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In contrast to the meaning the word ‘sophism’ had in
ancient philosophy, ‘sophisma’ in medieval
philosophy is a technical term with no pejorative connotation: a
sophisma is an ambiguous, puzzling or simply difficult
sentence that has to be solved. As an important element of scholarly
training in universities, closely related to different kinds of
disputations, the sophismata not only served to illustrate a
theory but, from a more theoretical point of view, were also used to
test the limits of a theory. The so-called
sophismata-literature assumed more and more importance during
the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries, and it is not an exaggeration
to claim that many important developments in philosophy (mainly in
logic and natural philosophy) appeared in texts of this kind, where
masters could feel free to investigate problems and develop their own
views, much more than they could in more academic and strictly codified
Although some medieval theologians -- and Humanists even more, of
course, like Vivès or Rabelais -- used the words
‘sophism’ or ‘sophist’ as a derogatory
designation for quibbling philosophers, ‘sophisma’
in medieval philosophical literature has a very precise and technical
signification. Hence, to avoid any confusion with fallacies and
badly-constructed arguments, we shall here use the original term
‘sophisma’ rather than the word
‘sophism’ that even nowadays still has a pejorative
There are several important characteristics of sophismata.
First of all, a sophisma is a sentence rather than an
argument. In particular, a sophisma is a sentence that either:
Here are some some examples of kind (1), sentences that are odd or have
- is odd or has odd consequences,
- is ambiguous, and can be true or false according to the
interpretation we give it, or
- has nothing special about it in itself, but becomes
puzzling when it occurs in a definite context (or "case,"
This donkey is your father.
As examples of kind (2), ambiguous sentences that can be true
or false according to the interpretation given to to them, consider:
A chimaera is a chimaera.
All the apostles are twelve.
As an example of kind (3), sentences that have nothing special about
them in themselves, but that become puzzling when they occur in a
definite context ("case," casus), consider:
The infinite are finite.
Every man is of necessity an animal.
The sentence ‘Socrates says something false’,
in the case where Socrates says nothing other than ‘Socrates says
(This is paradoxical, and is one of the forms the Liar paradox can
2.2 The Aim of the Discussion
Once the odd, ambiguous or puzzling sophisma-sentence is set
out, one should try to understand what it means, what implications it
has, and how it fits into or contradicts a particular theory under
consideration. This is called "solving the sophisma," and is
the aim of the entire discussion. The way solutions are searched for
and established is very similar to the highly formalized scholastic
method for determining a "question":
- First, one has to examine the arguments pro and
- Second, one has to present his own solution to the problem.
(Sometimes this part of the discussion is preceded by certain
theoretical remarks or clarifications that make the terminology more
- Third, one has to refute the arguments supporting the opposite
Let us take a very simple example, from Albert of Saxony,
Sophismata, sophisma xi. The sophisma is:
Omnes homines sunt asini vel homines et asini sunt
In accordance with step (1), here are the pro and
(All men are donkeys or men and donkeys are donkeys.)
Proof: The sophisma is a copulative sentence (in
modern logical terminology, a conjunction) each part of which is true;
therefore the sophisma is true, since its analysis becomes:
[All men are donkeys or men] and [donkeys are donkeys].
This is a sophisma of the second kind above, one that rests on
an ambiguity and can be read with a true interpretation or with a false
interpretation. Many such sophismata, although not this one,
resist being translated from Latin into another language without losing
the ambiguity. For example, the sentence ‘aliquem asinum omnis
homo videt’ can be translated by ‘Every man sees a
donkey’ as well as by ‘There is a donkey that every man
sees’. Similarly, in solving sophismata, sometimes Latin
word-order is used as an arbitrary code for interpreting the sentence.
For example, according to William Heytesbury, when the word
‘infinite’ is placed at the beginning of a sentence and
belongs to the subject, it has to be interpreted as a syncategorematic
term; in any other case, it is usually interpreted as a categorematic
term (Heytesbury, Sophismata, sophisma xviii,
fol.130va). Such word-order codes might seem like reasonable
regimentations of language to a Latin-speaker, but in translation they
often seem quite implausible and forced. No such problems arise with
this example. (For clarity, square brackets have been inserted into the
proof and disproof above, in order to indicate the ambiguity of the
Disproof: The sophisma is a disjunctive sentence each part
of which is false; therefore the sophisma is false, since its
analysis becomes: [All men are donkeys] or [men and donkeys are
In accordance with step (2) above, Albert of Saxony, who discusses
this sophisma, solves it by just saying that it is either true
or false depending on which interpretation we choose. He then takes the
opportunity to review the basic principles governing the truth-value of
copulative and disjunctive sentences.
In accordance with step (3), we would normally be required to refute
the opposite answer. In this case, however, there is nothing to refute,
since Albert's solution accepts both the pro and the
contra arguments (for different readings of the
In general, a sophisma was a good occasion to discuss all
the problems related to a specific issue. For example, the
sophisma ‘Album fuit disputaturum’
(‘The white [thing] was going to be disputed’) in
thirteenth-century Parisian literature was the occasion to discuss all
the problems related to the theory of reference in tensed contexts, as
well as to refute the positions others held on this very controversial
subject. This is why Pinborg 1977 (p. xv) says that at Paris in the
thirteenth century "the sophismata seems -- within the faculty
of arts -- to play a role analoguous to the Quaestiones
quodlibetales [quodlibetal questions] in the faculty of theology."
Note that this use is quite common. (Note also that Pinborg here uses
the word ‘sophismata’ to signify not only
sophisma-sentences but the whole literature that discussed
them as well.)
Syncategorematic Terms, Exponible Sentences
It is important to recognize that many sophismata involve
syncategorematic terms that are responsible for their odd, ambiguous or
puzzling character. The preceding sophisma can be considered
quite characteristic of the genre insofar as we see that the
syncategorematic terms ‘or’ and ‘and’ occur in
it and are responsible for the ambiguity of the sentence.
The expression ‘syncategorematic term’ should be taken
in a broad sense here, so that it not only includes classical
syncategorematic terms like ‘and’, ‘if’,
‘every’, etc., but also categorematic terms like
‘infinite’ or ‘whole’ that can be used both
categorematically and syncategorematically. Thus the sentence
"Infinita sunt finita" ("The infinite are finite" -- here,
incidentally is another good example of a sophisma that cannot
be translated into English without disambiguating it) is false if
‘infinite’ is used categorematically, for in that case its
signification is "Things that are infinite are finite." But it is true
if ‘infinite’ is used syncategorematically, for in that
case its signification is "Finite things are infinite in number" or
"There are infinitely many finite things." (See Heytesbury,
Sophismata, sophisma xviii, fol.130va.)
Many sophismata too are what medieval logicians called
"exponible sentences", sentences that seem to be simple but actually
imply several other sentences into which they can be decomposed. For
example, the sentence "A differs from B" was said to be
equivalent to "A exists and B exists and A is not
B"; the sentence "A ceases to be white" was said to be
equivalent either to "Now A is white and immediately after this
A will not be white" or to "Now A is not white and
immediately before this A was white", depending on the
2.3 The Main Fields in Which Sophismata Are Discussed
Just as the scholastic method can be applied to any subject, the use of
sophismata is to be found in logic, grammar and physics as
well as in theology. Let us concentrate here on the first three.
As seen above, logical sophismata are closely linked to the
discussions of syncategoremata. The aim is either to determine the
truth-value of a sentence (including sentences involving
self-reference) or to discuss subjects such as:
We could compare these discussions to contemporary discussions of
sentences like "The morning star is the evening star."
- The syntactic and semantic properties of terms (including the
difference between meaning and reference) in sentences like "Every man
sees every man," "You are a donkey," and "I promise you a horse."
- Quantification and existential import, as in the sentence "Every
- The theory of negation and "infinite" words, as in the sentence
"Nothing and a chimaera are brothers."
- The problem of universals, as in "Man is a species."
- The composite and divided senses of a sentence and the scope of
modal operators, as in "The white can be black," "Every man is of
necessity an animal," etc.
The aim here is to discuss physical concepts (motion, change, velocity,
intension and remission of forms, maxima and minima, etc.). But, as
seen above with the sophisma "The infinite are finite,"
physical problems are treated as logical and conceptual problems. This
logico-semantical approach to physical problems is quite characteristic
of medieval physics and should be kept in mind when we wonder the
extent to which medieval physics can be considered a precursor to
With respect to so-called physical sophismata, special
attention should to be paid to certain fourteenth century English
authors known as the "Oxford Calculators," authors like Richard
Kilvington, William Heytesbury, Thomas Bradwardine, Richard and Roger
Swineshead. These people developed a peculiarly "English-style" of
sophismata. Based on the theological dogma of the absolute
power of God, the distinction between what is physically possible and
what is logically possible (where non-contradiction is the only limit)
allowed these authors to make use of imaginary thought experiments. For
example, "Suppose that A is a distance to be traversed which
Socrates cannot traverse, and that his power is increased until
Socrates can traverse distance A completely, and that Socrates'
power is not increased further." Is the sophisma "Socrates
will begin to be able to traverse distance A" true or false?
(Richard Kilvington, Sophismata, sophisma 27, in
Kretzmann 1990, p.60.) Thought experiments like these led these authors
to, among other things, a theorem for uniformly accelerated motion
(Thomas Bradwardine's "Mean Speeed Theorem").
Sophismata like "Love is a verb," "O Master," "It rueth me" or
"I run" gave rise to very sharp discussions of grammatical categories
and theories. For example, does a change of word order change the
meaning of a proposition? Can a participle be a subject? How should we
interpret interjections? Can ‘est’ ("is") be used
The first and most evident role of sophismata is pedagogical.
In theoretical treatises, sophismata can play various roles.
They can be used to explain a given statement or rule, illustrate a
distinction or an ambiguity, show what would follow if a rule were
violated, or test the limits of a theory.
In addition, although some differences can be identified between the
Paris and the Oxford traditions, sophismata are important as
oral exercises (disputations) in a student's training in philosophy,
especially in the first years of universitary education in the Faculty
of Arts. Nevertheless, it is clear that, while Heytesbury's Rules
for Solving Sophismata is written for undergraduate students -- at
Oxford ‘sophista’ was the official name given to
students who had disputed "on sophismata" ("de
sophismatibus") for about two years -- this is probably not the
case for his Sophismata, the discussions in which are much
I think it is no exaggeration to say that sophismata in the
Faculty of Arts were as important as Biblical exegesis in the Faculty
If we look at the evolution of literary genres, we note that the
twelfth- and early-thirteenth century
syncategoremata-literature came to be absorbed in the
sophisma-literature. In thirteenth and fourteenth century
philosophical literature, sophismata can appear within many
kinds of treatises. There are collections of sophismata named
simply Sophismata or On Sophismata, but
sophismata are also important in works -- often by the same
authors, or by different authors coming from the same milieu as the
former collections -- with titles like Abstractions,
Distinctions, On Exponibles, On
Consequences, Sophistry, etc.
Even if there are technical distinctions among these types of
tracts, all of them play the same roles mentioned just above -- in
short: to acquire logical abilities that can be applied to any
The medieval sophismata-literature is a vast and complex
subject of research. Many questions are still unsolved, especially
about its historical origins and development. It is of central interest
for people interested in medieval logic, grammar and physics, but also
for those interested in the history of universities.
The study of "sophismatic works" began around 1940 with Grabmann's
Die Sophismatalitteratur des 12. und 13. Jahrhunderts, and
much work has been done in the last two decades. But there are still a
lot of texts to read, edit and analyze.
The bibliography is organized as follows:
Most of the logical and grammatical texts on sophismata have
been edited by S. Ebbesen and his collaborators in the review
Cahiers de l'Institut du Moyen Age Grec et Latin,
University of Copenhagen. We will here mention only
- de Libera, A. César et le Phénix. Distinctiones
et sophismata parisiens du XIIIe siècle. Centro di cultura
medievale, 4; Pisa: Scuola Normale Superiore, 1991.
- De Rijk, L. M. Some Earlier Parisian Tracts on Distinctiones
sophismatum. Nijmegen: Ingenium Publishers, 1988.
- Scott, T. K. Johannes Buridanus. ‘Sophismata’.
Critical Edition with an Introduction. Grammatica Speculativa, 1;
Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog, 1977.
- Pironet, Fabienne. Iohanni Buridani Summularum Tractatus nonus:
De practica sophismatum (Sophismata). Critical Edition and
Introduction. Nijmegen: Ingenium Publishers, forthcoming.
- Kretzmann, N., and Kretzmann, B. E. The
‘Sophismata’ of Richard Kilvington. Oxford: University
Press for The British Academy, 1990. (Critical edition.)
- Pinborg, J. Sigerus de Cortraco, ‘Summa modorum
significandi sophismata’; New Edition, on the Basis of G.
Wallerand's editio prima, with Additions, Critical Notes, an Index of
Terms and an Introduction. Amsterdam: J. Benjamins, 1977.
- Longeway, J. William Heytesbury: On Maxima and Minima. Chapter
5 of ‘Rules for Solving Sophismata’, with an Anonymous
Fourteenth Century Discussion, a Translation with an Introduction and
Study. Synthese Historical Library, 26; Dordrecht: Reidel,
- Pironet, Fabienne, Guillaume Heytesbury, Sophismata asinina.
Une introduction aux disputes médiévales.
Présentation, édition critique et analyse.
Collection Sic et Non; Paris: Vrin, 1994. (With texts from the
Libelli sophistarum ad usum Oxoniensis.)
Many important studies are to be found in the following collective
work: Read, S., (ed.) Sophisms in Medieval Logic and Grammar. Acts
of the Ninth European Symposium for Medieval Logic and Semantics, St.
Andrews, June 1990. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1993.
- Scott, T. K. Sophisms on Meaning and Truth. New York:
Appleton Century Crofts, 1966. (Translation of John Buridan's
- Biard, J. Jean Buridan, Sophismes. Collection Sic et Non;
Paris: Vrin, 1993.
- Hughes, G. E. John Buridan on Self-Reference. Chapter Eight of
Buridan's ‘Sophismata’. An Edition and a Translation with
an Introduction and a Philosophical Commentary. Cambridge:
Cambridge University Press, 1982. (The paperbound edition omits the
- Kretzmann, N., and Kretzmann, B.E. The ‘Sophismata’
of Richard Kilvington. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press,
1990. (English translation, historical introduction and philosophical
Buridan, John [Jean] |
Burley [Burleigh], Walter |
Heytesbury, William |
insolubles [= insolubilia] |
Kilvington, Richard |
Richard the Sophister [Ricardus Sophista, Magister abstractionum] |
terms, properties of: medieval theories of
- Biard, J. "Les sophismes du savoir: Albert de Saxe entre Jean
Buridan et Guillaume Heytesbury." Vivarium 27 (1989),
- Biard, J. "Verbes cognitifs et appellation de la forme selon Albert
de Saxe." In S. Knuuttila, R. Työrinoja, and S. Ebbesen, ed.
Knowledge and the Sciences in Medieval Philosophy. Proceedings of
the Eighth International Congress of Medieval Philosophy (S.I.E.P.M.).
Helsinki, 24-29 August 1987. Helsinki: Yliopistopaino, 1990,
- Ebbesen, S. "The Dead Man is Alive." Synthese 40 (1979),
- Grabmann, M. Die Sophismatenliteratur des 12. und 13.
Jahrhunderts mit Textausgabe eines Sophisma des Boetius von
Dacien. Beiträge zur Geschichte der Philosophie une
Theologie des Mittelalters. Texte und Untersuchungen. Band 36,
Heft 1; Münster i. W.: Aschendorff, 1940.
- Knuuttila, S. and Lehtinen, A. I. "Plato in infinitum remisse
incipit esse albus. New Texts on the Late Medieval Discussion on the
Concept of Infinity in Sophismata Literature." In E. Saarinen, R.
Hilpinen, I. Niiniluoto, M. P. Hintikka, ed. Essays in Honour of J.
Hintikka. Synthese Library, 124; Dordrecht: D. Reidel Pub. Co.,
- Kretzmann, N. "Syncategoremata, exponibilia, sophismata." In N.
Kretzmann, et al, ed. The Cambridge History of Later
Medieval Philosophy from the Rediscovery of Aristotle to the
Disintegration of Scholasticism, 1100-1600. Cambridge: Cambridge
University Press, 1982, 211-45.
- Kretzmann, N. "Continuity, Contrariety, Contradiction and Change."
In N. Kretzmann, ed. Infinity and Continuity in Ancient and
Medieval Thought. Papers Presented at a Conference held at Cornell
University on April 20 and 21 1979, under the Title ‘Infinity,
Continuity and Indivisibility in Antiquity and the Middle
Ages’. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1982, 322-40. (With
an appendix: "Text of Walter Burleigh and the Sophisms 8 and 16 of
- Kretzmann, N. "Tu scis hoc esse omne quod est hoc: Richard
Kilvington and the Logic of Knowledge." In N. Kretzmann, ed.
Meaning and Inference in Medieval Philosophy. Studies in Memory of
Jan Pinborg. Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1988, 225-45.
- de Libera, A. "La littérature des Sophismata dans
la tradition terministe parisienne de la seconde moitié du XIIIe
s." In M. Asztalos, ed. The Editing of Theological and
Philosophical Texts from the Middle Ages. Acts of the Conference
Arranged by the Department of Classical Languages, University of
Stockholm, 29-31 August 1984. Acta universitatis Stockholmiensis.
Studia Latina Stockholmiensia, 30; Stockholm: Almqvist and Wiksell
International, 1986, 213-44.
- de Libera, A. "La littérature des Abstractiones et
la tradition logique d'Oxford." In P. O. Lewry, ed. The Rise of
British Logic. Acts of the Sixth European Symposium on Medieval Logic
and Semantics. Balliol College, Oxford, 19-24 June 1983. Papers in
Mediaeval Studies, 7; Toronto, Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval
Studies, 1983, 63-114.
- de Libera, A. "La problématique de l’ ’instant du
changement’ au XIIIe siècle: contribution à
l'histoire des sophismata physicalia." In S. Carloti, ed.
Studies in Medieval Natural Philosophy. Florence: Leo S.
Olschki, 1989, 43-93.
- Murdoch, J. E. "Mathematics and Sophisms in Late Medieval Natural
Philosophy." In Les genres littéraires dans les sources
théologiques et philosophiques médiévales. Actes
du colloque international de Louvain-la-Neuve, 25-27 mai 1981.
Université Catholique de Louvain, Publications de l'Institut
Supérieur d'Etudes Médiévales. Deuxième
Série: Textes, Etudes, Congrès, 5; Louvain-la-Neuve:
Institut d'Etudes Médiévales de L'Université
Catholique de Louvain, 1982, 85-100.
- Murdoch, J. E. "Infinity and Continuity." In N. Kretzmann, et
al., ed. The Cambridge History of Later Medieval Philosophy
from the Rediscovery of Aristotle to the Disintegration of
Scholasticism, 1100-1600. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press,
- Rosier, I. and Roy, B. "Grammaire et liturgie dans les sophismes du
XIIIe siècle." Vivarium 28 (1990), 118-35.
- Rosier, I. "Les sophismes grammaticaux au XIIIe s."
Medioevo 17 (1991), 175-230.
- Sylla, E. D. "William Heytesbury on the Sophism infinita sunt
finita." In Sprache und Erkenntnis im Mittelalter. Akten des 6.
Internationalen Kongresses für mittelalterliche Philosophie der
Société Internationale pour l’étude de la
philosophie médiévale, 29. August-3. September 1977 im
Bonn. Miscellanea Mediaevalia, 13.1-2; Berlin: W. de Gruyter,
1981, Vol.II, 628-36.
Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy