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Plato's Republic centers on a simple question: is it always better to be just than unjust? The puzzles in Book One prepare for this question, and Glaucon and Adeimantus make it explicit at the beginning of Book Two. To answer the question, Socrates takes a long way around, sketching an account of a good city on the grounds that a good city would be just and that defining justice as a virtue of a city would help to define justice as a virtue of a human being. Socrates is finally close to answering the question after he characterizes justice as a personal virtue at the end of Book Four, but he is interrupted and challenged to defend some of the more controversial features of the good city he has sketched. In Books Five through Seven, he addresses this challenge, arguing (in effect) that the just city and the just human being as he has sketched them are in fact good and are in principle possible. After this long digression, Socrates in Books Eight and Nine finally delivers three "proofs" that it is always better to be just than unjust. Then, because Socrates wants not only to show that it is always better to be just but also to convince Glaucon and Adeimantus of this point, and because Socrates' proofs are opposed by the teachings of poets, he bolsters his case in Book Ten by indicting the poets' claims to represent the truth and by offering a new myth that is consonant with his proofs.
As this overview makes clear, the center of Plato's Republic is a contribution to ethics: a discussion of what the virtue justice is and why a person should be just. Yet because Socrates links his discussion of personal justice to an account of justice in the city and makes claims about how good and bad cities are arranged, the Republic sustains reflections on political questions, as well. Not that ethics and politics exhaust the concerns of the Republic. The account in Books Five through Seven of how a just city and a just person are in principle possible is an account of how knowledge can rule, which includes discussion of what knowledge and its objects are. Moreover, the indictment of the poets involves a wide-ranging discussion of art. This article, however, focuses on the ethics and politics of Plato's Republic. For more on what the Republic says about knowledge and its objects, see Plato: Metaphysics and Epistemology, and for more about the discussion of the poets, see Plato: Rhetoric and Poetry.
The article attempts to provide a constructive guide to the main issues of ethics and politics in the Republic. Two assumptions shape its organization. First, it assumes that an account of ethics and politics in the Republic requires a preliminary understanding of the question Socrates is facing and the strategy Socrates uses to answer the question. Second, it assumes that politics in the Republic is based upon the moral psychology in the Republic, and thus that the former is more profitably discussed after the latter. With these assumptions in place, the following outline unfolds:
In Book One, the Republic's question first emerges in the figure of Cephalus. After Socrates asks his host what it is like being old (328de) and rich (330d)--rather rude, we might think--Cephalus says that the best thing about wealth is that it can save us from being unjust and thus smooth the way for an agreeable afterlife (330d-331b). This is enough to prompt more questions, for Socrates wants to know what justice is. Predictably, Cephalus and then Polemarchus fail to define justice in a way that survives Socratic examination, but they continue to assume that justice is a valuable part of a good human life. Thrasymachus erupts when he has had his fill of this conversation (336ab), and he challenges the assumption that it is good to be just. On Thrasymachus' view (see especially 343c-344c), justice is conventionally established by the strong, in order that the weak will serve the interests of the strong. The strong themselves, on this view, are better off disregarding justice and serving their own interests.
Socrates sees in this "immoralist" challenge the explicit question of whether one should live a just or unjust life (344de), and he tries repeatedly to repel Thrasymachus' onslaught. Eventually, Thrasymachus withdraws sullenly, like Callicles in the Gorgias, but Socrates' "victory" fails to satisfy Glaucon and Adeimantus. The brothers pick up where Thrasymachus left off, providing reasons why most people think that justice is not intrinsically valuable but worth respecting only if one is not strong enough (or invisible enough) to get away with injustice. They want to be shown that most people are wrong, that justice is worth choosing for its own sake. More than that, Glaucon and Adeimantus want to be shown that justice is worth choosing regardless of the rewards or penalties bestowed on the just by other people and the gods, and they will accept this conclusion only if Socrates can convince them that it is always better to be just. So Socrates must persuade them that the just person who is terrifically unfortunate and scorned lives a better life than the unjust person who is so successful that he is unfairly rewarded as if he were perfectly just (see 360d-361d).
The challenge that Glaucon and Adeimantus present has baffled modern readers who are accustomed to carving up ethics into deontologies that articulate a theory of what is right independent of what is good and consequentialisms that define what is right in terms of what promotes the good. The insistence that justice be praised "itself by itself" has suggested to some that Socrates will be offering a deontological account of justice. But the insistence that justice be shown to be beneficial to the just has suggested to others that Socrates will be justifying justice by reference to its consequences.
In fact, both readings are distortions, predicated more on what modern moral philosophers think than on what Plato thinks. Socrates takes the basic challenge to concern how justice relates to objective happiness or flourishing. He states his general position by saying, "I think that justice belongs in the best class [of goods], that which should be loved both for its own sake and for the sake of its consequences by anyone who is going to be blessed" (358a1-3). In these terms, Glaucon and Adeimantus are asking, "If you are always acting for the sake of your happiness, are you also always overridingly committed to justice?" So understood, the challenge is not necessarily about whether justice brings about happiness as a consequence for the agent, for the agent who is always acting for the sake of his happiness may not be trying to bring about his happiness. Rather, the agent could always be trying to act in a way that instantiates happiness, and justice may (help to) constitute happiness. This would make sense of the demand to show both that justice is valued "itself by itself" and that the just are happier, and as we shall see, it seems to explain Socrates' strategy well.
There remains a further question about the answer Socrates aims to give. Although Socrates is asked to show that one is always happier being just than unjust, he may try to show more than this. He may try to show that justice is both necessary and sufficient for happiness, for that would entail that the just are always happier than the unjust. Of course, he need not be so bold. Even if there are circumstances in which the just do not flourish, Socrates will successfully answer the challenge if he shows that even in these circumstances the just are better off (that is, closer to flourishing) than the unjust. There is no way of determining which thesis Socrates ultimately tries to defend on the basis of the challenge Glaucon and Adeimantus present. The way the challenge is put suggests the weaker, comparative thesis, but we cannot rule out the possibility that Socrates will ultimately argue for the stronger, sufficiency thesis.
After the challenge of Glaucon and Adeimantus, Socrates takes off in a strange direction (from 367e). He suggests looking for justice as a virtue of cities before defining justice as a virtue of persons, on the rather unconvincing grounds that justice in a city is bigger and more apparent than justice in a person (368c-369b), and this leads Socrates to a rambling description of some features of a good city (369b-427c). This may seem puzzling. But Socrates' indirect approach is not unmotivated. The arguments of Book One and the challenge of Glaucon and Adeimantus rule out a variety of more direct routes.
First, Socrates might have tried to settle quickly on a widely accepted account of what justice is and moved immediately to considering whether that is always in one's interests. But Book One rules this strategy out by casting doubt on widely accepted accounts of justice. Socrates cannot simply assume an ordinary conception of justice, because he has found ordinary conceptions of justice lacking. He must say what justice is in order to answer the question put to him. Of course, he does not have perfectly free rein to make justice whatever he should want it to be. Defining justice as happiness, for example, would beg the question, and an account of justice according to which we were required to torture red-headed children for amusement would fail to address the question that Glaucon and Adeimantus take themselves to be asking. Still, Socrates has to say what justice is, on his own terms.
Moreover, Socrates cannot try to define justice by enumerating types of actions required by justice and types of actions forbidden by justice. We might have objected to this strategy for this reason: because action-types can be specified in remarkably various ways and at remarkably different levels of specificity, no list of just or unjust action-types could be comprehensive. But a specific argument in Book One suggests a different reason why Socrates does not employ this strategy. When Cephalus characterizes justice as keeping promises and returning what is owed, Socrates objects by citing a case in which returning what is owed would not be just (331c). This objection potentially has very wide force, as it seems that exceptions could always be found for any action-type that does not include in its description a word like ‘wrong’ or ‘just’. Wrongful killing may always be wrong, but is killing? Just recompense may always be right, but is recompense? This reasoning explains why Socrates does not attempt to define justice by a list of prescribed and proscribed actions.
So Book One makes it difficult for Socrates to take justice for granted. What is worse, the terms in which Socrates accepts the challenge of Glaucon and Adeimantus make it difficult for him to take happiness for granted. If Socrates were to proceed like a consequentialist, he might offer a full account of happiness and then deliver an account of justice that both meets with general approval and shows how justice brings about happiness. But Socrates does not proceed like that. He proceeds as if he were trying to show that justice (helps to) constitute happiness. Note that Socrates does not even do as much as Aristotle does in the Nicomachean Ethics; he does not suggest some general criteria for what happiness is. He is proceeding as if happiness is quite unsettled. But if justice is crucial to happiness and yet unsettled, then he is right to proceed as if happiness were unsettled.
In sum, Socrates needs to construct an account of justice and an account of happiness at the same time, and he needs these accounts to entail without assuming the conclusion that the just person is always happier than the unjust.
How can Socrates establish the relation between personal justice and personal happiness when the nature of personal justice and the nature of personal happiness are up in the air? The difficulty of this task helps to explain why Socrates takes the curious route through the discussion of civic justice and civic happiness. It would be easier to assume that a just city is always more flourishing than an unjust city, for Glaucon and Adeimantus do not question this. If Socrates can give content to this assumption by offering an account of civic justice and civic happiness, then he can propose that a similar relationship between justice and flourishing holds in persons.
Socrates' strategy depends in some measure on an analogy between a city and a person. If what makes a city flourish bears no intelligible relation to what makes a person flourish, Socrates' strategy is ill-founded. Similarly, he will get nowhere if what makes a city just bears no intelligible relation to what makes a person just. But to answer the Republic's question, Socrates does not need a very tight relation between cities and persons. He must convince Glaucon and Adeimantus that on their considered conceptions of personal justice and personal happiness, one is happier being just than unjust, and this he can do quite independently of anything that he says about the flourishing and justice of cities. The discussion of a good city does not have to introduce premises for the argument about personal justice and happiness. It will be useful if it only gives us some reason to entertain an account of persons that we may not have otherwise entertained.
Although this is all that the city-person analogy needs to do, Socrates seems at times to claim more for it, and one of the abiding puzzles about the Republic concerns the exact nature and grounds for the full analogy that Socrates claims. At times Socrates seems to say that the same account of justice must apply to both persons and cities because the same account of any F must apply to all things that are F (e.g., 434d-435a). At other times Socrates seems to say that the same account of justice must apply in both cases because the F-ness of a whole is due to the F-ness of its parts (e.g., 435d-436a). Again, at times Socrates seems to say that these grounds are strong enough to permit a deductive inference: if a city's F-ness is such-and-such, then a person's F-ness must be such-and-such (e.g., 441c9-10). At other times, Socrates would prefer to use the F-ness of the city as a heuristic for locating F-ness in persons (e.g., 368e-369a). Plato is surely right to think that there is some interesting and non-accidental relation between the structural features and values of society and the psychological features and values of persons, but there is much controversy about whether this relation really is strong enough to sustain all of the claims that Socrates makes for it in the Republic.
Still, the Republic primarily requires an answer to Glaucon and Adeimantus' question, and that answer does not depend logically on any strong claims for the analogy between cities and persons. Rather, it depends upon a persuasive account of justice as a personal virtue, and persuasive reasons why one is always happier being just than unjust. So we can turn to these issues before returning to Socrates' remarks about the flourishing city.
Socrates seeks to define justice as one of the cardinal human virtues, and he understands the virtues as states of the soul. So his account of what justice is depends upon his account of the human soul.
According to the Republic, just as the ideal city consists of persons who fall into three classes--rulers, auxiliaries, and producers--so too the human soul consists of psychological attitudes that fall into three classes-rational, spirited, and appetitive. This division of the soul can lead to talk of "parts," and it might also lead some to think about the ways in which we tend to classify psychological states into beliefs and emotions and desires. So it must be emphasized that the Platonic soul is not a physical thing comprising literal parts, despite Socrates' occasional choice of words, and it must be even more strongly emphasized that the rational, spirited, and appetitive kinds of psychological attitudes are not to be identified as beliefs, emotions, and desires, respectively. On the theory Socrates sketches in Book Four and develops thereafter (especially in Books Eight and Nine), humans have, on the one hand, rational desires for knowledge and rational eros, and on the other, spirited beliefs about what is honorable and appetitive beliefs about which kind of psychological attitudes should set the agenda. It seems, as we might put it, that there are representational psychological attitudes of all three kinds, motivating psychological attitudes of all three kinds, and affective attitudes of all three kinds. In fact, it is not even clear that Socrates in the Republic admits of any psychological attitude that is not simultaneously representational, motivating, and affective. Consequently, ‘belief’ and ‘desire’ in translations or discussions of Plato (including this one) must be handled with care; they should not be understood along Humean lines as motivationally inert representations, on the one hand, and non-cognitive motivators, on the other.
Socrates explains his threefold classification of psychological attitudes in two main stages. First, at the end of Book Four, he offers quick arguments for the classification, and these arguments, whether they are convincing or not, shed some light on what the kinds themselves are supposed to be. Then, in Books Eight and Nine, when Socrates discusses four inferior sorts of characterological types and argues for the superiority of the just character, he sheds more light on what the kinds of psychological attitudes are. Both of these stages are important, as the psychological analysis that Socrates provides should be assessed for its overall explanatory power.
In Book Four, psychological attitudes are initially divided into different kinds in order to avoid running afoul of what we might call the principle of non-opposition in our explanations of human experience. According to the principle of non-opposition, which bears comparison with Aristotle's formulation of the principle of non-contradiction (Metaphysics G3 1005b19-20), "the same thing will not be willing to do or undergo opposites in the same respect, in relation to the same thing, at the same time" (426b8-9). Now, it seems obvious that many people very often experience psychological conflict, and it seems natural to explain this psychological conflict in terms of opposition between psychological attitudes. But our desire to allow opposing psychological attitudes in our explanations needs to be rendered consistent with the principle of non-opposition. With many psychological conflicts, this is easy, for the opposing attitudes might be in relation to different things (an attitude in favor of drinking a martini conflicts with an attitude in favor of drinking champagne) or the opposing attitudes might be non-simultaneous (as Hobbes thought to be the case in all psychological conflicts). But what about cases in which we seem to experience opposing attitudes in relation to the same thing at the same time? Don't we sometimes have an attitude in favor of drinking what is in the cup and a simultaneous attitude opposed to drinking what is in the cup (437b-439d)? We can accept this phenomenon and explain it without running afoul of the principle of non-opposition only by supposing that the opposing attitudes do not oppose "in the same respect," and we can do this readily by supposing that we have, on the one hand, appetitive attitudes that arise in us as animals, independent of our considerations about what is good for us, and on the other hand, rational attitudes that track what we conceive to be good for us.
Socrates' appeal to psychological conflict is well-tailored to explain akrasia (weakness of will). In the Protagoras, Socrates denies that anyone willingly does other than what he believes to be best, but here in Republic IV, the door is opened for a person to act on an appetitive attitude that conflicts with a rational attitude for what is best. How far the door is open to akrasia awaits further discussion below. For now, we need to face the worry that Socrates' argument is also well-tailored to give rise to a multitude of psychological kinds, given the pervasiveness of psychological conflict. To assuage this worry, Socrates can point out that some apparent conflicts are non-simultaneous (à la Hobbes) and that other apparently conflicting attitudes are in relation to different objects (martini vs. champagne). These diachronic and external conflicts would not require an internal division of psychological attitudes in order to save the principle of non-opposition. Of course, anyone in the grips of the worry might find this response ad hoc, but Socrates is not done. He can support his distinction between internal psychological conflict and diachronic or external psychological conflict if he can justify his particular division of psychological attitudes into kinds on independent grounds, and he can do this if he can show how his particular psychological classification provides the best explanation of human experiences other than psychological conflict. This suggests that the appeal to psychological classification in order to explain psychological conflict should be assessed together with the appeal to the same psychological classification in order to explain other phenomena.
A broader appeal to explanatory power would seem to be what Socrates is hoping for when he argues that there exists a spirited kind of psychological attitudes in addition to the rational and appetitive kinds (439e-441c). Here he does not use the principle of non-opposition explicitly, but instead points to a range of phenomena, including anger, disgust, and a sense of honor. These phenomena would seem to be neither entirely independent nor entirely dependent on our consideration of what is good for us, and so they would be difficult to explain by reference to rational and appetitive attitudes. The best explanation perhaps requires a uniquely spirited kind of attitude.
The division of the soul first established in Book Four sets up even more audaciously imaginative patterns of psychological explanation in Books Eight and Nine. Here Socrates notes that different people have different psychological constitutions. In the most basic version of this pattern, Socrates divides the world into people ruled by their rational attitudes, those ruled by their spirited attitudes, and those ruled by their appetitive attitudes (580d-581e, esp. 581c): the first love wisdom and truth, the second love victory and honor, and the third profit and money. This simplistic division, it might be noted in passing, lays the groundwork for ongoing debates about whether it is best to be a philosopher, a politician, or an epicure (see, e.g., Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics I 5 and X 6-8). But more important for our purposes here, this basic classification greatly illuminates the division of the soul.
First, we learn about the organizing aims of each of the psychological kinds. Rational attitudes not only track what they conceive to be good for the person, but also seek wisdom. This may seem either a strange bifurcation of aims or a narrow identification of wisdom with human good, but on the view of Books Six and Seven, the drive to grasp the truth and achieve wisdom must go through knowledge of what the good is, and knowledge of one's own good will also depend upon knowledge of what the good is. So the rational attitudes have a unified quest: not just for what they conceive to be good for the person, but for what is truly good for the person. Spirited attitudes, by contrast, track social preeminence and honor. If ‘good’ is the organizing predicate for rational attitudes, ‘honorable’ or ‘fine’ is the organizing predicate for spirited attitudes. Finally, appetitive attitudes seek material satisfaction for bodily urges, which is, at its most general and fungible, money.
The basic division of the world into philosophers, honor-lovers, and money-lovers also illuminates what Socrates means by talking of being ruled by one kind of psychological attitude. If one kind of psychological attitude dominates in you, then aims of that kind of psychological attitude are your aims. If, for example, you are ruled by spirited attitudes, then your rational attitudes conceive of your good in terms of what is honorable. Rational attitudes have their own aim, to get their conception of what is good right, but in a soul perfectly ruled by spirited attitudes, where there are no genuine psychological conflicts between different kinds of attitudes, the rational attitudes for truth and wisdom must be limited to those that are also held to be honorable.
Still, Plato's full psychological theory is much more complicated than the basic division of persons would suggest. First, there are different kinds of appetitive attitudes (558d-559c, 571a-572b): some are necessary for human beings; some are unnecessary but regulable ("lawful"), and some are unnecessary and entirely uncontrollable ("lawless"). So there are in fact five kinds of pure psychological constitutions: aristocratically constituted persons (those ruled by their rational attitudes), timocratically constituted persons (those ruled by their spirited attitudes), oligarchically constituted persons (ruled by necessary appetitive attitudes), democratically constituted persons (ruled by unnecessary appetitive attitudes), and tyrannically constituted persons (ruled by lawless appetitive attitudes).
The second complication is that some people are not perfectly ruled by one class of their attitudes, but are subject to continuing conflicts between, say, attitudes in favor of doing what is honorable and appetitive attitudes in favor of pursuing a shameful tryst. Socrates does not concentrate on these people, nor does he say how common they are. But he does acknowledge their existence (544cd, cf. 445c). Moreover, the occurrence of akrasia would seem to require their existence. For if I am perfectly ruled by my spirited attitudes, then I take my good to be what is honorable, and how could I be akratic? My spirited attitudes and my rational attitudes are in line, so there will be no overpowering of rational attitudes about what is best by spirited attitudes. You might suppose that my appetitive attitudes could overcome my sense of what is honorable, but in that case, it would seem that I am not, after all, perfectly ruled by my spirited attitudes. Things might seem different with people ruled by their appetitive attitudes. Certainly, if I were perfectly ruled by appetitive attitudes, then I would be susceptible to akrasia of the impetuous sort, acting on appetitive desires without reflectively endorsing them as good. But impetuous akrasia is quite distinct from the standard akrasia in which I endorse phi-ing as best for me and at just that moment intentionally psi instead, and standard akrasia would seem to be impossible in any soul that is perfectly ruled by any one kind of psychological attitudes. If you think that competing appetitive attitudes could give rise to a strict case of standard akrasia, you should recall how Socrates would have to explain these cases of psychological conflict in order to avoid multiplying his divisions in the soul.
So the Republic's psychological theory is enormously complex. Moreover, many of the particular details of the Republic's psychological are dazzling, as, for example, the Freudian recognition of Oedipal desires that come out only in dreams (571cd). But the general form of the theory is enough for Socrates to begin to answer Glaucon and Adeimantus' question.
In Book Four, Socrates defines each of the cardinal virtues in terms of the complicated psychology he has just sketched. A person is wise just in case her rational attitudes are functioning well, so that her rational part "has in it the knowledge of what is advantageous for each part [of the soul] and for the whole in common of the three parts" (442c5-8). So the unwise person has a faulty conception of what is good for him. A person is courageous just in case her spirited attitudes do not change in the face of pains and pleasures but stay in agreement with what is rationally recognized as fearsome and not (442bc). So the coward will, in the face of prospective pains, fail to bear up to what he rationally believes is not genuinely fearsome, and the rash person will, in the face of prospective pleasures, rush headlong into what he rationally believes to be fearsome. A person is temperate or moderate just in case her different kinds of attitudes are in agreement. So the intemperate person has appetitive or spirited attitudes in competition with the rational attitudes, appetitive or spirited attitudes other than those the rational attitudes deem to be good. Finally, a person is just just in case all three "parts" of her soul are functioning as they should (441d12-e2; cf. 443c9-e2). Justice, then, brings the other virtues in its wake: anyone who is just is entirely virtuous. So the unjust person fails to be moderate, or fails to be wise, or fails to be courageous.
Actually, the relation among the virtues seems tighter than that, for it seems that the unjust person necessarily fails to be wise, courageous, and temperate. You might try to deny this. You might say that a person could be courageous-with spirited attitudes that track perfectly what the rational attitudes say is fearsome and not, in the face of any pleasures and pains-but still be unjust insofar has her rational attitudes are inadequately developed, failing to know what really is fearsome. But Socrates seems to balk at this possibility by contrasting the civically courageous whose spirit preserves law-inculcated beliefs about what is fearsome and not and the genuinely courageous in whom, presumably, spirit preserves knowledge about what is fearsome and not (430a-c). So you might say instead that a person could be moderate-utterly without appetitive attitudes at odds with what his rational attitudes say is good for him-but still be unjust insofar as his rational attitudes are inadequately developed and fail to know what really is good. But this picture of a meek, but moderate soul seems to sell short the requirements of moderation, which are not merely that there be no insurrections in the soul but also that there be agreement that the rational attitudes should rule. This would seem to require that there actually be appetitive attitudes that are in agreement with the rational attitudes' conception of what is good, which would in turn require that the rational attitudes be sufficiently strong to have a developed conception of what is good. Moreover, it would seem to require that the rational attitudes which endorse ruling be ruling, which would in turn require that the rational attitudes are at least on the path toward determining what really is good for the person. If these considerations are correct, then the unjust are lacking in virtue tout court, whereas the just possess all of the virtues.
After sketching these four virtues in Book Four, Socrates is ready to move from considering what justice is in a person to why a person should be just (444e). But this is premature. Socrates is moving to show that it is always better to have a just soul, but he was asked to show that it is always better to be the just person who does just actions. We might doubt that an answer concerning psychological justice is relevant to the question concerning practical justice.
It is easy to misstate this objection. The problem is not that the question is about conventional justice and Socrates is failing to address conventional justice. Neither the question nor the answer is bound to conventional justice, given what happened in Book One. Moreover, the problem is not that Socrates' answer is relevant only if the class of the psychologically just and the class of the practically just are coextensive. That would require Socrates to show that everyone who acts justly has a just soul, and Socrates quite reasonably shows no inclination for that thesis. He may have to establish some connection between doing just actions and becoming psychologically just if he is to give reasons to those who are not yet psychologically just to do just actions, but an account of habituation would be enough to do this (cf. 443e4-6, 444c10-d1).
The real problem raised by the objection is this: Socrates must be able to justify the claim that people with just souls are practically just. First, he must be able to show that the psychologically just refrain from injustice, and second, he must be able to show that the psychologically just do what is required by justice. The first point receives a gesture when Socrates is trying to secure the claim that harmonious functioning of the whole soul really deserves to be called justice (442e4-443a11), but he offers no real argument. Perhaps the best we can do on his behalf is to insist that the first point is not a thesis for argument but a bold empirical hypothesis. On this view, it is simply an empirical question whether all those who have the motivations to do unjust things happen to have souls that are out of balance, and an army of psychologists would be needed to answer the question.
That might seem bad enough, but the second point that Socrates needs to establish does not even receive a gesture. There is no denying the presence of this second requirement on the grounds that justice is a matter of refraining from harm ("negative duties") and not of helping others ("positive duties"). Plato's Republic makes justice a matter of both negative duties and positive duties. Socrates does not criticize the Book One suggestion that justice requires helping friends (332a ff.); he and his interlocutors agree that justice requires respect for parents and care for the gods (443a9-10); and they treat the principle that each should do his job (and thereby contribute to the city) as the image of justice (443c4-8).
Before we can consider Socrates' answer to the question of the Republic, we must have reason to accept that those who have harmonious souls do what is required by justice. Otherwise, we cannot be sure that psychological harmony is justice. Unfortunately, Socrates does not give any explicit attention to this worry at the end of Book Four or in the argument of Books Eight and Nine. But there are other places to look for a solution to this worry. First, we might look to Books Five through Seven. Second, we might look to Books Two and Three.
Consider Books Five through Seven. In Book Four Socrates has told us that the just person is wise and thus knows what is good for him, but he has not told us anything about what knowledge or the good is. The digression of Books Five through Seven clearly addresses these issues. This opens up the possibility that knowledge of the good provides the crucial link between psychological justice and just actions. Even if that possibility goes unrealized, knowledge of the good should fill out our account of virtue. So Books Five to Seven are valuable in completing the account of perfectly virtuous motivations. This completion turns out to be surprising. Socrates makes it clear that one is virtuous if and only if one is a philosopher. For we already knew that virtue requires knowledge, and now we learn that only the philosophers have knowledge (esp. 474b-480a).
The philosophers are initially distinguished from non-philosophers because they answer questions like ‘What is beautiful?’ by identifying the non-sensible property (form) of beauty instead of some sensible property or particulars (474b-480a). Socrates does not name any philosophers who can knowledgeably answer questions like that. In fact, his account of how philosophers would be educated in the ideal city suggests that the ability to give knowledgeable answers requires an enormous amount of (largely mathematical) learning in advance of the questions themselves (521b-540a). How would this mathematical learning and knowledge of forms affect one's motivating attitudes?
One effect can be found by interpreting the form of the good that the philosopher comes to grasp, since this should shape the philosopher's rational conception of what is good for her. The form of the good is a shadowy presence in the Republic, but it is not unreasonable to suppose that goodness is coherence or harmony. This interpretation explains the importance of mathematics to the ascent to the good (through mathematics an account of the one over the many is learned), the superiority of the good over the other forms (the good is the unity or coherence of them, and not another alongside them), the goodness of the other forms (they are good by being part of the unified or coherent order), the intelligibility of the other forms (they are fully known only teleologically), and the overwhelming importance of unity and harmony to the ethics and politics of the Republic (see especially 462ab). If this interpretation is correct, then the philosophers recognize their good in the harmony of their psychological attitudes. Grasping the form of the good gives one a new appreciation of one's other attitudes: one now knows that one's psychological attitudes are good insofar as they are parts of a coherent set.
But there are other ways in which mathematical learning and knowledge of forms might affect one's motivating attitudes. Socrates suggests one way when he says that a philosopher will aspire to imitate the harmony among the forms (500b-d). It has also been suggested that Socrates is assuming that lovers of the forms will desire to procreate this order by cultivating more order and virtue in the world, as Diotima suggests in the Symposium. These suggestions seem to provide ways of seeing how knowledge of the forms motivates just actions that help other people, and thus to solve the standing worry about the relation between psychological justice and practical justice.
Unfortunately, it is far from obvious that Socrates wants to use these suggestions in this way. He does not actually say in the Republic that knowledge of the forms freely motivates positive actions on behalf of other people. In fact, he says seven times that the philosophers in the ideal city will have to be compelled to rule and do their part in sustaining the perfectly just city (500d4, 519e4, 520a8, 520e2, 521b7, 539e3, 540b5). It is possible to understand this compulsion as the constraint of justice: the philosophers rule because it is just for them to rule. But Socrates' own way of characterizing the compulsion suggests an alternative picture, according to which the compulsion is a law that requires those who are educated to be philosophers to rule. Moreover, this alternative picture seems required by Socrates' insistence that the philosophers are the best rulers because they prefer not to rule even while they are ruling (520e4-521b11, with 519c4-6). On this picture, the philosophers' knowledge of justice alone does not motivate them to rule; rather, their knowledge of justice motivates them to follow the law, which justly compels them to rule.
There is another reason to worry about explaining just actions by the motivating power of knowledge. If we think that the philosophers are motivated to do what is just by their knowledge of the forms, then we have, at least potentially, opened up an enormous gap between philosophers and non-philosophers. In addition to the epistemic gap-the philosophers have knowledge and the non-philosophers do not-we have a motivational gap-the philosophers' knowledge gives them motivations to do what is required by justice, and the non-philosophers are not similarly motivated. This gap suggests some rather unpalatable conclusions about the character of non-philosophers' lives even in the ideal city, and it also sits poorly with Socrates' evident desire to take the philosophers' justice as a paradigm that can be usefully approximated by non-philosophers (472c4-d1).
We need an explanation of how imperfectly constituted people can approximate perfectly constituted people. We might hope, as well, that this explanation would allow us to say that all the perfectly constituted people act as justice requires, for that would give us a connection between psychological justice and practical justice that does not rely on the special motivating power of knowledge.
This brings us to Books Two and Three, where Socrates offers a long discussion of how to educate the guardians for the ideal city. This education is most notable for its carefully censored "reading list;" the young guardians-to-be will not be exposed to inappropriate images of gods and human beings. But Socrates is remarkably optimistic about the results of a sufficiently careful education. Well-trained guardians will "praise fine things, be pleased by them, receive them into his soul, and, being nurtured by them, become fine and good," and each will "rightly object to what is shameful, hating it while he's still young and unable to grasp the reason" (401e4-402a2). Note that Socrates has the young guardians not only responding to good things as honorable (with spirited attitudes), but also becoming fine and good. Moreover, Socrates is confident that the spirited guardians are stably good: when he is describing the possibility of civic courage in Book Four, he suggests that proper education can stain the spirited part of the soul with the right dispositions so deeply that they will be preserved "through everything" (429b8, 429c8, 430b2-3).
This optimism suggests that the motivations to do what is right are acquired early in moral education, built into a soul that might become, eventually, perfectly just. And this in turn suggests one reason why Socrates might have skipped the question of why the psychologically just can be relied upon to do what is right. Socrates might be assuming that anyone who is psychologically just must have been raised well, and that anyone who is raised well can be relied upon to do what is right. So understood, early childhood education, and not knowledge of the forms, is the driving force that links psychological justice and just action.
Of course, there are questions about how far Socrates could extend this optimism about imperfect virtue among non-philosophers. Perhaps honor-loving members of the auxiliary class have psychological harmony secured by their consistent attachment to what they have learned is honorable, but what about the producers? Can their attachment to the satisfaction of bodily desires be educated in such a way that it results, in optimal social circumstances, in a tolerably well-ordered soul? These interesting questions require careful consideration of Plato's complicated psychology; they will be considered more fully below.
The questions about what is added by knowledge and how much is present without knowledge are of the utmost importance in settling questions about how Plato conceives of degrees of virtue. This account has just scratched the surface in order to indicate two general ways of linking psychological justice to just action. If one of them works, then Socrates is entitled to argue that it is always better to be just than unjust by showing why it is always better to have a harmonious soul.
It is possible to find in the Republic as many as five separate arguments for the claim that it is better to be just than unjust, without regard to how other people and gods perceive us. The first appeals to an analogy between psychological health and physical health in Book Four (445a-b). The second, third, and fourth are what Socrates calls his three "proofs" in Books Eight and Nine (543c-580c, esp. 576b-580c; 580c-583a; 583b-588a). And the fifth is the image of the human soul consisting of a little human being (the rational "part"), a lion (the spirited "part"), and a many-headed beast (the appetitive "part") (588b ff.). Yet the first of these is interrupted and said in Book Eight to be continuous with the first "proof" of Books Eight and Nine (543c), and the last of them seems to be offered more as a concluding image than as an independent argument. This whittling leaves us with the three arguments that Socrates labels his "proofs" (580c9, cf. 583b), the first being a long discussion of psychological health and disease and the second and third being parries concerning pleasure.
The first argument begins and is aborted in Book Four. After sketching his account of justice in the soul, Socrates asks Glaucon whether they are ready to compare the happiness of the just and the unjust. Glaucon immediately declares the comparison silly: the unjust have souls that are ruined and in turmoil. Socrates presses on for a fuller reckoning, nonetheless, and that fuller reckoning is interrupted.
When Socrates resumes in Book Eight where he had left off in Book Four, he offers a long account of four defective psychological types. The list of four is not exhaustive (544cd, cf. 445c), but it captures the four imperfect kinds of pure psychological constitutions: pure rule by spirited attitudes, pure rule by necessary appetitive attitudes, pure rule by unnecessary but regulable appetitive attitudes, and pure rule by lawless appetitive attitudes. At the end of this long discussion, Socrates will again ask which sort of person lives the best life: the aristocratic soul of Books Six and Seven, or one of the other souls of Books Eight and Nine?
We might expect Socrates and Glaucon to argue carefully by elimination, showing the just life to be better than every sort of unjust life. But they do not. Instead, they quickly contrast the tyrannical soul with the aristocratic soul-the most unjust with the most just. In a way, they are picking up on Glaucon's original demand (in Book Two) to see how the perfectly just-who is most unfortunate but still just-is better than the perfectly unjust-who is unjust but still esteemed. But this symmetry is not enough to acquit the procedure. If the comparison of the tyrant and the philosopher does not generate some general lessons that tell in favor of justice over all forms of injustice, then the argument is dubious. So we should look at the comparison of the tyrant and the philosopher with an eye open for some general lessons.
Socrates and Glaucon characterize the person ruled by his lawless attitudes as enslaved, as least able to do what it wants, as full of disorder and regret, as poor and unsatisfiable, and as fearful (577c-578a). These characterizations fit in a logical order. The tyrannical soul wants satisfactions that depend upon external circumstances; in this way it is enslaved. Insofar as the tyrannical soul is most filled with never-ending desires that cannot all be satisfied and most filled with outsized desires for more than can be satisfied, then the tyrannical soul is least able to do what it wants. These initial difficulties give rise to the rest. The tyrant is full of disorder and regret by virtue of not having been able to do what he wants, is poor and unsatisfiable by virtue of now being unable to do what he wants, and is fearful by virtue of perceiving future inability to do what he wants. The result is a miserable existence, and the misery is rooted in attitudes that demand more satisfaction than a person can achieve. The tyrant does not have the capacity to do what he wants to do.
Contrast the philosophical soul. The philosopher is most able to do what she chooses to do, for she chooses to do what is best, and as long as one has agency, there would seem to be a doable best. (Should circumstances make a certain apparent best undoable, then it will no longer be best.) It might even seem that the philosopher's capacity to do what is best guarantees her success. But this pushes the interpretation too far. First, we should not suppose that what is best is always available. Socrates is quite clear that some appetitive attitudes are necessary, and one can well imagine circumstances of extreme deprivation in which the necessary appetitive attitudes (for food or drink, say) are unsatisfiable. Second, the capacity to do what is best may well require engaging in certain kinds of activities in order to maintain itself. Even if the philosopher can satisfy her necessary appetitive attitudes, she may be prevented by unfortunate circumstances from the sorts of regular thought and action that are required to hold onto the capacity to do what is best. These considerations suggest that a virtuous soul does not guarantee the capacity to do what one wants. Even if the philosophical soul is easily the most able to do what it chooses, and the closest thing to a sure bet for this capacity, it does not by itself guarantee the capacity.
This comparison between the tyrannical soul and the philosophical soul does all the work that Socrates needs if the capacity to do what one wants correlates closely with human flourishing and if the lessons about the tyrant's incapacity generalize to the other defective psychological constitutions. Start with the second point. A person who seeks honor or money above all might be fortunate enough to find himself in circumstances in which he regularly has the capacity to do as he chooses. But the capacity would not be fully his. It would depend in deep and obvious ways upon a cooperative environment that nurtures him and provides an orderly context in which he can do what he values as honorable or as lucrative. As long as that environment is secure, he will not be racked by regret, or frustration, or fear. He will be able to do what he chooses to do. This explains how the members of the lower classes in Socrates' ideal city can have a kind of capacity to do what they want, even though they are fully, slavishly dependent upon the rulers' work (cf. 590cd).
The characterization of appropriately ruled non-philosophers as slavish might suggest a special concern for the "heteronomous" character of their capacity to do what they choose and a special valorization of the philosophers' "autonomous" capacity. But we should be hesitant about applying these frequently confused and possibly anachronistic categories of thought to the Republic. Plato would probably prefer to think in terms of self-sufficiency, and for the purposes of Socrates' argument here, it is enough to contrast the way a producer's capacity is deeply dependent upon social surroundings and the way a philosopher's capacity is relatively free from this dependence.
This contrast must not be undersold, for it is plausible to think that the self-sufficiency of the philosopher makes him more flourishing. Appropriately ruled non-philosophers can enjoy a kind of happiness only so long as their circumstances are appropriately ruled, and this makes their happiness far less stable than what the philosophers enjoy. Things in the world tend to change, and the philosopher is in a much better position to flourish through these changes. Those of us living in imperfect cities, looking to use the Republic as a model for how to live (cf. 592b), need to emulate the philosopher in order to pursue stable, reliable happiness.
Nevertheless, so far as this argument shows, the happiness of appropriately ruled non-philosophers is just as real as the happiness of philosophers. This argument understands happiness in terms of the capacity to do what one wants to do, to realize what seems best to one, and it seems that exceptionally well-trained persons in exceptionally well-ordered cities can be happy whether they are pursuing what is honorable or the objects of necessary appetitive attitudes or what is known to be really good. Of course, they will be happy only if they do not consider the dependence of their happiness on external fortune; if they realize that their happiness depends upon their remarkable circumstances and if they believe that these circumstances are in jeopardy, then they will be racked by fear. But if their circumstances are sufficiently remarkable, they might not consider any threats to their happiness. Such people in such circumstances might be less happy than philosophers, but Socrates' first argument does not show that they are.
Socrates needs further argument in any case if he wants to convince those of us in imperfect circumstances (like Glaucon and Adeimantus) to pursue the philosophical life of perfect justice. The first argument tries to show that anyone who wants to satisfy her desires perfectly should cultivate certain kinds of desires rather than others. We can reject this argument in either of two ways, by taking issue with his analysis of which desires are regularly satisfiable and which desires are not, or by explaining why a person should not want to satisfy her desires perfectly. The first response calls for a quasi-empirical investigation of a difficult sort, but the second seems easy. We can just argue that a good human life must be subject to regret and loss. Of course, it is not enough to say that the human condition is in fact marked by regret and loss. There is no inconsistency in maintaining that one should aim at a secure life in order to live the best possible human life while also realizing that the best possible human life will be marked by insecurity. In fact, one might even argue that the proper experience of fragility requires attachment to security as one's end. So to reject Socrates' argument, we must show that it is wrong to aim at a life that is free of regret and loss: we must show that the pursuit of security leads one to reject certain desires that one should not reject. In this way, we move beyond a discussion of which desires are satisfiable, and we tackle the question about the value of what is desired and the value of the desiring itself. To address this possible objection, Socrates needs to give us a different argument.
This brings us to what many commentators have thought to be an odd feature of Plato's Republic. After delivering a long "proof" that it is always better to be just than unjust, Socrates piles on two more. This can seem strange. After all, the geometer does not need to offer multiple proofs of his theorem. What might seem worse, the additional proofs concern pleasure, and thereby introduce-seemingly at the eleventh hour-a heap of new considerations for the ethics of the Republic. For these reasons, some commentators have seen these "pleasure proofs" as awkward appendices or as mere reassurances that the just life is not unpleasant. But in fact, they are crucial to Socrates' case, as the considerations raised at the end of the previous section show. Socrates does not explicitly acknowledge these considerations, but Plato dramatizes them. Recall that Socrates has offered in the Republic not merely to demonstrate that it is always better to be just than unjust but to persuade Glaucon and Adeimantus (but especially Glaucon-see 327a1 and 357a1-b3 and the phrasing in Book Two) of this claim. Insofar as Glaucon shows sympathy for spirited attitudes (372d with the discussion in 4.1 below, and cf. 548d), his attachment to these attitudes could survive the realization that they are far from perfectly satisfiable. He may say, "I can see the point of perfectly satisfiable attitudes, but those attitudes and the objects of those attitudes are not as good as my less-than-perfectly satisfiable attitudes." Glaucon needs to be shown that the rewards of carrying insecure attitudes do not make up for the insecurity.
Socrates needs to offer additional proofs for a second reason, too, for he needs to complete his account of psychological attitudes. At the end of Book Five, Socrates says that faculties (at least psychological faculties) are distinguished by their results (their rate of success) and by their objects (what they concern) (477cd). So far, he has discussed only the success-rates of various kinds of psychological attitudes. He needs to discuss the objects of various kinds of psychological attitudes in order to complete his account. If we did not have the discussion of the second proof, in particular, we would have a very incomplete picture of the moral psychology of the Republic.
The two arguments that Socrates proceeds to make are frustratingly difficult. They are very quick, and though they concern "pleasures," Socrates never says exactly what a pleasure is. (At one point (585d11), the now-standard translation of the Republic by Grube and Reeve suggests that "being filled with what is appropriate to our nature is pleasure," but it may be better to read less into the Greek by rendering the clause "being filled with what is appropriate to our nature is pleasant.") The first argument suggests that pleasures might be activities of a certain kind, but the remarkably abstract second argument does not provide any special support to that suggestion. Even if a convincing account of how Plato wants us to conceive of pleasure in the Republic is wanting, however, we can get a grasp on the form of the two pleasure proofs.
The first "pleasure proof" is a kind of appeal to authority, in four easy steps. First, Socrates suggests that just as each part of the soul has its own characteristic desires and pleasures, so persons have characteristic desires and pleasures depending upon which part of their soul rules them. The characteristic pleasure of philosophers is learning. The characteristic pleasure of honor-lovers is being honored. The characteristic pleasure of money-lovers is making money. Next, Socrates suggests that each of these three different kinds of person would say that her own characteristic activities are most pleasant-that her own pleasure is best. So, third, to decide which pleasure really is best, we need to determine which sort of person's judgment is best. Socrates suggests that whoever has the most reason, experience, and argument is the best judge. What other criteria could he have suggested? Finally, Socrates argues that the philosopher is better than the honor-lover and the money-lover in reason, experience, and argument.
It has sometimes been thought that the philosopher cannot be better off in experience, for the philosopher has never lived as an adult who is fully committed to the pleasures of the money-lover. But this point does not disable Socrates' argument. The philosopher does not have exactly the experience that the money-lover has, but the philosopher has far more experience of the money-lover's pleasures than the money-lover has of the philosopher's pleasures. The comparative judgment is enough to secure Socrates' conclusion: because the philosopher is a better judge than the others, the philosopher's judgment has a better claim on the truth. So we have some reason for thinking that the activities desired by the money-lover and those desired by the honor-lover are less pleasurable than the philosopher's activities.
But this first proof does not explain why the distinction in pleasures is made; the appeal to the philosopher's authority as a judge gives no account of the philosopher's reasons for her judgment. Moreover, the first pleasure proof does not say that the philosopher's pleasures are vastly superior to those of the money-lover and the honor-lover. So Glaucon-or anyone else tempted to avoid the mathematical studies of Book Seven-might think that the superiority of the philosopher's psychological justice is slight, and given the disrepute heaped on the philosophers (487a ff.), Glaucon or anyone else might decide that the less-than-perfectly just life is better overall. Socrates needs to show that the philosopher's activities are vastly better than the non-philosopher's activities in order to answer the challenge originally put forth in Book Two by Glaucon and Adeimantus. So it is for very good reason that Socrates proceeds to offer a second pleasure proof that he promises to be the "greatest and most decisive overthrow" for the unjust (583b6-7).
Socrates' final argument moves in three broad steps. The first step establishes that pleasure and pain are not exhaustive contradictories but opposites, separated by a calm middle that is neither pain nor pleasure. This may sometimes seem false. The removal of pain can seem to be pleasant, and the removal of a pleasure can seem to be painful. But these appearances are deceptive. We can readily recognize the contrast between pleasures that fill a lack and thereby replace a pain (these are not genuine pleasures) and pleasures that do not fill a lack and thereby replace a pain (these are genuine pleasures). The second step in the argument is to establish that most bodily pleasures-and the most intense of these-fill a painful lack and are not genuine pleasures. Finally, Socrates takes his third step by arguing that the philosopher's pleasures do not fill a painful lack and are genuine pleasures. Contra the epicure's assumption, the philosopher's pleasures are more substantial than the pleasures of the flesh.
Even at the end of his three "proofs," Socrates knows that he cannot yet have fully persuaded Glaucon and Adeimantus that it is always better to be just than unjust. Their beliefs and desires have been stained too deeply by a world filled with mistakes, especially by the misleading tales of the poets. To turn Glaucon and Adeimantus more fully toward virtue, Socrates will need to undercut their respect for the poets, and he will need to begin to stain their souls anew. So there is more work to be done in the Republic. But Socrates' theoretical arguments on behalf of justice are finished. The work that remains to be done-especially the sketch of a soul at the end of Book Nine and the myth of an afterlife in Book Ten-should deepen without transforming our appreciation for the psychological ethics of the Republic.
The Republic contributes to political philosophy in two main ways, first by advancing claims about how a good city would be arranged and then by analyzing the evolution and shortcomings of bad regimes. Discussions of the first have been dominated by the attempt to characterize Plato's politics by one or more "isms," including utopianism, communism, feminism, and totalitarianism. We can survey Plato's detailed proposals for the ideal city and assess their broader implications by examining the warrant for each of these characterizations in turn. Then we can take up the second way in which the Republic contributes to politics.
Before we proceed to our first "ism," however, we should notice that Socrates actually describes two apparently ideal cities in the Republic. The first, simple city is sketched very briefly, and is rejected by Glaucon as a "city of pigs" though Socrates calls it "the healthy city" (369b-372e). The second, initially called by Socrates a "fevered city" and a "city of luxuries" (372e) but later purified of its luxuries (see especially 399e) and characterized as "Kallipolis" (527c2), includes the features described in Books Two, Three, and Four. (At 543cd, Glaucon suggests that it is possible to see a third city in the Republic by insisting that the additional claims of Book Five and later make for an entirely different city than the purified city of luxuries described in Books Two through Four, but I see the later claims as more explicit explorations of the second city.) Most of the alleged "isms" attached to the politics of Plato's Republic--communism, feminism, and totalitarianism--gain no foothold at all in the brief description of the first city, but another "ism"--utopianism--actually helps to explain the contrast between the two cities and gives us reason to take seriously Socrates' arrangements for the second city.
When we call some society a utopia, we mean that it is ideal (eu-topia = "good place"), but we sometimes mean as well that it is necessarily fictional (ou-topia = "no place"). When Plato is charged with utopianism--as he has been frequently charged, with relish, by modern political theorists since Machiavelli--he is being accused of describing a political ideal that rests on an unrealistic picture of human beings. This accusation is generally leveled at the second city discussed at length in the Republic, and it may be true of that city. But before we consider that version of the charge, we should see that it is definitely true of the first city, and that Plato knew it to be so.
The first city described so briefly in Book Two can seem to be an ideal-utopia, but this impression does not withstand scrutiny. Rather, the first city is a noplace-utopia. It is an exclusively economic society, a model of how the necessary appetitive attitudes would be optimally satisfied in a society of persons ruled exclusively by necessary appetitive attitudes. At the center of the model is a principle of specialization: each person should perform just the task to which he is best suited. Socrates later makes it clear that people who are ruled by their necessary appetitive attitudes can live harmonious lives only if they are ruled by reason from without (esp. 590cd; cf. 586ab), but the first city makes no provision for rational rule. So the first city is inconsistent with the Republic's view of human nature, and thus (by Socrates' lights) impossible. As an impossibility, it cannot be the ideal-utopia.
But Socrates does have very good reasons for introducting the nowhere-utopia of the first city. First, because the first city shows us how the necessary appetitive attitudes would be optimally satisfied in the best circumstances, it shows us how the producer class will live in the second city that is ruled by those with knowledge. In other words, the first city is really an initial sketch of part of the second city. Second, the principle of specialization that is crucial to the optimal satisfaction of necessary appetitive attitudes will prove to be generalizable into a principle of specialization that is crucial to the optimal satisfaction of all psychological attitudes (442d-444a with 432b-434c). Third, the picture of the first city begins to persuade Glaucon to turn his back on the merely appetitive reasons to reject justice. Glaucon reacts to the first city with spirited indignation, declaiming that it is fit for pigs and not human beings. In particular, the first city lacks couches, tables, relishes, and the other things required for a symposium, the cornerstone of a civilized human life. Glaucon is not calling for satisfaction of unnecessary appetitive attitudes, for the relishes he insists on are later recognized to be among the objects of necessary appetitive attitudes (559b). Rather, he is motivated by a spirited sense of what is honorable and fitting for a human being. He is insisting that there is more to a good human life than the satisfaction of appetitive attitudes.
The importance of the first city can scarcely be overstated. The Republic has two kinds of arguments for the superiority of the just life. The first appeals to the efficient satisfaction of psychological attitudes and the second appeals to the intrinsic value of different kinds of psychological satisfaction. The sketch of the first city takes the initial step for both of these arguments--the first argument in the principle of specialization and the second argument in Glaucon's reaction to the world of necessary appetitive attitudes. So while nowhere-utopianism is true of the first city, it is hardly an objection to the first city.
By contrast, nowhere-utopianism would be an objection to the second city. Socrates repeatedly insists that the ideal city of philosopher-rulers, guardian soldiers, and producers is not impossible (456bc, 502a-c, 540de). On his view, the ideal city requires its residents to reach their fullest psychological potential, but it does not require them to do more than their psychology allows. So nowhere-utopianism cannot be persuasively advanced as an objection to the Republic on the grounds that Socrates admits the impossibility of the second city. But the charge might stick in one of two other ways. First, we might think that the psychology of the Republic is fanciful. On this view, though the second city is possible, given the psychology, we should not give the Republic its psychology. To sustain this view, we should falsify some psychological claim that Socrates makes, and we should then show how that psychological claim is crucial to the political ideal of the second city. When this criticism is advanced, it is usually in very sweeping terms: Plato's psychology underplays self-interest, say. In these general terms, the criticism is false. Socrates seems acutely aware of how dangerous and selfish appetitive attitudes are. But more specific criticisms of Plato's psychology may well be tenable.
A second way of charging the second city of the Republic with nowhere-utopianism is weaker. We might concede to the Republic its psychology, concede the possibility of the second city, and nevertheless insist that the second city is so impractical as to be merely fanciful. A hard-nosed political scientist might have this sort of response. But political theorizing need not propose ideas ready for implementation in order to propose ideas relevant to ready implementation. Plato is constructing a model of perfect city (and a model of a perfect soul) to give us targets by which to judge our own condition. This can work in very general terms: if we see in the ideals the unity and coherence that make them ideal, we can also see where our own cities and souls are defective. But it can also work in more specific terms: we should be able to recognize and promote the strategies and policies crucial to the ideal--the careful moral education societally and the habitual regulation of appetitive desire personally, the equal opportunity for work societally and development of multiple kinds of psychological attitudes personally.
So it is far from obvious that Plato's Republic is objectionably nowhere-utopian. Of course, it might also be far from obvious that Plato's Republic is attractively ideal-utopian. We need to turn to other features of the second city that have led readers to praise and blame it.
One of the most striking features of the second city is its abolition of private families and sharp limitation on private property in the two guardian classes. Starting with Aristotle, this communism in the Republic's ideal city has been the target of confusion and criticism. On the one hand, Aristotle (at Politics 1264a11-22) and others have expressed uncertainty about the extent of communism in the ideal city. On the other, they have argued against the provision of any communism in an ideal political community.
There should be no confusion about private property. When Socrates describes the living situation of the guardian classes in the ideal city (415d-417b), he is clear that private property will be sharply limited, and when he discusses the kinds of regulations the rulers need to have in place for the whole city (421c ff.), he is clear that the producers will have enough private property to make the regulation of wealth and poverty a concern. But confusion about scope of communal living arrangements is possible, due to the backhanded way in which Socrates introduces this controversial proposal. The abolition of private families enters as a casual afterthought. Socrates says that there is no need to list everything that the rulers will do, for if they are well educated, they will see what is necessary, including the fact that "marriage, the having of wives, and the procreation of children must be governed as far as possible by the old proverb: friends possess everything in common" (423e6-424a2). It is not immediately clear about whether this governance should extend over the whole city or just the guardian classes. Still, when he is pressed to defend the communal arrangements (449c ff.), Socrates focuses on the guardian classes, and it seems most reasonable to suppose that the communism about families extends just as far as the communism about property does, on the grounds that only the best people can live as friends with such things in common (cf. Laws 739c-740b).
To what extent the communism of the ideal city is subject to criticism is a more complicated question. The critics either claim that communism is undesirable or impossible. The charge of impossibility essentially extends one of Plato's insight: while Plato believes that most people are incapable of living without private property and private families, the critics argue that all people are incapable of living without private property. This criticism fails if there is clear evidence of people who live communally. But the critic can fall back on the charge of undesirability. Here the critic needs to identify what value is lost by giving up on private property and private families, and the critic needs to show that this value is greater than the unity and extended family purported for the communal arrangements. It is not clear how this debate should go. Plato's position on this question is a stubbornly persistent ideal, despite the equally stubborn persistence of criticism.
The abolition of private families among the guardian classes is tied by Socrates to another radical proposal, namely, that in the ideal city the jobs of ruling and guarding should be open to women, and girls should be educated alongside boys for the purposes of training future rulers and guardians. The relation between these proposals is contestable. Is Socrates proposing the abolition of families in order to free up women to do the work of ruling? Or is Socrates putting the women to work since they will not have the job of family-caregiver anymore? But these questions need not be settled. Each of the proposals can be supported independently, and their dovetailing effects can be claimed as a happy convergence.
But the grounds for these proposals will matter significantly to a further question. Many readers have seen in Plato's Republic a rare exception in western philosophy's long history of sexist denigration of women, and some have even decided that Plato's willingness to open up the best education and the highest jobs to women shows a kind of feminism. Yet other readers have found this difficult to swallow. They point to Plato's indifference to the needs of actual women in his own city, to Socrates' frequent, disparaging remarks about women and "womanish" attitudes, and to the illiberal reasons Socrates offers for educating and empowering women.
The broad claim that Plato or the Republic is feminist cannot be sustained, and the label ‘feminist’ is an especially contested one, but still, there are two features of the Republic's ideal city that can be reasonably called feminist. First, Socrates suggests that the distinction between male and female is as relevant as the distinction between having long hair and having short hair for the purposes of deciding who should be active guardians: men and women, just like the long-haired and the short-haired, are by nature the same for the assignment of education and jobs (454b-456b). This suggestion seems to express the plausibly feminist point that one's sex is generally irrelevant to one's qualifications for education or employment.
The second plausibly feminist commitment in the Republic involves the abolition of private families. The feminist import of this may be obscured by the way in which Socrates and his interlocutors talk of "women and children shared in common." In fact, Socrates' companions might well have been forgiven if they had called to mind pictures of orgiastic free love in the guardians' camp, for that, after all, is how Aristophanes' Ecclesiazusae plays the proposal of "sharing women and children" for laughs. But as Socrates clarifies what he means, both free love and male possessiveness turn out to be beside the point. (The talk of "sharing women and children" reflects the male perspective of the men having the conversation but not the content of the proposal.) Then Socrates' proposal can seem especially striking. Plato is clearly aware that an account of how the polis should be arranged must give special attention to how families are arranged. Relatedly, he is clearly aware that an account of the ideal citizens must explain how sexual desire, a paradigmatic appetitive attitude, should fit into the good human life. Only very recently, with feminist interventions, have sexual desire and its consequences come to seem crucial to political and ethical theory, and we might think that Plato's awareness of these as topics of political philosophy shows at least proto-feminist concern. All the more might this awareness seem feminist when we relate it back to the first plausibly feminist commitment, for Plato wants the economy of desire and reproduction to be organized in such a way that women are free for education and employment alongside men, in the guardian classes, at any rate.
Three of the ways in which these attributions of plausibly feminist commitments might be undercut say more about the contest over the label ‘feminist’ than they do about Plato. First, some have said that feminism requires a concern for women's rights and have then argued that Plato is not a feminist on the grounds that Plato shows no interests in women's rights. This particular argument is not quite to the point, for it says nothing about Plato's view of women per se. He is not interested in women's rights just to the extent that he is not interested in anyone's rights. Second, some have said that feminism requires attention to what actual women want. Since Plato shows no interest in what actual women want, he would seem on this view of feminism to be anti-feminist. But the limitations of this criticism are apparent as soon as we realize that Plato shows no interest in what actual men want. Plato focuses instead on what women (and men) should want, what they would want if they were in the best possible psychological condition. Actual women (and actual men), as we might put it, are subject to false consciousness. Third, some have insisted that feminism requires attention to and concern for the particular interests and needs of women as distinct from the particular interests and needs of men. Since Plato does not admit of particular women's interests and needs, he would not, in this view, be a feminist (except insofar as he accidentally promoted any supposed particular interests by, say, proposing the abolition of the private family). Again, however, this objection turns on what we understand by ‘feminism’ more than on what Socrates is saying in the Republic. There should be no doubt that there are conceptions of feminism according to which the Republic is anti-feminist. What is worth interesting discussion is whether there are conceptions of feminism according to which the Republic is feminist.
Better ground for doubting Plato's apparent feminist commitments lies in the reasons that Socrates gives for them: Socrates consistently emphasizes concern for the welfare of the whole city, but not for the women themselves (esp. 456c ff.). But Socrates' emphasis in Book Five on the happiness of the city as a whole rather than the happiness of the rulers (and cf. 465e-466c) might have more to do with his worries about convincing his interlocutors that ideal rulers do not flourish by exploiting the ruled. Thus, his emphasis need not be taken to represent a lack of concern for the women's interests. And after all, what greater concern could Socrates show for the women than to insist that they be fully educated and allowed to hold the highest offices? Socrates goes on to argue that the philosopher-rulers of the city are as happy as can be, and this insistence must include not only the male rulers but also the female rulers.
The best reason for doubting Plato's feminism is provided by those disparaging remarks about women. We might try to distinguish between Plato's rather harsh view of the women around him and his more optimistic view of women as they would be in more favorable circumstances. It is also possible to distinguish between the traditional sexist tropes as they feature in Plato's drama and the rejection of sexism in Plato's ideas. But it is not clear that these distinctions will remove all of the tension, especially when Socrates and Glaucon are saying that men are stronger or better than women in just about every endeavor (455c).
Final judgment on this question is difficult. The disparaging remarks have to be taken one-by-one, as it is doubtful that all can be understood in exactly the same way. Moreover, it is of the utmost importance to determine whether each remark says something about the way all women are by nature or essentially. If Plato thinks that women are essentially worse than men, then Socrates' claim that men and women have the same nature for education and employment is puzzling. But if the disparagements do not express any considered views about the nature of women, then we might be able to conclude that Plato is deeply prejudiced against women and yet committed to some plausibly feminist principles.
Some of the most heated discussions of the politics of Plato's Republic have surrounded the charge of totalitarianism famously advanced by Karl Popper (in The Open Society and its Enemies). Like the other "isms" we have been considering, totalitarianism applies to the Republic only conditionally, depending on the definition of ‘totalitarianism’ offered.
First, we might define as totalitarian those regimes in which the political power is concentrated in one bloc, and the ruled have no alternative. On this definition, the ideal city of Plato's Republic is surely totalitarian. Socrates carefully argues that the ruled in his "Kallipolis" (as the ideal city is sometimes called) endorse the ruling party. When he argues that those without knowledge will concede that only the philosophers have knowledge (476d-480a), he is in effect demonstrating his confidence that the non-philosophers in Kallipolis will recognize the appropriateness of rule by philosophers. And if he is correct that in ideally ruled circumstances, even the producers who locate their good in the satisfaction of necessary appetitive attitudes will have optimally satisfied psychological attitudes, then he is justified in thinking that the ruled will find Kallipolis to be ideally ruled. So by showing concern for the consent of the governed, Socrates is painting a totalitarian state nicer than some, but he is still, by the first definition, painting a totalitarian state.
Second, we might define as totalitarian those regimes that exercise propagandistic control over the values and interests of the ruled. Again, by this definition, the ideal city of Plato's Republic will count as totalitarian. There is no doubt that the censored education in Kallipolis represent totalitarian concerns, as does Kallipolis' use of a "noble lie" to convince citizens' of their unequal standing and deep tie to the city (414b-415d). Before we assess this totalitarianism, however, we might want to evaluate its aims. Does the state or the ruling class have its own distinctive interests that are being served prior to and independent of the interests of the ruled? Or is the propaganda in the service of the interests of the ruled?
These questions bring us to the heart of the traditional dispute about totalitarianism in Plato's Republic. On one extreme view, Plato conceives of the city as a whole as an organic unity with its own interests, and he refuses to recognize the interests of individual citizens apart from that organic unity. The propaganda forces the citizens to serve the city. But this can hardly be right, as the Republic is supposed to provide a picture not just of a happy city but also of a happy individual person. Plato must have a conception of an individual's good that is independent of the city's good.
On the opposite extreme, Plato conceives of the city's good as nothing more than the aggregate good of all the citizens. On this view, citizens need to contribute to the city's happiness only because they need to contribute to the happiness of other citizens if they are to achieve their own maximal happiness. Propaganda is required only because the weakest citizens will not do what is in their interests on their own: the totalitarianism is paternalistic. Yet this view, too, seems at odds with much of what the Republic is trying to do. When Socrates says that the happiest city is a maximally unified city (462ab), or when he insists that all the citizens need to be bound together (519e-520a), he seems to be invoking a conception of the city's good that is not reducible to the aggregate good of the citizens.
So a mixed interpretation might seem to be called for. We can suppose that the good of the city and the good of the individual are independently specifiable, and that the citizens' own maximal good coincides with the maximal good of the city. Since Plato believes that this coincidence is realized only through propagandistic means in the ideal city, then the propaganda is paternalistically targeted at the citizens' own good but not exclusively at the citizens' own good. On this view, if the citizens do not see themselves as parts of the city serving the city, neither the city nor they will be maximally happy.
Critiques of the Republic's totalitarianism can proceed in three very different ways. First, we might reject the idea of an objectively knowable human good, and thus reject the idea that political power should be in the hands of those who know the human good. Here we might want to distinguish between Plato's picture of the human good and the very idea of an objective human good, for even if we want to dissent from Plato's view in some respect or another, we might still accept the very idea. At least, it does not seem implausible to suppose that some general psychological capacities are objectively good for their possessors (while others are objectively bad), and at that point, we can ask whether political power should be used to foster the good capacities and to restrain or prevent the bad ones. Given that state-sponsored education cannot but address the psychological capacities of the pupils, only very austere political systems could be supported by a thorough-going skepticism about the human good.
Second, we might accept the idea of an objectively knowable human good, but be wary of concentrating extensive political power in the hands of a few knowers. We might reject Plato's apparent optimism about the trustworthiness of philosopher-rulers and insist on greater checks upon political power, to minimize the risks of abuse. If this is our objection, then we might wonder what checks are optimal.
Finally, we might reject Plato's scheme on the grounds that political self-determination and free expression are themselves more valuable than what Kallipolis provides. This sort of response is perhaps the most interesting, but it is by no means easy. For it is difficult to assess the intrinsic value of self-determination and free expression, apart from skepticism about the knowledge or power of those limiting self-determining or free expression. Moreover, it is difficult to balance these values against the concerns that motivate Plato. Where does the power over massive cultural forces lie when it is not under political control? And to what extent can we live well when our culture is not shaped by people thoughtfully dedicated to living a good human life? These are not questions that can be easily shrugged off, even if we cannot embrace Kallipolis as their answer.
Thus far, we have concentrated on what Socrates says about the good city. But the Republic makes another contribution to political theory, in its remarks about defective political aims and regimes. This is perhaps most obvious in Books Eight and Nine, where Socrates discusses a variety of defective political constitutions: timocracy, oligarchy, democracy, and tyranny.
This discussion emphasizes a causal account of continuous degeneration: aristocracy degenerates into timocracy (545c ff.); timocracy degenerates into oligarchy (550c ff.); oligarchy into democracy (555b ff.); and democracy into tyranny (562a ff.). If this account is taken to be an actual history, as Aristotle appears to do (Politics V 12), then it will not impress. But the schematic nature of the causal account suggests that Plato is not interested in providing an actual history of political change but rather an analysis of the weakness of each sort of regime. To say that timocracy naturally devolves into oligarchy is just to highlight timocracy's failure to check the pursuit of wealth as a badge of honor. Socrates is suggesting that just as a person who is dominated by spirited attitudes and not in properly educated from without is vulnerable to growing appetitive attitudes, so too, the city dominated by spirited persons is vulnerable to material greed. In this way, the causal story about the defective regimes is inextricably bound to a corresponding account of psychological decline that Socrates is also developing through Books Eight and Nine. We are in effect getting the flip-side of Books Two through Seven. The earlier books show the slow development of the perfectly just and flourishing city and person, and Books Eight and Nine show the slow development of the perfectly unjust and miserable city and person. Books Two through Seven can give the illusion of providing a political history, from primitive society ("the first city") to an ideal society ("Kallipolis"), but in fact, there are no real developmental claims, apart from the ideal education of the philosopher-ruler-to-be in the ideal city. Similarly, Books Eight and Nine give the illusion of providing a political history, but we should see the account as a theory of political psychology.
As such, all of the difficult questions about the city-person analogy return with a vengeance in Books Eight and Nine. Is the account of political change dependent upon the account of psychological change, or vice versa? Or if this is a case of mutual interdependence, exactly what accounts for the various dependencies? It seems difficult to give just one answer to these questions that will explain all of the claims in these books, and the full, complex theory that must underlie all of the claims is by no means clear.
But the details of Books Eight and Nine are not merely in the service of a more complicated political psychology. They also undoubtedly contribute commentaries on existing political institutions and regimes. The discussion of timocracy is surely relevant to Sparta, and the discussion of democracy is surely relevant to Athens (see 563d). Any serious attempt to connect Plato's writings with his attitudes towards and engagement with existing politics must make heavy use of Republic Eight and Nine. But this connection is difficult to establish. One needs to find criticisms that apply directly to existing institutions among criticisms that are driven by the psychological theorizing of the Republic and that are aimed at convincing Glaucon and Adeimantus to take up a philosophical life. Failure to draw this distinction is problematic, for what one will say about the problems of democracy, relative to an ideal world when one is trying to convince people that an egalitarian indulgence of one's appetitive attitudes is not a recipe for a good human life, is not necessarily what one will say about the problems of democracy, relative to the real world when one is wondering how to improve existing institutions.
Moreover, one who wants to connect Plato's writings with his attitudes towards and engagement with existing politics should not limit himself to Books Eight and Nine. Socrates' conversation with Thrasymachus, for example, turns on the central political problem of greed (pleonexia), and the principle of specialization that is fundamental to Kallipolis straightforwardly opposes the Athenian democracy. The Republic is rich in its connections to its time and place, and not just a remarkably long-lived contribution to ethical and political theory.
In the Anglophone world, the standard edition of the Greek text is in
The full Greek text also appears with an excellent commentary in the edition of
Among the English translations the following three deserve especially high regard (in chronological order):
Here, in chronological order, are some helpful general discussions of the Republic:
There are also valuable collections of recent essays on the Republic:
The following monographs, in alphabetical order, treat multiple features of the ethics and politics of Plato's Republic:
The following are especially helpful for placing the ethics and politics of Plato's Republic in their context:
In addition to the monographs mentioned above, there is a huge number of scholarly essays and books that discuss more particular features of the ethics and politics in the Republic. I here list just a few that develop views featured in this article. The essays are organized (a bit imperfectly) under the headings used in the present article, and each cluster is listed in chronological order.
A | B | C | D | E | F | G | H | I | J | K | L | M | N | O | P | Q | R | S | T | U | V | W | X | Y | Z