Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.


First published Sat Mar 20, 2004; substantive revision Thu Sep 17, 2009

Plato (429–347 B.C.E.) is, by any reckoning, one of the most dazzling writers in the Western literary tradition and one of the most penetrating, wide-ranging, and influential authors in the history of philosophy. An Athenian citizen of high status, he displays in his works his absorption in the political events and intellectual movements of his time, but the questions he raises are so profound and the strategies he uses for tackling them so richly suggestive and provocative that educated readers of nearly every period have in some way been influenced by him, and in practically every age there have been philosophers who count themselves Platonists in some important respects. He was not the first thinker or writer to whom the word “philosopher” should be applied. But he was so self-conscious about how philosophy should be conceived, and what its scope and ambitions properly are, and he so transformed the intellectual currents with which he grappled, that the subject of philosophy, as it is often conceived — a rigorous and systematic examination of ethical, political, metaphysical, and epistemological issues, armed with a distinctive method — can be called his invention. Few other authors in the history of philosophy approximate him in depth and range: perhaps only Aristotle (who studied with him), Aquinas, and Kant would be generally agreed to be of the same rank.

1. Plato's central doctrines

Many people associate Plato with a few central doctrines that are advocated in his writings: The world that appears to our senses is in some way defective and filled with error, but there is a more real and perfect realm, populated by entities (called “forms” or “ideas”) that are eternal, changeless, and in some sense paradigmatic for the structure and character of our world. Among the most important of these abstract objects (as they are now called, because they are not located in space or time) are goodness, beauty, equality, bigness, likeness, unity, being, sameness, difference, change, and changelessness. (These terms — “goodness”, “beauty”, and so on — are often capitalized by those who write about Plato, in order to call attention to their exalted status; similarly for “Forms” and “Ideas.”) The most fundamental distinction in Plato's philosophy is between the many observable objects that appear beautiful (good, just, unified, equal, big) and the one object that is what beauty (goodness, justice, unity) really is, from which those many beautiful (good, just, unified, equal, big) things receive their names and their corresponding characteristics. Nearly every major work of Plato is, in some way, devoted to or dependent on this distinction. Many of them explore the ethical and practical consequences of conceiving of reality in this bifurcated way. We are urged to transform our values by taking to heart the greater reality of the forms and the defectiveness of the corporeal world. We must recognize that the soul is a different sort of object from the body — so much so that it does not depend on the existence of the body for its functioning, and can in fact grasp the nature of the forms far more easily when it is not encumbered by its attachment to anything corporeal. In a few of Plato's works, we are told that the soul always retains the ability to recollect what it once grasped of the forms, when it was disembodied (see especially Meno), and that the lives we lead are to some extent a punishment or reward for choices we made in a previous existence (see especially the final pages of Republic). But in many of Plato's writings, it is asserted or assumed that true philosophers — those who recognize how important it is to distinguish the one (the one thing that goodness is, or virtue is, or courage is) from the many (the many things that are called good or virtuous or courageous ) — are in a position to become ethically superior to unenlightened human beings, because of the greater degree of insight they can acquire. To understand which things are good and why they are good (and if we are not interested in such questions, how can we become good?), we must investigate the form of good.

2. Plato's puzzles

Although these propositions are often identified by Plato's readers as forming a large part of the core of his philosophy, many of his greatest admirers and most careful students point out that few, if any, of his writings can accurately be described as mere advocacy of a cut-and-dried group of propositions. Often Plato's works exhibit a certain degree of dissatisfaction and puzzlement with even those doctrines that are being recommended for our consideration. For example, the forms are sometimes described as hypotheses (see for example Phaedo). The form of good in particular is described as something of a mystery whose real nature is elusive and as yet unknown (Republic). Puzzles are raised — and not overtly answered — about how any of the forms can be known and how we are to talk about them without falling into contradiction (Parmenides), or about what it is to know anything (Theaetetus) or to name anything (Cratylus). When one compares Plato with some of the other philosophers who are often ranked with him — Aristotle, Aquinas, and Kant, for example — he can be recognized to be far more exploratory, incompletely systematic, elusive, and playful than they. That, along with his gifts as a writer and as a creator of vivid character and dramatic setting, is one of the reasons why he is often thought to be the ideal author from whom one should receive one's introduction to philosophy. His readers are not presented with an elaborate system of doctrines held to be so fully worked out that they are in no need of further exploration or development; instead, what we often receive from Plato is a few key ideas together with a series of suggestions and problems about how those ideas are to be interrogated and deployed. Readers of a Platonic dialogue are drawn into thinking for themselves about the issues raised, if they are to learn what the dialogue itself might be thought to say about them. Many of his works therefore give their readers a strong sense of philosophy as a living and unfinished subject (perhaps one that can never be completed) to which they themselves will have to contribute. All of Plato's works are in some way meant to leave further work for their readers, but among the ones that most conspicuously fall into this category are: Euthyphro, Laches, Charmides, Euthydemus, Theaetetus, and Parmenides.

3. Dialogue, setting, character

There is another feature of Plato's writings that makes him distinctive among the great philosophers and colors our experience of him as an author. Nearly everything he wrote takes the form of a dialogue. (There is one striking exception: his Apology, which purports to be the speech that Socrates gave in his defense — the Greek word apologia means “defense” — when, in 399, he was legally charged and convicted of the crime of impiety. However, even there, Socrates is presented at one point addressing questions of a philosophical character to his accuser, Meletus, and responding to them. In addition, since antiquity, a collection of 13 letters has been included among his collected works, but their authenticity as compositions of Plato is not universally accepted among scholars, and many or most of them are almost certainly not his. Most of them purport to be the outcome of his involvement in the politics of Syracuse, a heavily populated Greek city located in Sicily and ruled by tyrants.)

We are of course familiar with the dialogue form through our acquaintance with the literary genre of drama. But Plato's dialogues do not try to create a fictional world for the purposes of telling a story, as many literary dramas do; nor do they invoke an earlier mythical realm, like the creations of the great Greek tragedians Aeschylus, Sophocles, and Euripides. Nor are they all presented in the form of a drama: in many of them, a single speaker narrates events in which he participated. They are philosophical discussions — “debates” would, in some cases, also be an appropriate word — among a small number of interlocutors, many of whom can be identified as real historical figures; and often they begin with a depiction of the setting of the discussion — a visit to a prison, a wealthy man's house, a celebration over drinks, a religious festival, a visit to the gymnasium, a stroll outside the city's wall, a long walk on a hot day. As a group, they form vivid portraits of a social world, and are not purely intellectual exchanges between characterless and socially unmarked speakers. (At any rate, that is true of a large number of Plato's interlocutors. However, it must be added that in some of his works the speakers display little or no character. See, for example, Sophist and Statesman — dialogues in which a visitor from the town of Elea in Southern Italy leads the discussion; and Laws, a discussion between an unnamed Athenian and two named fictional characters, one from Crete and the other from Sparta.) In many of his dialogues (though not all), Plato is not only attempting to draw his readers into a discussion, but is also commenting on the social milieu that he is depicting, and criticizing the character and ways of life of his interlocutors. Some of the dialogues that most evidently fall into this category are Protagoras, Gorgias, Hippias Major, Euthydemus, and Symposium.

4. Socrates

There is one interlocutor who speaks in nearly all of Plato's dialogues, being completely absent only in Laws, which ancient testimony tells us was one of his latest works: that figure is Socrates. Like nearly everyone else who appears in Plato's works, he is not an invention of Plato: there really was a Socrates. Plato was not the only author whose personal experience of Socrates led to the depiction of him as a character in one or more dramatic works. Socrates is one of the principal characters of Aristophanes' comedy, Clouds; and Xenophon, a historian and military leader, wrote, like Plato, both an Apology of Socrates (an account of Socrates' trial) and other works in which Socrates appears as a principal speaker. Furthermore, we have some fragmentary remains of dialogues written by other contemporaries of Socrates (Aeschines, Antisthenes, Eucleides, Phaedo), and these purport to describe conversations he conducted with others. So, when Plato wrote dialogues that feature Socrates as a principal speaker, he was both contributing to a genre that was inspired by the life of Socrates and participating in a lively literary debate about the kind of person Socrates was and the value of the intellectual conversations in which he was involved. Aristophanes' comic portrayal of Socrates is at the same time a bitter critique of him and other leading intellectual figures of the day (the 420s B.C.), but from Plato, Xenophon, and the other composers (in the 390's and later) of “Socratic discourses” (as Aristotle calls this body of writings) we receive a far more favorable impression.

Evidently, the historical Socrates was the sort of person who provoked in those who knew him, or knew of him, a profound response, and he inspired many of those who came under his influence to write about him. But the portraits composed by Aristophanes, Xenophon, and Plato are the ones that have survived intact, and they are therefore the ones that must play the greatest role in shaping our conception of what Socrates was like. Of these, Clouds has the least value as an indication of what was distinctive of Socrates' mode of philosophizing: after all, it is not intended as a philosophical work, and although it may contain a few lines that are characterizations of features unique to Socrates, for the most part it is an attack on a philosophical type — the long-haired, unwashed, amoral investigator into abstruse empirical phenomena — rather than a depiction of Socrates himself. Xenophon's depiction of Socrates, whatever its value as historical testimony (which may be considerable), is generally thought to lack the philosophical subtlety and depth of Plato's. At any rate, no one (certainly not Xenophon himself) takes Xenophon to be a major philosopher in his own right; when we read his Socratic works, we are not encountering a great philosophical mind. But that is what we experience when we read Plato. We may read Plato's Socratic dialogues because we are (as Plato evidently wanted us to be) interested in who Socrates was and what he stood for, but even if we have little or no desire to learn about the historical Socrates, we will want to read Plato because in doing so we are encountering an author of the greatest philosophical significance. No doubt he in some way borrowed in important ways from Socrates, though it is not easy to say where to draw the line between him and his teacher (more about this below in section 12). But it is widely agreed among scholars that Plato is not a mere transcriber of the words of Socrates (any more than Xenophon or the other authors of Socratic discourses). His use of a figure called “Socrates” in so many of his dialogues should not be taken to mean that Plato is merely preserving for a reading public the lessons he learned from his teacher.

5. Plato's indirectness

Socrates, it should be kept in mind, does not appear in all of Plato's works. He makes no appearance in Laws, and there are several dialogues (Sophist, Statesman, Timaeus) in which his role is small and peripheral, while some other figure dominates the conversation or even, as in the Timaeus and Critias, presents a long and elaborate, continuous discourse of their own. Plato's dialogues are not a static literary form; not only do his topics vary, not only do his speakers vary, but the role played by questions and answers is never the same from one dialogue to another. (Symposium, for example, is a series of speeches, and there are also lengthy speeches in Apology, Menexenus, Protagoras, Crito, Phaedrus, Timaeus, and Critias; in fact, one might reasonably question whether these works are properly called dialogues). But even though Plato constantly adapted “the dialogue form” (a commonly used term, and convenient enough, so long as we do not think of it as an unvarying unity) to suit his purposes, it is striking that throughout his career as a writer he never engaged in a form of composition that was widely used in his time and was soon to become the standard mode of philosophical address: Plato never became a writer of philosophical treatises, even though the writing of treatises (for example, on rhetoric, medicine, and geometry) was a common practice among his predecessors and contemporaries. (The closest we come to an exception to this generalization is the seventh letter, which contains a brief section in which Plato commits himself to several philosophical points — while insisting, at the same time, that no philosopher will write about the deepest matters. But, as noted above, the authenticity of Plato's letters is a matter of great controversy; and in any case, the author of the seventh letter declares his opposition to the writing of philosophical books. Whether Plato wrote it or not, it cannot be regarded as a philosophical treatise, and its author did not wish it to be so regarded.) In all of his writings — except in the letters, if any of them are genuine — Plato never speaks to his audience directly and in his own voice. Strictly speaking, he does not himself affirm anything in his dialogues; rather, it is the interlocutors in his dialogues who are made by Plato to do all of the affirming, doubting, questioning, arguing, and so on. Whatever he wishes to communicate to us is conveyed indirectly.

6. Can we know Plato's mind?

This feature of Plato's works raises important questions about how they are to be read, and has led to considerable controversy among those who study his writings. Since he does not himself affirm anything in any of his dialogues, can we ever be on secure ground in attributing a philosophical doctrine to him (as opposed to one of his characters)? Did he himself have philosophical convictions, and can we discover what they were? Are we justified in speaking of “the philosophy of Plato”? Or, if we attribute some view to Plato himself, are we violating the spirit in which he intended the dialogues to be read? Is his whole point, in refraining from addressing his readers as an author of treatises, to discourage them from asking what their author believes and to encourage them instead simply to consider the plausibility or implausibility of what his characters are saying? Is that why Plato wrote dialogues? If not for this reason, then what was his purpose in refraining from addressing his audience in a more direct way? There are other important questions about the particular shape his dialogues take: for example, why does Socrates play such a prominent role in so many of them, and why, in some of these works, does Socrates play a smaller role, or none at all?

Once these questions are raised and their difficulty acknowledged, it is tempting, in reading Plato's works and reflecting upon them, to adopt a strategy of extreme caution. Rather than commit oneself to any hypothesis about what he is trying to communicate to his readers, one might adopt a stance of neutrality about his intentions, and confine oneself to talking only about what is said by his dramatis personae. One cannot be faulted, for example, if one notes that, in Plato's Republic, Socrates argues that justice in the soul consists in each part of the soul doing its own. It is equally correct to point out that other principal speakers in that work, Glaucon and Adeimantus, accept the arguments that Socrates gives for that definition of justice. Perhaps there is no need for us to say more — to say, for example, that Plato himself agrees that this is how justice should be defined, or that Plato himself accepts the arguments that Socrates gives in support of this definition. And we might adopt this same “minimalist” approach to all of Plato's works. After all, is it of any importance to discover what went on inside his head as he wrote — to find out whether he himself endorsed the ideas he put in the mouths of his characters, whether they constitute “the philosophy of Plato”? Should we not read his works for their intrinsic philosophical value, and not as tools to be used for entering into the mind of their author? We know what Plato's characters say — and isn't that all that we need, for the purpose of engaging with his works philosophically?

But the fact that we know what Plato's characters say does not show that by refusing to entertain any hypotheses about what the author of these works is trying to communicate to his readers we can understand what those characters mean by what they say. We should not lose sight of this obvious fact: it is Plato, not any of his dramatis personae, who is reaching out to a readership and trying to influence their beliefs and actions by means of his literary actions. When we ask whether an argument put forward by a character in Plato's works should be read as an effort to persuade us of its conclusion, or is better read as a revelation of how foolish that speaker is, we are asking about what Plato (not that character) is trying to lead us to believe, through the writing that he is presenting to our attention. We need to interpret the work itself to find out what it, or Plato the author, is saying. Similarly, when we ask how a word that has several different senses is best understood, we are asking what Plato means to communicate to us through the speaker who uses that word. We should not suppose that we can derive much philosophical value from Plato's writings if we refuse to entertain any thoughts about what use he intends us to make of the things his speakers say. Penetrating the mind of Plato and comprehending what his interlocutors mean by what they say are not two separate tasks but one, and if we do not ask what his interlocutors mean by what they say, and what the dialogue itself indicates we should think about what they mean, we will not profit from reading his dialogues.

Furthermore, the dialogues have certain characteristics that are most easily explained by supposing that Plato is using them as vehicles for inducing his readers to become convinced (or more convinced than they already are) of certain propositions — for example, that there are forms, that the soul is not corporeal, that knowledge can be acquired only by means of a study of the forms, and so on. Why, after all, did Plato write so many works (for example: Phaedo, Symposium, Republic, Phaedrus, Theaetetus, Sophist, Statesman, Timaeus, Philebus, Laws) in which one character dominates the conversation (often, but not always, Socrates) and convinces the other speakers (at times, after encountering initial resistance) that they should accept or reject certain conclusions, on the basis of the arguments presented? The only plausible way of answering that question is to say that these dialogues were intended by Plato to be devices by which he might induce the audience for which they are intended to reflect on and accept the arguments and conclusions offered by his principal interlocutor. (It is noteworthy that in Laws, the principal speaker — an unnamed visitor from Athens — proposes that laws should be accompanied by “preludes” in which their philosophical basis is given as full an explanation as possible. The educative value of written texts is thus explicitly acknowledged by Plato's dominant speaker. If preludes can educate a whole citizenry that is prepared to learn from them, then surely Plato thinks that other sorts of written texts — for example, his own dialogues — can also serve an educative function.)

This does not mean that Plato thinks that his readers can become wise simply by reading and studying his works. On the contrary, it is highly likely that he wanted all of his writings to be supplementary aids to philosophical conversation: in one of his works, he has Socrates warn his readers against relying solely on books, or taking them to be authoritative. They are, Socrates says, best used as devices that stimulate the readers' memory of discussions they have had (Phaedrus 274e-276d). In those face-to-face conversations with a knowledgeable leader, positions are taken, arguments are given, and conclusions are drawn. Plato's writings, he implies in this passage from Phaedrus, will work best when conversational seeds have already been sown for the arguments they contain.

7. Socrates as the dominant speaker

If we take Plato to be trying to persuade us, in many of his works, to accept the conclusions arrived at by his principal interlocutors (or to persuade us of the refutations of their opponents), we can easily explain why he so often chooses Socrates as the dominant speaker in his dialogues. Presumably the contemporary audience for whom Plato was writing included many of Socrates' admirers. They would be predisposed to think that a character called “Socrates” would have all of the intellectual brilliance and moral passion of the historical person after whom he is named (especially since Plato often makes special efforts to give his “Socrates” a life-like reality, and has him refer to his trial or to the characteristics by which he was best known); and the aura surrounding the character called “Socrates” would give the words he speaks in the dialogue considerable persuasive power. Furthermore, if Plato felt strongly indebted to Socrates for many of his philosophical techniques and ideas, that would give him further reason for assigning a dominant role to him in many of his works. (More about this in section 12.)

Of course, there are other more speculative possible ways of explaining why Plato so often makes Socrates his principal speaker. For example, we could say that Plato was trying to undermine the reputation of the historical Socrates by writing a series of works in which a figure called “Socrates” manages to persuade a group of naïve and sycophantic interlocutors to accept absurd conclusions on the basis of sophistries. But anyone who has read some of Plato's works will quickly recognize the utter implausibility of that alternative way of reading them. Plato could have written into his works clear signals to the reader that the arguments of Socrates do not work, and that his interlocutors are foolish to accept them. But there are many signs in such works as Meno, Phaedo, Republic, and Phaedrus that point in the opposite direction. (And the great admiration Plato feels for Socrates is also evident from his Apology.) The reader is given every encouragement to believe that the reason why Socrates is successful in persuading his interlocutors (on those occasions when he does succeed) is that his arguments are powerful ones. The reader, in other words, is being encouraged by the author to accept those arguments, if not as definitive then at least as highly arresting and deserving of careful and full positive consideration. When we interpret the dialogues in this way, we cannot escape the fact that we are entering into the mind of Plato, and attributing to him, their author, a positive evaluation of the arguments that his speakers present to each other.

8. Links between the dialogues

There is a further reason for entertaining hypotheses about what Plato intended and believed, and not merely confining ourselves to observations about what sorts of people his characters are and what they say to each other. When we undertake a serious study of Plato, and go beyond reading just one of his works, we are inevitably confronted with the question of how we are to link the work we are currently reading with the many others that Plato composed. Admittedly, many of his dialogues make a fresh start in their setting and their interlocutors: typically, Socrates encounters a group of people many of whom do not appear in any other work of Plato, and so, as an author, he needs to give his readers some indication of their character and social circumstances. But often Plato's characters make statements that would be difficult for readers to understand unless they had already read one or more of his other works. For example, in Phaedo (73a-b), Socrates says that one argument for the immortality of the soul derives from the fact that when people are asked certain kinds of questions, and are aided with diagrams, they answer in a way that shows that they are not learning afresh from the diagrams or from information provided in the questions, but are drawing their knowledge of the answers from within themselves. That remark would be of little worth for an audience that had not already read Meno. Several pages later, Socrates tells his interlocutors that his argument about our prior knowledge of equality itself (the form of equality) applies no less to other forms — to the beautiful, good, just, pious and to all the other things that are involved in their asking and answering of questions (75d). This reference to asking and answering questions would not be well understood by a reader who had not yet encountered a series of dialogues in which Socrates asks his interlocutors questions of the form, “What is X?” (Euthyphro: what is piety? Laches: what is courage? Charmides: What is moderation? Hippias Major: what is beauty?). Evidently, Plato is assuming that readers of Phaedo have already read several of his other works, and will bring to bear on the current argument all of the lessons that they have learned from them. In some of his writings, Plato's characters refer ahead to the continuation of their conversations on another day, or refer back to conversations they had recently: thus Plato signals to us that we should read Theaetetus, Sophist, and Statesman sequentially; and similarly, since the opening of Timaeus refers us back to Republic, Plato is indicating to his readers that they must seek some connection between these two works.

These features of the dialogues show Plato's awareness that he cannot entirely start from scratch in every work that he writes. He will introduce new ideas and raise fresh difficulties, but he will also expect his readers to have already familiarized themselves with the conversations held by the interlocutors of other dialogues — even when there is some alteration among those interlocutors. (Meno does not re-appear in Phaedo; Timaeus was not among the interlocutors of Republic.) Why does Plato have his dominant characters (Socrates, the Eleatic visitor) reaffirm some of the same points from one dialogue to another, and build on ideas that were made in earlier works? If the dialogues were merely meant as provocations to thought — mere exercises for the mind — there would be no need for Plato to identify his leading characters with a consistent and ever-developing doctrine. For example, Socrates continues to maintain, over a large number of dialogues, that there are such things as forms— and there is no better explanation for this continuity than to suppose that Plato is recommending that doctrine to his readers. Furthermore, when Socrates is replaced as the principal investigator by the visitor from Elea (in Sophist and Statesman), the existence of forms continues to be taken for granted, and the visitor criticizes any conception of reality that excludes such incorporeal objects as souls and forms. The Eleatic visitor, in other words, upholds a metaphysics that is, in many respects, like the one that Socrates is made to defend. Again, the best explanation for this continuity is that Plato is using both characters — Socrates and the Eleatic visitor — as devices for the presentation and defense of a doctrine that he embraces and wants his readers to embrace as well.

9. Does Plato change his mind about forms?

This way of reading Plato's dialogues does not presuppose that he never changes his mind about anything — that whatever any of his main interlocutors uphold in one dialogue will continue to be presupposed or affirmed elsewhere without alteration. It is, in fact, a difficult and delicate matter to determine, on the basis of our reading of the dialogues, whether Plato means to modify or reject in one dialogue what he has his main interlocutor affirm in some other. One of the most intriguing and controversial questions about his treatment of the forms, for example, is whether he concedes that his conception of those abstract entities is vulnerable to criticism; and, if so, whether he revises some of the assumptions he had been making about them, or develops a more elaborate picture of them that allows him to respond to that criticism. In Parmenides, the principal interlocutor (not Socrates — he is here portrayed as a promising, young philosopher in need of further training — but rather the pre-Socratic from Elea who gives the dialogue its name: Parmenides) subjects the forms to withering criticism, and then consents to conduct an inquiry into the nature of oneness that has no overt connection to his critique of the forms. Does the discussion of oneness (a baffling series of contradictions — or at any rate, propositions that seem, on the surface, to be contradictions) in some way help address the problems raised about forms? That is one way of reading the dialogue. And if we do read it in this way, does that show that Plato has changed his mind about some of the ideas about forms he inserted into earlier dialogues? Can we find dialogues in which we encounter a “new theory of forms” — that is, a way of thinking of forms that carefully steers clear of the assumptions about forms that led to Parmenides' critique? It is not easy to say. But we cannot even raise this as an issue worth pondering unless we presuppose that behind the dialogues there stands a single mind that is using these writings as a way of hitting upon the truth, and of bringing that truth to the attention of others. If we find Timaeus (the principal interlocutor of the dialogue named after him) and the Eleatic visitor of the Sophist and Statesman talking about forms in a way that is entirely consistent with the way Socrates talks about forms in Phaedo and Republic, then there is only one reasonable explanation for that consistency: Plato believes that their way of talking about forms is correct, or is at least strongly supported by powerful considerations. If, on the other hand, we find that Timaeus or the Eleatic visitor talks about forms in a way that does not harmonize with the way Socrates conceives of those abstract objects, in the dialogues that assign him a central role as director of the conversation, then the most plausible explanation for these discrepancies is that Plato has changed his mind about the nature of these entities. It would be implausible to suppose that Plato himself had no convictions about forms, and merely wants to give his readers mental exercise by composing dialogues in which different leading characters talk about these objects in discordant ways.

10. Does Plato change his mind about politics?

The same point — that we must view the dialogues as the product of a single mind, a single philosopher, though perhaps one that changes his mind — can be made in connection with the politics of Plato's works.

It is noteworthy, to begin with, that Plato is, among other things, a political philosopher. For he gives expression, in several of his writings (particular Phaedo), to a yearning to escape from the tawdriness of ordinary human relations. (Similarly, he evinces a sense of the ugliness of the sensible world, whose beauty pales in comparison with that of the forms.) Because of this, it would have been all too easy for Plato to turn his back entirely on practical reality, and to confine his speculations to theoretical questions. Some of his works — Parmenides is a stellar example — do confine themselves to exploring questions that seem to have no bearing whatsoever on practical life. But it is remarkable how few of his works fall into this category. Even the highly abstract questions raised in Sophist about the nature of being and not-being are, after all, embedded in a search for the definition of sophistry; and thus they call to mind the question whether Socrates should be classified as a sophist — whether, in other words, sophists are to be despised and avoided. In any case, despite the great sympathy Plato expresses for the desire to shed one's body and live in an incorporeal world, he devotes an enormous amount of energy to the task of understanding the world we live in, appreciating its limited beauty, and improving it.

His tribute to the mixed beauty of the sensible world, in Timaeus, consists in his depiction of it as the outcome of divine efforts to mold reality in the image of the forms, using simple geometrical patterns and harmonious arithmetic relations as building blocks. The desire to transform human relations is given expression in a far larger number of works. Socrates presents himself, in Plato's Apology, as a man who does not have his head in the clouds (that is part of Aristophanes' charge against him in Clouds). He does not want to escape from the everyday world but to make it better. He presents himself, in Gorgias, as the only Athenian who has tried his hand at the true art of politics.

Similarly, the Socrates of Republic devotes a considerable part of his discussion to the critique of ordinary social institutions — the family, private property, and rule by the many. The motivation that lies behind the writing of this dialogue is the desire to transform (or, at any rate, to improve) political life, not to escape from it (although it is acknowledged that the desire to escape is an honorable one: the best sort of rulers greatly prefer the contemplation of divine reality to the governance of the city). And if we have any further doubts that Plato does take an interest in the practical realm, we need only turn to Laws. A work of such great detail and length about voting procedures, punishments, education, legislation, and the oversight of public officials can only have been produced by someone who wants to contribute something to the improvement of the lives we lead in this sensible and imperfect realm. Further evidence of Plato's interest in practical matters can be drawn from his letters, if they are genuine. In most of them, he presents himself as having a deep interest in educating (with the help of his friend, Dion) the ruler of Syracuse, Dionysius II, and thus reforming that city's politics.

Just as any attempt to understand Plato's views about forms must confront the question whether his thoughts about them developed or altered over time, so too our reading of him as a political philosopher must be shaped by a willingness to consider the possibility that he changed his mind. For example, on any plausible reading of Republic, Plato evinces a deep antipathy to rule by the many. Socrates tells his interlocutors that the only politics that should engage them are those of the anti-democratic regime he depicts as the paradigm of a good constitution. And yet in Laws, the Athenian visitor proposes a detailed legislative framework for a city in which non-philosophers (people who have never heard of the forms, and have not been trained to understand them) are given considerable powers as rulers. Plato would not have invested so much time in the creation of this comprehensive and lengthy work, had he not believed that the creation of a political community ruled by those who are philosophically unenlightened is a project that deserves the support of his readers. Has Plato changed his mind, then? Has he re-evaluated the highly negative opinion he once held of those who are innocent of philosophy? Did he at first think that the reform of existing Greek cities, with all of their imperfections, is a waste of time — but then decide that it is an endeavor of great value? (And if so, what led him to change his mind?) Answers to these questions can be justified only by careful attention to what he has his interlocutors say. But it would be utterly implausible to suppose that these developmental questions need not be raised, on the grounds that Republic and Laws each has its own cast of characters, and that the two works therefore cannot come into contradiction with each other. According to this hypothesis (one that must be rejected), because it is Socrates (not Plato) who is critical of democracy in Republic, and because it is the Athenian visitor (not Plato) who recognizes the merits of rule by the many in Laws, there is no possibility that the two dialogues are in tension with each other. Against this hypothesis, we should say: Since both Republic and Laws are works in which Plato is trying to move his readers towards certain conclusions, by having them reflect on certain arguments — these dialogues are not barred from having this feature by their use of interlocutors — it would be an evasion of our responsibility as readers and students of Plato not to ask whether what one of them advocates is compatible with what the other advocates. If we answer that question negatively, we have some explaining to do: what led to this change? Alternatively, if we conclude that the two works are compatible, we must say why the appearance of conflict is illusory.

11. The historical Socrates: early, middle, and late dialogues

Many contemporary scholars find it plausible that when Plato embarked on his career as a philosophical writer, he composed, in addition to his Apology of Socrates, a number of short ethical dialogues that contain little or nothing in the way of positive philosophical doctrine, but are mainly devoted to portraying the way in which Socrates punctured the pretensions of his interlocutors and forced them to realize that they are unable to offer satisfactory definitions of the ethical terms they used, or satisfactory arguments for their moral beliefs. According to this way of placing the dialogues into a rough chronological order — associated especially with Gregory Vlastos's name (see especially his Socrates Ironist and Moral Philosopher, chapters 2 and 3) — Plato, at this point of his career, was content to use his writings primarily for the purpose of preserving the memory of Socrates and making plain the superiority of his hero, in intellectual skill and moral seriousness, to all of his contemporaries — particularly those among them who claimed to be experts on religious, political, or moral matters. Into this category of early dialogues (they are also sometimes called “Socratic” dialogues) are placed: Charmides, Crito, Euthydemus, Euthyphro, Gorgias, Hippias Major, Hippias Minor, Ion, Laches, Lysis, and Protagoras, (Some scholars hold that we can tell which of these come later during Plato's early period. For example, it is sometimes said that Protagoras and Gorgias are later, because of their greater length and philosophical complexity. Other dialogues — for example, Charmides and Lysis — are thought not to be among Plato's earliest within this early group, because in them Socrates appears to be playing a more active role in shaping the progress of the dialogue: that is, he has more ideas of his own.) In comparison with many of Plato's other dialogues, these “Socratic” works contain little in the way of metaphysical, epistemological, or methodological speculation, and they therefore fit well with the way Socrates characterizes himself in Plato's Apology: as a man who leaves investigations of high falutin’ matters (which are “in the sky and below the earth”) to wiser heads, and confines all of his investigations to the question how one should live one's life. Aristotle describes Socrates as someone whose interests were restricted to only one branch of philosophy — the realm of the ethical; and he also says that he was in the habit of asking definitional questions to which he himself lacked answers (Metaphysics 987b1, Sophistical Refutations 183b7). That testimony gives added weight to the widely accepted hypothesis that there is a group of dialogues — the ones mentioned above as his early works — in which Plato used the dialogue form as a way of portraying the philosophical activities of the historical Socrates (although, of course, he might also have used them in other ways as well — for example to suggest and begin to explore philosophical difficulties raised by them).

But at a certain point — so says this hypothesis about the chronology of the dialogues — Plato began to use his works to advance ideas that were his own creations rather than those of Socrates, although he continued to use the name “Socrates” for the interlocutor who presented and argued for these new ideas. The speaker called “Socrates” now begins to move beyond and depart from the historical Socrates: he has views about the methodology that should be used by philosophers (a methodology borrowed from mathematics), and he argues for the immortality of the soul and the existence and importance of the forms of beauty, justice, goodness, and the like. (By contrast, in Apology Socrates says that no one knows what becomes of us after we die.) Phaedo is often said to be the dialogue in which Plato first comes into his own as a philosopher who is moving far beyond the ideas of his teacher (though it is also commonly said that we see a new methodological sophistication and a greater interest in mathematical knowledge in Meno). Having completed all of the dialogues that, according to this hypothesis, we characterize as early, Plato widened the range of topics to be explored in his writings (no longer confining himself to ethics), and placed the theory of forms (and related ideas about language, knowledge, and love) at the center of his thinking. In these works of his “middle” period — for example, in Phaedo, Cratylus, Symposium, Republic, and Phaedrus — there is both a change of emphasis and of doctrine. The focus is no longer on ridding ourselves of false ideas and self-deceit; rather, we are asked to accept (however tentatively) a radical new conception of ourselves (now divided into three parts), our world — or rather, our two worlds — and our need to negotiate between them. Definitions of the most important virtue terms are finally proposed in Republic (the search for them in some of the early dialogues having been unsuccessful): Book I of this dialogue is a portrait of how the historical Socrates might have handled the search for a definition of justice, and the rest of the dialogue shows how the new ideas and tools discovered by Plato can complete the project that his teacher was unable to finish. Plato continues to use a figure called “Socrates” as his principal interlocutor, and in this way he creates a sense of continuity between the methods, insights, and ideals of the historical Socrates and the new Socrates who has now become a vehicle for the articulation of his own philosophical outlook. In doing so, he acknowledges his intellectual debt to his teacher and appropriates for his own purposes the extraordinary prestige of the man who was the wisest of his time.

This hypothesis about the chronology of Plato's writings has a third component: it does not place his works into either of only two categories — the early or “Socratic” dialogues, and all the rest — but works instead with a threefold division of early, middle, and late. That is because, following ancient testimony, it has become a widely accepted assumption that Laws is one of Plato's last works, and further that this dialogue shares a great many stylistic affinities with a small group of others: Sophist, Statesman, Timaeus, Critias, and Philebus. These five dialogues together with Laws are generally agreed to be his late works, because they have much more in common with each other, when one counts certain stylistic features apparent only to readers of Plato's Greek, than with any of Plato's other works. (Computer counts have aided these stylometric studies, but the isolation of a group of six dialogues by means of their stylistic commonalities was recognized in the nineteenth century.)

It is not at all clear whether there are one or more philosophical affinities among this group of six dialogues — that is, whether the philosophy they contain is sharply different from that of all of the other dialogues. Plato does nothing to encourage the reader to view these works as a distinctive and separate component of his thinking. On the contrary, he links Sophist with Theaetetus (the conversations they present have a largely overlapping cast of characters, and take place on successive days) no less than Sophist and Statesman. Sophist contains, in its opening pages, a reference to the conversation of Parmenides — and perhaps Plato is thus signaling to his readers that they should bring to bear on Sophist the lessons that are to be drawn from Parmenides. Similarly, Timaeus opens with a reminder of some of the principal doctrines of Republic. It could be argued, of course, that when one looks beyond these stage-setting devices, one finds significant philosophical changes in the six late dialogues, setting this group off from all that preceded them. But there is no consensus that they should be read in this way. Resolving this issue requires intensive study of the content of Plato's works. So, although it is widely accepted that the six dialogues mentioned above belong to Plato's latest period, there is, as yet, no agreement among students of Plato that these six form a distinctive stage in his philosophical development.

In fact, it remains a matter of dispute whether the division of Plato's works into three periods — early, middle, late — is a useful tool for the understanding of his thought. Of course, it would be wildly implausible to suppose that Plato's writing career began with such complex works as Laws, Parmenides, Phaedrus, or Republic. In light of widely accepted assumptions about how most philosophical minds develop, it is likely that when Plato started writing philosophical works some of the shorter and simpler dialogues were the ones he composed: Laches, or Crito, or Ion (for example). (Similarly, Apology does not advance a complex philosophical agenda or presuppose an earlier body of work; so that too is likely to have been composed near the beginning of Plato's writing career.) Even so, there is no good reason to eliminate the hypothesis that throughout much of his life Plato devoted himself to writing two sorts of dialogues at the same time, moving back and forth between them as he aged: on the one hand, introductory works whose primary purpose is to show readers the difficulty of apparently simple philosophical problems, and thereby to rid them of their pretensions and false beliefs; and on the other hand, works filled with more substantive philosophical theories supported by elaborate argumentation. Moreover, one could point to features of many of the “Socratic” dialogues that would justify counting them in the latter category, even though the argumentation does not concern metaphysics or methodology or invoke mathematics — Gorgias, Protagoras, Lysis, Euthydemus, Hippias Major among them.

Plato makes it clear that both of these processes, one preceding the other, must be part of one's philosophical education. One of his deepest methodological convictions (affirmed in Meno, Theaetetus, and Sophist) is that in order to make intellectual progress we must recognize that knowledge cannot be acquired by passively receiving it from others: rather, we must work our way through problems and assess the merits of competing theories with an independent mind. Accordingly, some of his dialogues are primarily devices for breaking down the reader's complacency, and that is why it is essential that they come to no positive conclusions; others are contributions to theory-construction, and are therefore best absorbed by those who have already passed through the first stage of philosophical development. We should not assume that Plato could have written the preparatory dialogues only at the earliest stage of his career. Although he may well have begun his writing career by taking up that sort of project, he may have continued writing these “negative” works at later stages, at the same time that he was composing his theory-constructing dialogues. For example although both Euthydemus and Charmides are widely assumed to be early dialogues, they might have been written around the same time as Symposium and Republic, which are generally assumed to be compositions of his middle period — or even later.

No doubt, some of the works widely considered to be early really are such. But it is an open question which and how many of them are. At any rate, it is clear that Plato continued to write in a “Socratic” and “negative” vein even after he was well beyond the earliest stages of his career: Theaetetus features a Socrates who is even more insistent upon his ignorance than are the dramatic representations of Socrates in briefer and philosophically less complex works that are reasonably assumed to be early; and like many of those early works, Theaetetus seeks but does not find the answer to the “what is it?” question that it relentlessly pursues — “What is knowledge?” Similarly, Parmenides, though certainly not an early dialogue, is a work whose principal aim is to puzzle the reader by the presentation of arguments for apparently contradictory conclusions; since it does not tell us how it is possible to accept all of those conclusions, its principal effect on the reader is similar to that of dialogues (many of them no doubt early) that reach only negative conclusions. Plato uses this educational device — provoking the reader through the presentation of opposed arguments, and leaving the contradiction unresolved — in Protagoras (often considered an early dialogue) as well. So it is clear that even after he was well beyond the earliest stages of his thinking, he continued to assign himself the project of writing works whose principal aim is the presentation of unresolved difficulties. (And, just as we should recognize that puzzling the reader continues to be his aim even in later works, so too we should not overlook the fact that there is some substantive theory-construction in the ethical works that are simple enough to have been early compositions: Ion, for example, affirms a theory of poetic inspiration; and Crito sets out the conditions under which a citizen acquires an obligation to obey civic commands. Neither ends in failure.)

If we are justified in taking Socrates' speech in Plato's Apology to constitute reliable evidence about what the historical Socrates was like, then whatever we find in Plato's other works that is of a piece with that speech can also be safely attributed to Socrates. So understood, Socrates was a moralist but (unlike Plato) not a metaphysician or epistemologist or cosmologist. That fits with Aristotle's testimony, and Plato's way of choosing the dominant speaker of his dialogues gives further support to this way of distinguishing between him and Socrates. The number of dialogues that are dominated by a Socrates who is spinning out elaborate philosophical doctrines is remarkably small: Phaedo, Republic, Phaedrus, and Philebus. All of them are dominated by ethical issues: whether to fear death, whether to be just, whom to love, the place of pleasure. Evidently, Plato thinks that it is appropriate to make Socrates the major speaker in a dialogue that is filled with positive content only when the topics explored in that work primarily have to do with the ethical life of the individual. (The political aspects of Republic are explicitly said to serve the larger question whether any individual, no matter what his circumstances, should be just.) When the doctrines he wishes to present systematically become primarily metaphysical, he turns to a visitor from Elea (Sophist, Statesman); when they become cosmological, he turns to Timaeus; when they become constitutional, he turns, in Laws, to a visitor from Athens (and he then eliminates Socrates entirely). In effect, Plato is showing us: although he owes a great deal to the ethical insights of Socrates, as well as to his method of puncturing the intellectual pretensions of his interlocutors by leading them into contradiction, he thinks he should not put into the mouth of his teacher too elaborate an exploration of ontological, or cosmological, or political themes, because Socrates refrained from entering these domains. This may be part of the explanation why he has Socrates put into the mouth of the personified Laws of Athens the theory advanced in Crito, which reaches the conclusion that it would be unjust for him to escape from prison. Perhaps Plato is indicating, at the point where these speakers enter the dialogue, that none of what is said here is in any way derived from or inspired by the conversation of Socrates.

Just as we should reject the idea that Plato must have made a decision, at a fairly early point in his career, no longer to write one kind of dialogue (negative, destructive, preparatory) and to write only works of elaborate theory-construction; so we should also question whether he went through an early stage during which he refrained from introducing into his works any of his own ideas (if he had any), but was content to play the role of a faithful portraitist, representing to his readers the life and thought of Socrates. It is unrealistic to suppose that someone as original and creative as Plato, who probably began to write dialogues somewhere in his thirties (he was around 28 when Socrates was killed), would have started his compositions with no ideas of his own, or, having such ideas, would have decided to suppress them, for some period of time, allowing himself to think for himself only later. (What would have led to such a decision?) We should instead treat the moves made in the dialogues, even those that are likely to be early, as Platonic inventions — derived, no doubt, by Plato's reflections on and transformations of the key themes of Socrates that he attributes to Socrates in Apology. That speech indicates, for example, that the kind of religiosity exhibited by Socrates was unorthodox and likely to give offense or lead to misunderstanding. It would be implausible to suppose that Plato simply concocted the idea that Socrates followed a divine sign. But what of the various philosophical moves rehearsed in Euthyphro — the dialogue in which Socrates searches, unsuccessfully, for an understanding of what piety is? We have no good reason to think that in writing this work Plato adopted the role of a mere recording device, or something close to it (changing a word here and there, but for the most part simply recalling what he heard Socrates say, as he made his way to court). It is more likely that Plato, having been inspired by the unorthodoxy of Socrates' conception of piety, developed, on his own, a series of questions and answers designed to show his readers how difficult it is to reach an understanding of the central concept that Socrates' fellow citizens relied upon when they condemned him to death. The idea that it is important to search for definitions may have been Socratic in origin. (After all, Aristotle attributes this much to Socrates.) But the twists and turns of the arguments in Euthyphro and other dialogues that search for definitions are more likely to be the products of Plato's mind than the content of a conversation that really took place.

12. Why dialogues?

It is equally unrealistic to suppose that when Plato embarked on his career as a writer, he made a conscious decision to put all of the compositions that he would henceforth compose for a general reading public (with the exception of Apology) in the form of a dialogue. If the question, “why did Plato write dialogues?”, which many of his readers are tempted to ask, pre-supposes that there must have been some such once-and-for-all decision, then it is poorly posed. It makes better sense to break that question apart into many little ones: better to ask, “Why did Plato write this particular work (for example: Protagoras, or Republic, or Symposium, or Laws) in the form of a dialogue — and that one (Timaeus, say) mostly in the form of a long and rhetorically elaborate single speech?” than to ask why he decided to adopt the dialogue form.

The best way to form a reasonable conjecture about why Plato wrote any given work in the form of a dialogue is to ask: what would be lost, were one to attempt to re-write this work in a way that eliminated the give-and-take of interchange, stripped the characters of their personality and social markers, and transformed the result into something that comes straight from the mouth of its author? This is often a question that will be easy to answer, but the answer might vary greatly from one dialogue to another. In pursuing this strategy, we must not rule out the possibility that some of Plato's reasons for writing this or that work in the form of a dialogue will also be his reason for doing so in other cases — perhaps some of his reasons, so far as we can guess at them, will be present in all other cases. For example, the use of character and conversation allows an author to enliven his work, to awaken the interest of his readership, and therefore to reach a wider audience. The enormous appeal of Plato's writings is in part a result of their dramatic composition. Even treatise-like compositions — Timaeus and Laws, for example — improve in readability because of their conversational frame. Furthermore, the dialogue form allows Plato's evident interest in pedagogical questions (how is it possible to learn? what is the best way to learn? from what sort of person can we learn? what sort of person is in a position to learn?) to be pursued not only in the content of his compositions but also in their form. Even in Laws such questions are not far from Plato's mind, as he demonstrates, through the dialogue form, how it is possible for the citizens of Athens, Sparta, and Crete to learn from each other by adapting and improving upon each other's social and political institutions.

In some of his works, it is evident that one of Plato's goals is to create a sense of puzzlement among his readers, and that the dialogue form is being used for this purpose. The Parmenides is perhaps the clearest example of such a work, because here Plato relentlessly rubs his readers' faces in a baffling series of unresolved puzzles and apparent contradictions. But several of his other works also have this character, though to a smaller degree: for example, Protagoras (can virtue be taught?), Hippias Minor (is voluntary wrongdoing better than involuntary wrongdoing?), and portions of Meno (are some people virtuous because of divine inspiration?). Just as someone who encounters Socrates in conversation should sometimes be puzzled about whether he means what he says (or whether he is instead speaking ironically), so Plato sometimes uses the dialogue form to create in his readers a similar sense of discomfort about what he means and what we ought to infer from the arguments that have been presented to us. But Socrates does not always speak ironically, and similarly Plato's dialogues do not always aim at creating a sense of bafflement about what we are to think about the subject under discussion. There is no mechanical rule for discovering how best to read a dialogue, no interpretive strategy that applies equally well to all of his works. We will best understand Plato's works and profit most from our reading of them if we recognize their great diversity of styles and adapt our reading habits accordingly. Rather than impose on our reading of Plato a uniform expectation of what he must be doing (because he has done such a thing elsewhere), we should bring to each dialogue a receptivity to what is unique in each of them. That would be the most fitting reaction to the artistry in his philosophy.


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abstract objects | Aristotle | education, philosophy of | epistemology | metaphysics | Plato: ethics and politics in The Republic | religion: and morality | Socrates | Socratic Dialogues