Desiderius Erasmus of Rotterdam (1467?-1534) was the most famous and influential humanist of the Northern Renaissance, a man of great talent and industriousness who rose from obscure beginnings to become the leading intellectual figure of the early sixteenth century, courted by rulers and prelates who wanted to enhance their own reputations by association with the greatest scholar of the age. He was his generation's finest Latin stylist, in a society that revered good Latin, even more impressive for his much rarer mastery of Greek that no contemporary could equal. He was a phenomenally productive writer (the most complete edition of his collected works fills ten large folio volumes) and was the first European intellectual to exploit fully the power of the printed word, making the true center of his career not a university or the court of a secular prince or high prelate but the greatest publishing houses of the Netherlands, Paris, Venice, and—above all—Basel. Though most vividly remembered now for his critical satires of abuses in the church and secular society and for his work as editor of the first published edition of the Greek New Testament, he was a prolific and influential author in many genres. He was a leading writer on education, author of five influential treatises on humanist educational theory and even a greater number of widely used and often reprinted textbooks taught in humanistic schools throughout Europe, especially north of the Alps; the producer of excellent critical editions of the works of classical Greek and Latin authors, including translations of Greek texts into the Latin that all educated people of his time could read; and the editor and translator of the works of early Latin and Greek Church Fathers, especially important for translations of Greek patristic literature, which had been little known to the Western church during the Middle Ages; the author of books of spiritual counsel addressed mainly to educated laymen of his time, all written in Latin but several of them quickly translated by other hands into most of the European vernacular languages and frequently reprinted; he even wrote and published Latin poems on both secular and religious themes, the one genre in which he had no lasting influence. The guides to theological method and exegesis of the Bible that he wrote as prefaces to the 1516 and 1518 editions of the New Testament mark a major turn in theology and the interpretation of Scripture and posed a serious challenge to the scholastic theology that had dominated university faculties of theology since the thirteenth century. He was also an active letter-writer, corresponding with contemporaries high and low, famous and obscure, and carefully preserving his letters and publishing some of them since like his Roman models, he regarded the letter as an important literary genre. The one genre in which Erasmus wrote no works at all was philosophy, though he often cited ancient philosophers and dealt (normally in a non-philosophical way) with several intellectual problems of interest to philosophers.
- 1. Introduction
- 2. Life and Works
- 3. The Ancient Philosophers
- 4. Politics and Pacifism
- 5. Human Nature
- 6. Free Will: The Conflict with Luther
- 7. Rhetoric and Skepticism
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
More than any other person, Erasmus through his publications and letters created the intellectual and spiritual milieu into which the Protestant Reformation was born; and more than anyone except Martin Luther, he shaped the early development of that great religious upheaval even though he never joined it. During its early years up to about 1522, he did much, mostly quietly and through private conferences and correspondence, to ensure that Luther was not abruptly silenced and put to death, even though he never fully approved of Luther's ideas and actions and eventually in 1524 broke publicly with him and published an important challenge to his most important doctrine. Though since his early days he had agitated for reform of the church, he always insisted that that reformed church must be one and must be reformed peacefully and gradually from within rather than having reform thrust in from outside the traditional institutional structures. Erasmus was subjected to bitter, scurrilous attacks by traditionalist Catholics who did not take his criticism of Luther seriously and who accused him of opening the way to Luther's heresies; in the earliest period, some of these even publicly suspected that he was the real author of Luther's books. He faced almost equally vehement attacks by zealous Protestants who accused him of cowardice and refusal to endorse openly beliefs that he actually held and had taught to them. Yet Erasmus retained admirers on both sides of the growing religious divide, especially those who (like him) labored to find a compromise that would restore Christian unity and make the church, led by a new generation of educated clergy dedicated to serving the needs of the people rather than to the accumulation of power, wealth, and personal prestige, and more mindful of its educational and pastoral obligations to the faithful.
After his death in 1536 and the triumph of conservative leaders over moderates in the leadership of the Roman Catholic Church, Erasmus' reputation in Catholic Europe declined precipitately. In tightly disciplined countries like Spain, where his works had been frequently translated and widely admired in the 1520s, it soon became dangerous to own or cite his books. The reactionary Pope Paul IV in 1559 placed all of Erasmus' works, without exception, on the papal index of forbidden books; the more durable Tridentine index of 1564 was somewhat more moderate: six of his books, especially those sharply critical of the church, such as the satirical Praise of Folly, were wholly prohibited; the rest were placed on the index expurgatorius, potentially acceptable, but only if new, carefully censored editions were published, omitting objectionable materials.
The posthumous reputation of Erasmus in Protestant Europe was mixed. Although Luther and some of his more dogmatic followers remained true to Luther's savage reply to Erasmus' book on free will, dismissing him as an atheist, a hypocrite, a snake, lacking any religious faith, Luther's closest associate, Philipp Melanchthon, a learned humanist scholar and a moderate, maintained a civil and even friendly correspondence with Erasmus and after Erasmus' death warmly praised him for his scholarly contribution to the religious renewal brought about by the Reformation. In the later internal divisions within Lutheranism, moderate supporters of Melanchthon continued to regard Erasmus positively while regretting a lack of courage that prevented him from following his own principles to their logical conclusion, a position that eventually prevailed among most Protestants; but the dominant Lutheran faction of the late sixteenth century rejected Erasmus just as Luther had. The Church of England from the last years of Henry VIII's reign through the reign of Edward VI not only praised Erasmus but actively promoted translation and publication of his anticlerical satires and his Paraphrases of the New Testament.
In the late sixteenth and early seventeenth centuries, moderates on both sides of the religious divide retained a generally positive opinion of him, especially those who were not quite orthodox, such as the Arminians within Dutch and French Calvinism and the Jansenists among French Catholics. Erasmus' scholarly works were still used and admired, and his book of spiritual counsel for laymen, the Enchiridion, remained popular, especially in vernacular translations. The reaction against strict orthodoxy of all kinds that arose among the educated classes in the later seventeenth century and grew throughout the eighteenth century led to renewed interest in Erasmus. It was no accident that the great Leiden folio edition of his collected works was edited by a French Huguenot who was not Calvinistic enough to live in Geneva but still willing to go into exile after the revocation of the Edict of Nantes (1685) ended legal toleration for French Protestants. Enlightenment thinkers remembered Erasmus (not quite accurately) as a precursor of modern intellectual freedom and a foe of both Protestant and Catholic dogmatism. In the nineteenth and early twentieth centuries, Erasmus had a mixed reputation: among strict Catholics, as a rash author who endangered true religion; among secular people or Protestant liberals, as a precursor of the Reformation whose major flaw was lack of sufficient courage to follow his own deepest convictions by rejecting Catholicism. During the spiritual reorientation of Catholicism associated with Vatican Council II, however, there was a revival of sympathy for his stubborn criticism of abuses in the church while refusing to break away and insisting that the church must remain united, and for his insistence that the consensus of faithful Christians through the centuries deserved respect even on issues that reason or specific biblical texts did not settle. Much of the best Erasmian scholarship of the later twentieth century was the work of Catholic scholars who drew inspiration from Vatican Council II and the reform program associated with Pope John XXIII (Mansfield 2003:131–134, 223–225).
Erasmus was a native of the Netherlands, born at Rotterdam in the county of Holland on 27 October of some year in the late 1460s; 1467 now seems to be the year that most biographers prefer. Erasmus' own statements on the year of his birth are contradictory, perhaps because he did not know for certain but probably because later in life he wanted to emphasize the excessively early age at which his guardians pushed him and his elder brother Pieter to enter monastic life, in order to support his efforts to be released from his monastic vows. If the year of his birth remains unclear, the circumstances are not. He was born out of wedlock, the second son of, a priest named Roger who spent several years in Italy, learned Greek and humanistic Latin, and supported himself there as a copyist or scribe before returning to parish life in or near Rotterdam, and Margaret, the daughter of a physician and perhaps a widow. The existence of two sons suggests that the relationship between Roger and Margaret was not casual but an example of the concubinage that was common among the clergy in many parts of medieval Europe. The two sons were not neglected but received the attention of both parents. Their early education was at Gouda, a town near Rotterdam. When Erasmus was nine years old and Peter probably twelve, their father sent them to one of the largest and best Latin grammar schools in the Netherlands, located at Deventer and owned by the chapter clergy of St. Lebwin's church. Contrary to many older biographies, this school was not “a school of the Brethren of the Common Life.” The Brethren, a semi-monastic society of laymen, did have a community in Deventer and operated a youth hostel for boys from other towns who came to study there but did not control the school. The two boys did not live at the hostel. Their mother moved to Deventer to provide a home for her sons. Erasmus probably attended St. Lebwin's from 1475 to 1484. Although in later years he made light of the school as an institution still stuck in the “barbarism” of the Middle Ages, it was an excellent school for that period, and Erasmus probably laid the foundations of his fine Latin style there. Toward the end of Erasmus' study there, a teacher who had considerable interest in the new humanistic studies flourishing in Italy, Alexander Hegius, became headmaster. Erasmus never had Hegius as a teacher, since the headmaster taught only the boys in the most advanced form; but he must have heard him lecture to the entire school on feast days, and he vividly remembered a lecture given by Hegius' friend Rudolf Agricola, the first significant humanist active in the Netherlands, who had spent many years studying in Italy. Despite his habitual belittling of St. Lebwin's school, Erasmus himself in an autobiographical letter of 1524 acknowledged the role of Hegius and his ablest Latin teacher, Johannes Synthen, in introducing “something of a higher standard as literature” into the school (CWE 4:405).
In addition to imparting a love of humanistic studies, St. Lebwin's school may have been one source of Erasmus' lifelong conviction that religion must be experienced inwardly rather than in formal ceremonies and must be expressed in daily living rather than in dogmas and liturgies. The older literature on Erasmus often attributed this religious spirit to his education in “the schools of the Brethren of the Common Life,” but recent scholarship has demonstrated that at this period, the Brethren were not very deeply committed to education or interested in classical antiquity or any other intellectual matters (Post 1968:576–579). Johannes Synthen, Erasmus' grammar-teacher at Deventer, was one of the Brethren, but in the chapter-school he was employed as a teacher, just as other Brethren supported themselves in the town by labor in manual trades. Erasmus' non-dogmatic and anti-ceremonial religiosity probably is a product of the Dutch spiritual milieu of his boyhood, but there is little in that religiosity that suggests a close relation to the Brethren. The most famous book to come out of that movement, The Imitation of Christ, is often interpreted as a source of Erasmus' earliest spiritual publication, the Enchiridion, but in fact the books are very different. The Imitation is clearly directed toward persons called to the contemplative life, monks and nuns and semi-monastic groups like the Brethren. It devalues material goals and is profoundly anti-intellectual, as were the Brethren. Erasmus' Enchiridion, on the contrary, was directed toward the spiritual life of ordinary laymen pursuing secular careers in the secular world who needed spiritual guidance (Tracy 1972:65).
Erasmus' studies at Deventer ended abruptly when plague struck the city about 1483. His mother died of the infection, and apparently their father called his sons back to Gouda. Their father soon fell victim to the same plague, leaving his two sons and a small inheritance in the hands of three guardians. Erasmus later depicted these guardians as unfeeling men who merely wanted to get the boys off their hands by pushing them into a monastery. Erasmus at age 14 to 16 (a quite normal age to begin university study) wanted to go to a university, but instead was sent with his brother to a grammar school at 's Hertogenbosch that really was conducted by the Brethren of the Common Life. The highest level of study there did not go up to the level the brothers had already completed at Deventer. Erasmus regarded this period as a total waste. Eventually the guardians decided that since the two boys had only a small inheritance and, being born out of wedlock, were not eligible for an ordinary career as secular priests or for membership in many professions, entry into a monastery was their only realistic option. Erasmus bitterly resented the pressure to become a monk, feeling too young to resist but having no real calling to the monastic life. Eventually Pieter, the elder, gave in. The younger brother, now isolated, also agreed, entering Augustinian Canons Regular at Steyn near Gouda. He began his novitiate about 1487, when he might have been 16 but may have been nearly 20. At the end of the novitiate, he took his final vows and thus was bound to the Steyn monastery for life.
Although Erasmus later claimed that he found monastic life almost unbearable, he actually found some compensating advantages. He was no longer an isolated orphan but a member of a supportive community. Unlike the intellectually drab environment of the mediocre school at 's Hertogenbosch, the monastery at Steyn included at least some members who shared his interest in classical literature and encouraged his intellectual longings. His first prose work of any length, De contemptu mundi (On Contempt of the World), was written in the monastery and presented a generally favorable picture of monastic life, though the first edition, not published until 1521, contained later additions that warned strongly against encouraging boys to enter a monastery at an excessively early age. Monastic life limited his freedom to determine his own activities, but he did have opportunities for study. His negative feelings about his life in a community where most of his fellows had no interest in his literary aspirations inspired another book, Antibarbarorum liber (Book Against the Barbarians), originally written as a letter to a scholarly friend in another monastery about 1489, then transformed into a dialogue about 1494, and after much further revision, finally published in 1520. Even in its earliest version, this work suggests that Erasmus felt cramped by his surroundings. Nevertheless, in 1492, he agreed to be ordained as a priest.
By the time of his ordination, Erasmus seems to have been eager to leave the monastery. Ordination may have beens part of his strategy to get out in spite of the permanent obligation imposed by his vows. He already was identified as an intelligent and widely read monk with an outstanding Latin style. Sometime after his ordination, probably in 1493, Erasmus left the monastery on temporary assignment to serve as secretary to Henry of Bergen, bishop of Cambrai. Officially, this assignment was temporary. But as his life worked out, he never went back, not even when, many years later, the prior wrote a letter ordering him to return. He carefully arranged for his departure to be legally authorized: by his own prior at Steyn, by the general of his order, and by the bishop who ordained him. His new master, who had family ties to the aristocracy, was ambitious and closely linked to the holders of political and ecclesiastical power. He anticipated an early call to Rome to become a cardinal. That plan was the reason why he wanted a Latin secretary known for a superb Latin style that would pass muster even in Rome.
For Erasmus, the prospect of a visit to Italy was alluring, but the greatest advantage was release from the tedium of the monastery. Although Bishop Henry was attentive, he was a politician and a courtier, not an intellectual or spiritual leader. His household moved about frequently, and Erasmus soon complained of the unsettled nature of life at court and the lack of time for study. In the end, Bishop Henry's hopes of becoming a cardinal collapsed because of political changes at Rome, and he lost interest in his talented secretary. Erasmus persuaded the bishop to send him to study theology at Paris, the most celebrated theological faculty in Europe. By the fall of 1495, Erasmus was at Paris, living in the strictest and most ascetic institution in the university, the Collège de Montaigu.
Life at Montaigu was harsh, and for Erasmus, almost intolerable. Poor students were expected to do menial labor in addition to attending to their studies. The conditions were so harsh, the facilities so filthy, and the diet so sparse that Erasmus blamed his later digestive ailments on the foul food at Montaigu. He fell seriously ill and returned for a time to the court of his bishop and even paid a visit to his monastic brethren at Steyn. When he returned to Paris, he left Montaigu and found private lodgings.
Even before he began his studies at Paris, Erasmus had expressed hostility to the traditional scholastic theology based on questions, disputations, and reliance on Aristotle. Although a leading expert on the Paris theologians has speculated that Erasmus never seriously undertook the lengthy process of qualifying for a degree in theology, his letters from his early years there do reflect attendance at lectures that he regarded as dull, worthless, and presented in abominable (that is, medieval) Latin (for example, Ep 64, CWE 1:137–138). Surely in his first year, when he resided in the tightly disciplined community at Montaigu, he must have participated regularly in the formal academic exercises. But Paris also had an active literary life and had been thoroughly exposed to the humanistic culture of Italy. The city and the court had a substantial circle of humanists. The outstanding figure in this circle was Robert Gaguin, a writer and translator of mainly historical books and a senior professor of canon law, an astute man frequently employed by the king for diplomatic missions, and a distinguished monk who was the general of a small monastic order, the Trinitarians. Erasmus quickly established contact with him. Gaguin recognized Erasmus' outstanding Latin style, and when in 1495 a blank page needed to be filled at the end of his book on the history of the Franks, he invited his new friend to write a letter praising the book. This letter was the first writing by Erasmus to appear in print (Ep 45, CWE 1:87–91), the first of many. Erasmus formed friendships with other humanists, both Italian and French, and published two volumes of Latin poems by himself and one of his fellow-monks at Steyn.
Although Erasmus still longed for the title (but not the theological ideas) of a Paris doctorate, he drifted away gradually from serious pursuit of a degree. His real interests were the study of classical literature and his own ambitions to be a Latin poet. Nevertheless, his later writings, especially those directed against Martin Luther, show considerable familiarity with the theologians and scholastic traditions taught at Paris. In a letter of 1498, he still expressed a desire to take a doctorate in theology but now wanted to do this at Bologna (where the theological curriculum was far less demanding and drawn-out) rather than at Paris (Ep 75, CWE 1:151). In that same letter, he complained that Bishop Henry had become slow to pay the promised subsidy to support his studies. Both through correspondence and on visits to the Netherlands, he sought new patrons, but with only limited success. Erasmus had to earn money as a tutor to wealthy young students at Paris. His reputation for excellent Latin style and mastery of ancient literature must have helped him win paying customers, including an English aristocrat who became his patron for the rest of his life, William Blount, Lord Mountjoy. Erasmus did not want to become a teacher, but he was very good at it, attracting youths who grew up to be patrons and friends, and producing simple versions of several textbooks that later in his career were published in revised versions and became highly successful throughout Europe, including a practical guide effective letter-writing, a paraphrase of Lorenzo Valla's masterly guide to classical Latin style, the Elegantiae, an early form of his Colloquies, his own guide to writing classical Latin, De copia, even a guide to good manners for young students.
The most useful of his pupils at Paris was Lord Mountjoy. In the summer of 1499 Mountjoy returned to England and invited Erasmus to accompany him for an extended stay. He took his Dutch friend to court and let him experience life on a wealthy rural estate, a novel experience for a man who had always faced poverty. In the Netherlands, Erasmus had been an obscure (even if talented) monk; in Paris, an impoverished student and poet. But in England, he was received as the guest of a wealthy nobleman and a published author of Latin poems. He visited Oxford, where he met a wealthy and well-connected cleric, John Colet, who was studying theology in his own headstrong way, scornful of traditional scholastic theology and bold enough to present public lectures on the Epistles of Paul that approached the New Testament as a literary text rather than as a bundle of scholastic propositions. The two men became friends, and Colet tried to persuade Erasmus to stay at Oxford and present similar lectures on the Old Testament. Erasmus declined this proposal, for he was convinced that he was unqualified to expound Scripture. Unlike Colet, who knew no Greek and did not even know that he needed it, Erasmus did not think it possible to do competent exegesis solely on the basis of the Latin translation. Some older biographies of Erasmus and of Colet claimed that this contact with Colet was responsible for the transformation of Erasmus from a classical scholar and aspiring poet into a serious theologian. This claim is unfounded. Much as Erasmus liked Colet, he also recognized his narrowness of outlook and lack of any deep understanding of how humanist learning could revolutionize biblical studies. Recent scholarship has concluded that “Colet had nothing to teach Erasmus about scriptural exegesis at any stage” (Gleason 1989:233).
The unfounded claim that Colet exercised a decisive influence on the transformation of Erasmus from an undirected enthusiast for classical literature into a pioneering theologian and biblical scholar was based on biographers' awareness of an apparently sudden change in Erasmus soon after he got back from England early in 1500. During his time in the monastery and also at Paris, Erasmus did show signs of spiritual concern and a desire to relate his classical studies to his Christian faith. Colet, happily ignorant of Greek and too stubborn to recognize his own shortcomings, is an unlikely source of the transformation that Erasmus experienced. Yet it does seem that while in England, Erasmus began to realize that if he wanted to accomplish anything significant in theology, he would have to master the Greek language. English friends other than Colet may have played a significant role in this development. In a letter to a former student of his who was in Italy to study law, Erasmus extols his experience in England and praises the remarkably advanced state of classical learning there, “in both Latin and Greek.” While he praises the Greekless Colet, he also mentions two other English humanists who had spent extended periods in Italy and had engaged in serious study of Greek, William Grocyn and Thomas Linacre (Ep 118, CWE 1:117–118). Erasmus may have met another English humanist, William Latimer, who had studied Greek at Florence along with Grocyn and Giovanni de’Medici (the future Pope Leo X). Thus Erasmus' new determination to master the Greek language, evident from shortly after his return from England, may have been inspired by new English friends, but not by Colet.
As an impoverished monk, Erasmus was not bashful about soliciting gifts of money to support his studies. But when he was ready to cross the Channel, English customs officers at Dover confiscated nearly all of the cash he had received since the export of bullion was illegal. Thus he arrived back in Paris to face penury even worse than usual. He schemed with his friend Jacob Batt in the Netherlands how to extract more money from a rich prospective patron, Anna van Borsselen,. In 1500 fear of plague drove him from Paris. Initially he took refuge at Orléans, but when the infection spread there, he decided to return to the Netherlands. He went to Steyn and secured permission to absent himself for another year of study, and he called on his unreliable patron the bishop of Cambrai, but with little success. Throughout this grim period, he never let his poverty stop him from writing and studying. In 1500 he published a little book, Adagiorum collectanea, an anthology of proverbs and sayings derived from classical sources, a slim little volume with only 818 items, all taken from Latin sources. Even in this primitive form, it was a book that aspiring humanists, who wanted to flesh out their own writings with passages taken from the ancients and thus appear to be more learned than they really were, found useful. It sold and brought in a little money.
Learning Greek now became Erasmus' most urgent goal. At Paris and in Holland he was so impoverished that he could barely afford the Greek texts and grammar books that he needed. There was only one active teacher of Greek at Paris, a Byzantine exile. Erasmus found him to be expensive, deficient in mastery of the ancient literary language, and incompetent as a teacher. But with some help from his tutoring and the aid of Greek books that he managed to buy (a Plato) or borrow from friends (a Homer), Erasmus taught himself Greek by tediously translating Greek books into Latin. He worked at Greek every day and by late 1502 claimed that he was able to read and write the language. Although he saw the necessity of Greek for a thorough understanding of the Latin classics, he also emphasized its crucial role in theology.
Both his determined effort to master Greek and his interest in editing the writings of St. Jerome, the most learned of the ancient Latin Fathers and the principal translator of the current Latin Bible, suggest that Erasmus had become far more deeply committed to religion than he had been. It is an oversimplification to say that he was transformed from a secular poet into a spiritual Christian and a biblical and patristic scholar. His early letters and his De contemptu mundi, begun while he still lived at Steyn, show that he had been concerned with spiritual matters from an early age. But after his return from England in 1500, religion as well as the study of Greek became more prominent in his thought. John Colet, who was very religious in his own idiosyncratic way, might have had some influence; but the two men really became close only during Erasmus' third period of residence in England from 1509 to 1514. A much more plausible inspiration of Erasmus' turn toward religion was a man whom he met after he returned to the Netherlands for an extended stay (1501–1505), mainly because he needed a patron who would subsidize his studies. In 1501 at St.-Omer, Erasmus met Jean Vitrier, a combative, reform-minded Franciscan friar who, despite many troubles with religious authorities who resented his blunt denunciation of clerical corruption, had become warden of the Franciscan convent there. Vitrier eventually became a spiritual adviser to Erasmus. Vitrier was deeply mystical, devoted to the teachings of St. Paul and to the early Greek church, especially the patristic theologian Origen. At his urging, Erasmus spent much time reading Origen's commentary on Paul's Epistle to the Romans. Origen was especially attractive both because of his early date (died about 253) and because he was one of the creators of the contemplative, Bible-oriented theology that prevailed in the patristic age, in contrast to the medieval scholasticism based on quaestiones and use of Aristotelian dialectic. Scholasticism was what had turned Erasmus away from the study of theology. Now he found an alternative model, sanctified by its early date and particularly attractive to a humanist scholar because it involved linguistic and literary analysis of a text, the central element in the humanists' intellectual method. Reading Origen directed his attention to the spiritual meaning of the sacred text.
This new direction in theology also impressed Erasmus as practical, concerned with the religious dimension of a Christian's life rather than the abstruse issues debated by the theologians at Paris. The initial expression of this new outlook was a guide to the Christian life, Enchiridion militis christiani (Handbook of the Christian Soldier), a little book addressed not to the monks and contemplatives who had withdrawn from secular life (such as the Brethren of the Common Life) but to a Christian layman who needed spiritual guidance. Addressing a man with a military background, Erasmus defines the true Christian life as constant warfare against worldly temptation. In this struggle, the Christian can rely on two weapons, prayer and knowledge, especially knowledge of Scripture. Erasmus wrote this book with the encouragement of Vitrier, who urged him to publish it. The first edition appeared early in 1503 in a small collection of Erasmus' works. At first, as part of collections of assorted works by Erasmus, it had only modest influence and sales. Beginning in 1515, when it appeared from two different publishers as a small separate book, and culminating with the definitive edition of 1518 to which Erasmus added an effective preface addressed to his friend Paul Volz, the Enchiridion became not only a best-seller but also a major influence on the spiritual life of Christians. By the end of the sixteenth century, there had been more than seventy editions of the Latin text, as well frequently reprinted translations into most of the vernacular languages of Western and Central Europe. Although its popularity has puzzled many modern observers, its power may be linked to its author's own search for his spiritual identity, his discovery of his true vocation as a theologian. The Enchiridion marks the first clear step toward a conception of Christian life and Christian faith that a decade later Erasmus called philosophia Christi—originally in one of the greatest and most popular of the new adages, “Sileni Alcibiadis,” that he added to a revolutionary new edition of his Adagia published in 1515, and then repeated in his preface addressed to Paul Volz. The concept itself is not philosophical at all; it is a religious affirmation that a true Christian must allow Christ's spirit (or “philosophy”) to permeate every facet of his life, that Christianity must become a way of life, not just a set of formal doctrines and external ceremonies. The phrase had roots in the Greek patristic authors whom he was studying when he wrote the Enchiridion (Augustijn 1991:75).
After Erasmus finally realized that his hopes of significant patronage from a wealthy woman he had cultivated, Anna van Bolrsselen, would never be fulfilled, he moved to the university town of Louvain, where the first edition of the Enchiridion was published. By this time he had a reputation as a master of Latin style and an expert in classical literature. The conservative theologian Adriaan Floriszoon (the future Pope Adrian VI), chancellor of the university, persuaded the city of Louvain to offer Erasmus a lectureship at the university; but Erasmus declined, probably fearing that teaching would distract him from his study of Greek. Floriszoon remained friendly, and there is some evidence that Erasmus attended his theological lectures while living in Louvain (Ep 1304, CWE 9:145). In 1505 Erasmus published his first translation from Greek, some Declamationes by the fourth-century rhetorician Libanius, and dedicated the book to the wealthy and influential bishop of Arras, Nicolas Ruistre, obviously still seeking a new patron. Ruistre was the person who arranged for Erasmus to represent the university by delivering a formal oration of welcome at Brussels in January 1504 to the ruler of the Netherlands, Archduke Philip of Habsburg, upon his safe return from an extended visit he and his wife Juana made in 1501 to Juana's parents, the king and queen of Spain, followed by Philip's return by way of Austria, where he spent time with his father, the Emperor Maximilian I. The assigned genre was a panegyric in the classical style. Erasmus found writing such a speech, which by reason of the genre was full of unctuous and meaningless flattery, arduous and demeaning, but he needed the cash reward that he knew he would receive and also wanted public recognition. Erasmus probably spent most of 1504 at Louvain but by December was back in Paris,.
One unexpected result of his time in Louvain was that while rummaging through the library of a neighboring monastery, he came across an almost unknown masterpiece of scholarship by Lorenzo Valla, probably the ablest Italian humanist of the fifteenth century. This was the Annotations on the New Testament, based on Valla's use of Greek manuscripts to investigate some obscure portions of the traditional Latin translation. This work had never been printed. Erasmus already knew much about Valla and had even written an epitome of his most influential book, the Elegantiae, a guide to the writing of good (that is, classical) Latin. Valla's Annotations were an example of his remarkable philological skill and critical intellect, using manuscripts of the Greek New Testament to resolve questions about certain biblical passages that seemed corrupt or unclear in the traditional Latin Bible. Erasmus concluded that in interpreting the sacred text, a critical-minded grammarian could be a better exegete than a conventional theologian who specialized in resolving scholastic questions rather than in teasing out the meaning of a biblical text. While Valla's notes had remained narrowly philological, Erasmus conceived a more far-ranging approach that was a greater challenge to traditional exegesis (Tracy 1972:154–155). He prepared an edition of Valla's work and published it at Paris in March 1505.
Although his period in the Netherlands from 1501 to the end of 1504 was a difficult time, when he was poor and had little success in his search for patrons, it was also the period when he seriously began to define his life's work. At Paris in the 1490s he was formally studying theology, but he really dabbled in theology and focused his efforts on classical Latin literature and writing Latin poetry. He was adrift, his future direction still undefined. His visit to England in 1499–1500 probably did represent a step toward his future career as a biblical and patristic scholar, and Colet did draw him toward biblical studies, though the time in England may have been even more important because of his contact with English Hellenists like Linacre and Grocyn. His time back in the Netherlands contributed far more to his redefinition of his future. The first great event was his encounter with Jean Vitrier, who became a spiritual guide at a time when Erasmus was spiritually troubled and whose influence reinforced a tendency to conceive religion as a personal and inward experience. Vitrier had already been a sharp critic of many current practices such as excessive veneration of the saints, the clergy's financial exploitation of gullible laymen, and the accumulation of great wealth by ecclesiastical institutions. Erasmus had already arrived at some of the same opinions, but Vitrier probably encouraged him to speak out. Finally, Vitrier was an admirer of patristic authors considerably earlier than St. Jerome, whom Erasmus had long admired. In particular, he exposed Erasmus to the works of the first great Christian theologian, Origen. Vitrier pointed Erasmus toward a new conception of theology, no longer as a systematically demonstrated set of answers to broad speculative issues discussed by specialists in the shop-talk of the university faculty but as a practical guide to the religious life of devout Christians, founded on the Bible and the Church Fathers.
The new Erasmian theology that was in gestation between 1500 and 1505 had one other principal characteristic. It involved the marriage of the most advanced humanist modes of textual criticism (as advanced by Valla) to the text of the Bible, chiefly in its original languages, Hebrew and Greek. The new theology would require advanced linguistic skills rather than skill in dialectical disputation. He also believed that this new theology would be more like the theology of the early Church Fathers than the scholastic theology of the universities. This does not mean that in 1505 he had a fully developed program that pointed clearly toward his later career, but he did already know that he would have to continue the perfection of his Greek and must closely study the patristic authors. His new spiritual orientation did not end his devotion to the classics. He was a busy man, publishing editions of ancient works like Cicero's De officiis, a work of moral philosophy; the Disticha Catonis, a popular collection of versified moral maxims from late antiquity; and the Mimes of Publilius Syrus, a minor but popular Roman playwright famous for his witty sayings. None of these editions was pathbreaking, but they may have brought him some income from the original publishers and certainly would enhance his reputation as a master of Latin style.
Sometime in the autumn of 1505, Erasmus left Paris for England, where he stayed through the winter and spring of 1506. Reasons for this move are purely speculative, but he may have thought that he had better connections there in his search for patrons. During this visit he established friendships with three learned and influential bishops, Richard Foxe of Winchester, John Fisher of Rochester, and William Warham, the archbishop of Canterbury, all of whom eventually did become helpful patrons. There was another advantage, perhaps even more essential for his future. He received from Pope Julius II a dispensation (4 January 1506) absolving him from the impediment created by his illegitimate birth to his holding an ecclesiastical benefice: in other words, he could now lawfully hold benefices that would provide the kind of ecclesiastical income that supported most university professors and scholars. His closest personal connection during this visit was with Thomas More, now established as a young barrister, who had also been studying Greek. The two friends worked on translation of several works of the ancient satirical poet Lucian, and they jointly published these with a Paris publisher in 1506. Early in 1506, Erasmus went to Cambridge and enrolled as a candidate for the doctorate in theology.
But Erasmus did not settle in Cambridge. Through his friendships with people at the royal court, he learned of an opportunity to fulfill his ambition of visiting in Italy. The king's Italian physician wanted a learned scholar to accompany his two sons to Italy and supervise the first year of their studies at the University of Bologna. As early as 1498, Erasmus had discussed moving to Bologna, where the theological course was shorter, and taking his doctorate there (Ep 75, CWE 1:151). Erasmus and his pupils stopped for two months in Paris to allow him to supervise publication of several translations from Greek. From Paris the travelers took an unusual route by way of Turin, apparently because Erasmus had arranged in advance to receive his doctorate there. The degree was truly rapid. The diploma, dated 4 September 1506, makes it clear that he had been given a formal oral examination by members of the faculty of theology. He and his traveling companions had been in Turin for about two or three weeks. He attended no classes. Although in modern times often dismissed as an “honorary degree,” in fact his doctorate was a genuine academic degree awarded on the basis of his established reputation for learning in theology and his study at Paris, all confirmed by the genuine (but perhaps not very searching) oral examination administered before the award was made. It was conferred by a small and undistinguished school, but Turin was a lawfully recognized university. Erasmus usually did not lay much emphasis on his doctorate, and he was usually vague about its source. He preferred to emphasize his public recognition as a theologian by three popes, but his Turin doctorate was what gave him a legal right to speak and publish on theological questions.
From Turin Erasmus and his pupils headed for Bologna, but since that city was being besieged by the army of Pope Julius II, they turned aside to Florence, where they spent only a few days. They then completed their trip to Bologna, just in time to witness the formal entry of Pope Julius into the conquered city at the head of his army on 15 November 1506, a sight that the peace-loving Erasmus found disgusting and inappropriate for a Christian bishop. Once he and his two pupils were settled at Bologna, Erasmus formed friendships with local humanists, consulted Greek manuscripts, and worked on translations from Greek and on a new, vastly expanded edition of his collection of ancient proverbs, the Adages. He remained in Bologna for nearly all of 1507. Late in October, he wrote to the greatest Italian publisher of the Renaissance, Aldus Manutius of Venice, seeking to have his translations of two plays of Euripides, already published at Paris in 1506, reprinted by the Venetian publisher. This Aldine edition appeared promptly, before the end of 1507. A further goal, perhaps from the first, was to have Aldus publish the expanded edition of the Adages he had been working on. Aldus was interested, and in the winter or early spring of 1507 Erasmus left Bologna for Venice. There he worked amid the bustle of the print shop for eight months on the new Adages, surrounded by the cluster of classical scholars (including several native Greeks) who constantly brought to his attention additional Greek authors from whom he could extract new items. The revised edition, issued in September, represented a revolutionary change. The original edition at Paris in 1500 was a volume of 152 pages, including 818 proverbs. It was based entirely on texts available in Latin. But the Aldine edition contained 3260 proverbs, with longer and more scholarly commentaries; and since the press was the greatest center of Greek linguistic and literary knowledge in Europe, the volume was not only bigger but also immensely richer in Greek sources, providing Western scholars with a resource such as had never existed before. It confirmed and securely established Erasmus' reputation as a major classical scholar. The book was a commercial as well as a scholarly success. Aldus wanted Erasmus to settle in Venice. He did remain until December, working on editions of the Roman dramatists Terence, Plautus, and Seneca. Erasmus learned much from association with the scholars around him, especially from access to Aldus' unrivalled collection of Greek texts. No doubt his Greek improved. But his greatest discovery was that his linguistic and literary knowledge even on arrival was equal to that of any of the Aldine scholars. In 1531, replying to the aspersions of his Italian critic Alberto Pio, he declared his independence of the Italian scholarly world: “My literary education owes nothing to Italy” (Phillips 1964: 68).
Late in 1508 Erasmus moved to the university town of Padua, where he became tutor to two illegitimate sons of King James IV of Scotland. He found Padua a more pleasant place to live than Venice, but the threat of war caused group to move to the University of Siena before the end of the year. Shortly after the beginning of Lent, Erasmus left on a trip to Rome, where later he brought his pupils to spend Holy Week. The group made a trip to Naples, after which the Scottish youths returned home and Erasmus went back to Rome.
Erasmus' years in Italy are sparsely documented in his usually rich correspondence, which preserves none of his own letters from the spring of 1509 down to 1511. When he arrived in Rome in the late winter of 1509, he found a warm welcome, for his publications, especially the Aldine edition of the Adages and perhaps some of his translations from Greek, had established his reputation as an able classical scholar. He met many learned men in the papal curia, including several cardinals. There was some talk of finding him employment in one of the curial offices. Yet his general impression of curial society was unfavorable; he found it to be a rich, indolent, self-serving, and luxury-loving milieu. Many years later, in his Ciceronianus, he recalled the sermons he heard there for their inflated rhetoric and their offensive neglect of the central beliefs of the Christian faith. Most of the papal secretaries he met impressed him as essentially mere careerists, pagans, lacking a truly Christian spirit.
Sometime after his return from Naples to Rome, news of the death of Henry VII (21 April 1509) reached Rome. His former pupil Lord Mountjoy wrote on 27 May praising the young new king, Henry VIII, as a potential blessing to men of letters and urging Erasmus to settle in England, reporting that Archbishop Warham of Canterbury promised to present Erasmus with a benefice if he would settle in England. The accession of a friendly young king who seemed interested in literature struck him as an opportunity more attractive than a possible career at the papal curia. He knew England well from his two earlier visits and had many influential friends there. In July 1509 he left Rome for England, and despite friendly invitations from later popes, he never went back.
On the long journey to England, Erasmus conceived and began writing what still remains his best-known literary work, the satire The Praise of Folly, which he completed in London while staying in the home of his closest English friend, Thomas More. Its Latin title, Encomium Moriae, was a pun on More's name (moria was Greek for folly). His hopes of lavish patronage from the new king, however, were not fulfilled; Henry VIII proved to be more interested in Continental politics and war than in scholarship. Eventually, thanks to the help of Bishop John Fisher, who was chancellor of Cambridge University, he was appointed lecturer in Greek and in divinity at Cambridge, where he moved late in the summer of 1511. He seems to have been given wide latitude on the subject of his theological lectures, which were related to his editorial work on patristic authors, especially St. Jerome. Erasmus had ample time for literary work, not only on his study of Jerome's letters but also on translations of St. Basil, Plutarch, and more of Lucian into Latin but also on an edition of the Roman moralist Seneca. From his years at Cambridge comes the first evidence since 1505 that he was at work on the text of the New Testament. Much of the flood of scholarly publication that he published in 1515 and 1516 at Basel represented work he began while at Cambridge. Yet he was always unhappy there. He missed the company of friends left behind at London: More, Colet, and the Italian humanist Andrea Ammonio, Latin secretary to King Henry. He found the company of Scotist and Thomist theologians, eager to criticize his reform-minded friend Colet and suspicious of anyone who studied the language of the schismatic Greeks, tiring. Cambridge seemed isolated and “barbarous.” One pleasant activity was his ability to help his wealthy friend John Colet carry out final preparations for his new educational foundation, St. Paul's School. He wrote several poems, prayers, and orations for the new school, but his most important help was that at Colet's request he wrote and published a textbook on how to develop a fine Latin style (De duplici copia). It proved to be a great success not only in the new school but also in hundreds of editions reprinted all over Europe during the rest of the century. Also coming from his years at Cambridge was a satirical dialogue that he never acknowledged, harshly criticizing the recently deceased warrior-pope Julius II, whose triumphant entry into the conquered city of Bologna he had witnessed in 1506, as a warmonger. This dialogue is discussed further in section 3 below.
Erasmus was still financially needy. In 1511 Archbishop Warham granted him a valuable benefice, the parish of Aldington in Kent. Warham declared that normally he disapproved appointment of non-resident priests but in this case granted the appointment because it would support Erasmus' outstanding scholarly work. Erasmus provided a stipend for a substitute rector and drew the balance of the revenues as an annual pension for the rest of his life. In the long run, he found life at Cambridge too much to endure. In January 1514 he moved to London. He realized that his hopes of generous royal patronage would never be fulfilled, and London was a stopping-point on his way back to the Netherlands. In July 1514, he crossed the Channel to the English enclave at Calais. Awaiting him there was a letter from the prior of his monastery at Steyn, ordering him to return to Steyn and resume his life as a monk. Erasmus flatly refused. After first repeating his standard story of being pushed reluctantly into the monastery at an excessively early age, and claiming that his fragile health and his experience living in the monastery proved that he was unsuited to monastic life, he cited his Enchiridion and Adages as contributions to religion and learning and described the scholarly projects he had under way, including work on the New Testament and the editing of St. Jerome, none of which could be completed at Steyn. From Calais Erasmus visited friends and patrons in the Netherlands and stopped for a time at the University of Louvain. His plan was probably to establish his residence in the Netherlands. Although his English benefice did not pay him enough to cover his total expenses, he evidently (and correctly) estimated that fees from publishers who wanted to print new Erasmian works and gifts from patrons, now that he had attained a degree of fame, would allow him to live independently. His immediate goal, however, was to go to Basel in order to visit the publisher Johann Froben, who had reprinted the Aldine edition of the Adages in 1513 and now had in his hands a vastly expanded version of the same book. Erasmus knew that Froben had a team of scholars preparing an edition of the complete works of St. Jerome and probably wanted to arrange for the edition of Jerome's letters on which he was working to be incorporated into that undertaking.
Erasmus set out from Louvain in August 1514, headed for Basel. This trip up the Rhine marked a watershed in his life. He must have been aware that he had finally gained substantial public recognition, but now, as he traveled from city to city up the river, he was greeted in many places, including important cities such as Trier, Mainz, and Strasbourg, by leaders of the local humanist movement who gathered to pay their respects and greet him as the greatest humanist scholar Germany ever had. Erasmus was flattered by the attention. He may not yet have become prosperous, but he was famous. This journey up the Rhine marks the beginning of a decade when Erasmus was the most famous writer in Europe, a clear example of the new power of the press, since his writings, published by the leading firms of the Netherlands, France, and now Basel, and reprinted again and again by lesser presses from Britain to Poland, were the foundation of his fame. Although after 1520 the growing religious upheaval of the early Reformation somewhat dimmed his reputation and eventually cost him some of his following, he remained a celebrity for the rest of his life.
Johann Froben, the publisher he had come to meet, was one of the greatest publishers of the century. Though not a scholar himself, he was sympathetic to talented scholars and seems to have had the rare knack of making money while publishing scholarly books. Basel, a self-governing city with its own university and politically sheltered by its recent entry into the powerful Swiss Confederation, had become a major center for publishing, and Froben was its most distinguished publisher. Froben recognized Erasmus' importance and went out of his way to make him welcome. Erasmus had several matters to settle with him when he arrived in mid-August, beginning with production of the new and significantly enhanced edition of the Adages. Erasmus enlisted himself in Froben's existing plan to publish the works of St. Jerome, taking full responsibility for the correspondence and agreeing to become the general editor for the whole project. He was also at work on an edition of the works of the Roman Stoic philosopher Seneca and a new edition of his own Enchiridion.
But Erasmus had also been pondering what to do with the results of his years spent studying the New Testament, especially what should be his next step after his publication (1505) of Lorenzo Valla's Annotationes on the New Testament. Exactly what Erasmus intended to publish on the New Testament is not clear. Probably he had in mind an edition of the traditional Latin Vulgate text accompanied by his own notes based on several Greek manuscripts. Perhaps he intended merely to publish his notes. Sometime between his first meeting with Froben in August 1514 and the publication of his New Testament in February 1516, the scope of the project was immensely widened. Froben may well have been the one who promoted the change, which transformed what might have been an obscure edition of scholarly notes into a book that (despite the flaws of the hastily completed first edition) permanently changed the course of biblical studies. The new book, published in late winter of 1516, was called Novum Instrumentum, in later editions changed to Novum Testamentum. It included the first published edition of the Greek text of the New Testament, accompanied by a cautious revision of the traditional Latin New Testament and by Erasmus' annotations explaining how in specific passages, study of the Greek text clarified the meaning of the Latin text. In later editions he more boldly substituted his own new Latin translation, based on the Greek text, for the cautious revision of the old version that he used in 1516. Froben was not only an excellent printer but also a shrewd businessman. He knew that if he moved fast, he could get a book onto the market before the six-volume polyglot edition of the whole Bible then being produced in Spain by a team of scholars generously financed by the Cardinal-Archbishop of Toledo, Ximénes de Cisneros. The New Testament part of that project was already in print before Erasmus finished his own edition, but issues of censorship kept the volumes locked in a warehouse until the Old Testament volumes had been printed and final authorization for publication was received from the pope in 1521. By that time, Erasmus' New Testament was already available in a much-improved third edition. Thus the bureaucratic controls in Spain and Rome guaranteed that Erasmus' edition would become the decisive force in New Testament scholarship. In any case, though the Spanish scholars based at Alcalá had far more and far better Greek manuscripts, they were bound by their patron to traditional principles of exegesis. This meant that their edition was made obsolete even before publication by Erasmus' humanistic methods of textual criticism. The future of biblical studies belonged to the new philological and critical methods developed by Erasmus, not to the cautious and traditionalist approach of the Spanish scholars (Bentley 1983:70–193).
The publication of the New Testament in February 1516, shrewdly dedicated to Pope Leo X and graciously received by him, followed later that year by the first edition of a great nine-volume edition of the works of St. Jerome, marks the summit of Erasmus' scholarly career, confirming his status as the greatest scholar of his generation. In the preceding year, Froben had brought out a new edition of the Adages that added yet more proverbs to the “thousands” already claimed in the title of the Aldine edition of 1508. This new edition marks the beginning of a new literary function for the Adages. In certain of the articles, the text included not only the ancient source in its original language and a relatively brief discussion of its meaning but also added a fairly long essay in which Erasmus used the adage as a starting-point for discussion of some issue of current interest that seemed related to the adage and meaningful to Erasmus himself. A good example, added in 1515, is Dulce bellum inexpertis, discussed below as an example of Erasmus' pacifism. The Adages became not only a handy tool for those who wrote in Latin but also a medium for expressing Erasmus' opinions, and the book was another literary and financial success, frequently reprinted throughout the century.
Despite his literary and scholarly success, Erasmus had no reliable income except the modest annual payment from his English benefice. The multiple reprintings of his books brought in little or no revenue. Authorship brought in very limited income for the author, even in the case of a widely circulated literary work like The Praise of Folly or a textbook and literary book like the Colloquies. Authors needed generous patrons; authors who were priests might be given ecclesiastical benefices that paid a steady annual income. After completing arrangements with Froben for his several impending publications, Erasmus made a brief trip to England in March 1515 and then proceeded to the Netherlands., where he visited Louvain and then stayed close to the ducal court, fishing for patrons. Jean Le Sauvage, chancellor of Burgundy, was probably the person most responsible for the appointment of Erasmus as a ducal councilor early in 1516, a position that was purely honorary but theoretically yielded a substantial annual pension (though in fact, since the government was usually short of money, Erasmus rarely received payment). In response to this appointment, Erasmus wrote a tract on The Education of a Christian Prince and dedicated it to the youthful ruler Archduke Charles (the later Emperor Charles V). At the urging of Le Sauvage, in 1517 he also published a book that restated the anti-war sentiments expressed in the adage Dulce bellum, called Querela pacis (The Complaint of Peace). Le Sauvage had a political goal since he was a leader of a court faction that favored a cautious foreign policy of rapprochement with France and avoidance of military adventures in Italy. There was a talk of further ecclesiastical preferment, even suggestions that Erasmus might be made bishop (non-resident, of course) of some diocese in Sicily. More useful was Le Sauvage's gift of a canonry in the cathedral at Courtrai, which Erasmus could exchange for an annual pension. Like Aldington in England, Courtrai provided a modest but reliable annual income for the rest of his life. The two benefices together did not make him rich, but they ended his many years of poverty.
In the summer of 1516, Erasmus made a short trip to London, where he and his friend the expatriate Italian Andrea Ammonio drew up a petition to the apostolic chancery in Rome seeking a papal dispensation to guarantee his eligibility for his benefices. His petition sought relief from certain legal disabilities: one, from the consequences of his illegitimate birth as the son of a priest, which rendered him legally ineligible to receive a benefice; second, his membership in a religious order, which required him to reside at Steyn; and finally, his obligation to wear the distinctive garb of the Augustinian Canons. Dispensations granted by Pope Julius II in 1506 had addressed some of these issues, but he wanted to be more certain of his legal status. Perhaps also the letter from the abbot at Steyn in 1514, ordering him to return to the monastery, made him apprehensive. In January 1517 Pope Leo X issued two formal letters, one addressed to Ammonio and the other to Erasmus himself, confirming the approval of his petition, absolving him from guilt for any technical violations of church law, and authorizing him to accept and hold ecclesiastical benefices, even multiple ones. Pope Leo also sent a friendly personal letter to Erasmus vaguely declaring that he had granted his petition and warmly praising his character and his learning. This last letter, Erasmus promptly published; the other two he kept private, as they were intended to be. In April 1517, Erasmus made a quick trip to London so that Ammonio as the pope's delegate could absolve him of any sin related to the previous legal irregularity of his status.
Erasmus seems to have decided to make the Netherlands his permanent home. He was now a famous man, especially among the young humanists of Germany, who idolized him and looked upon him as the person who was initiating a spiritual and institutional renewal of Christendom. In early summer of 1517, as Archduke Charles prepared to travel to Spain and take possession of Spain as successor to his grandfather King Ferdinand, Erasmus decided not to accompany the large delegation of officials from the Netherlands who would go with the ruler. He chose to remain in the Netherlands and eventually decided to settle at the University of Louvain. He knew that this move might be risky. The faculty of theology was dominated by the same sort of tradition-minded scholastic theologians he had learned to dislike at Paris. Indeed, controversy threatened even before he had decided on a place to settle. In 1514 Martin van Dorp, a candidate for a doctorate in theology who also had some credentials as a humanist, had written Erasmus expressing dismay at what the theologians regarded as the flippancy and irreverence of The Praise of Folly. Still worse, Dorp's letter interpreted Erasmus' plan to publish annotations and corrections for a revision of the New Testament as a dangerous and subversive undertaking that implied that the church had erred for centuries by relying on a Latin Bible that Erasmus claimed was full of errors. Only Erasmus' plan for an edition of the works of St. Jerome received Dorp's praise. Erasmus shrugged off criticism of the Folly by dismissing the book as a mere trifle. But if even a theological candidate with good humanist credentials regarded Erasmus' scriptural studies as subversive, Louvain must have seemed a rather hostile environment. Dorp himself changed his opinion, mainly because he was shamed into it by a brilliant letter in defense of Erasmus written by Thomas More. In a lecture delivered in 1516, Dorp endorsed Erasmus' opinions on biblical criticism and the value of Greek. His seniors in the faculty, who may have instigated his earlier letter, took revenge by refusing to renew his certification to teach courses in theology during the following year, though his status in the faculty soon recovered. The whole incident, however, demonstrates that Louvain was not a very welcoming place for a biblical scholar like Erasmus. Nevertheless, in January 1517, six months before Prince Charles left for Spain, Erasmus paid a brief visit to Louvain to assess the situation. While he was often waspish as a writer, Erasmus knew how to be charming in person, and the visit seems to have gone well. In August 1517, he did move to Louvain. He matriculated in the faculty of theology as a doctor from another university and later in the autumn was co-opted as an adjunct member. This status did not mean that he taught theology, but he was accepted as a fellow-theologian.
At first, Erasmus' relations with his new colleagues were at least civil and in some cases friendly; Dorp was especially helpful. By this period, Erasmus was an internationally recognized scholar. Admiring letters arrived from humanists all across northern Europe, in such numbers that he found it burdensome to reply. His own letters were copied, collected, and published, often without his consent and sometimes including remarks that he intended to be private. He had himself begun publishing selected letters, and these letters were prized not only for their content but also as examples of the finest Latin style of the age. His fame also encouraged the reprinting of his earlier publications, and it was from this period that the Enchiridion became a best-seller. Erasmus himself became more optimistic, and in February 1517, in a letter to his German humanist friend Wolfgang Capito, he expressed a spirit of optimism about the general state of Christian Europe. The three young rulers of Western Europe seemed to be pursuing peace. The growth of interest in humanistic studies and religious reform, in which he claimed “a very humble part,” seemed to promise better times ahead, so that “I perceive that we may shortly behold the rise of a new kind of golden age” (Ep 541, CWE 4:261–268). His optimism was tempered by awareness that there was still stubborn opposition by reactionary monks and theologians, and a careful reading of the letter shows that he saw the golden age as a possibility in the near future, not something already achieved.
Even though he knew that the leading men among the theological faculty still had reservations about his writings, Erasmus settled down to work at his scholarly projects. His major task was preparation of a revised edition of the New Testament since he was well aware that the hurried edition of 1516 had many defects. He courteously asked his new colleagues for suggestions to improve the revision. The general consensus was favorable though rather vague. Yet everyone involved knew that Erasmus was not the conventional Louvain theologian, and eventually this latent tension led to a breakdown of the original feeling of collegiality. A number of conflicts pitting humanists against traditional academic theologians broke out in Germany and influenced attitudes at Louvain, where the most famous of all humanists now lived among a group of very conservative theologians. One such case was the conflict between the theologians and mendicant friars of the neighboring University of Cologne and the German humanist and pioneering Hebrew scholar Johann Reuchlin that had been brewing since 1510. Erasmus respected Reuchlin's learning and resented the disgraceful way he had been attacked by the Cologne Dominicans, though he was cool to Reuchlin's interest in Hebrew and in Jewish Cabalism. His sympathy for Reuchlin irritated many of his new colleagues, and enthusiastic young German humanists who supported Reuchlin associated his cause with Erasmus, mentioned Erasmus as a foe of the Cologne Dominicans, and even published some friendly private letters that he had written to Reuchlin, commiserating (very cautiously) with his troubles. The youthful firebrands in Germany viewed the case as involving not just suspicion of Jewish religion but also as a premeditated attack on humanist learning in general. Erasmus shared this suspicion, and while he avoided public involvement, he did write confidential letters to several acquaintances at the Roman curia urging that the pope should silence the German mendicants. Despite his caution, his own relations with his peers at Louvain were in jeopardy, since most of them took the side of Reuchlin's enemies.
In at least one case, Erasmus' attempt to foster good will among his theological colleagues made tension worse in the long run. Before starting a trip to Basel in May 1518 to supervise publication of the revised New Testament, Erasmus carefully solicited opinions and suggestions from his conservative colleagues. Several of them, including Jean Briart, the conservative dean of the faculty, replied that they found nothing objectionable. But a young and presumptuous English doctoral candidate, Edward Lee, precipitated a confrontation that ultimately disturbed relations. Lee rashly assumed that Erasmus' polite request for opinions amounted to an invitation for him to collaborate in making corrections, and he was offended to learn that Erasmus had not incorporated his emendations. Though at that stage of his career, Lee had only a limited mastery of Greek and was still only a degree candidate, he began a series of attacks that distracted Erasmus over a period of several years. Erasmus' colleagues on the faculty and his friends in England tried unsuccessfully to persuade Lee to desist. Erasmus complained to the dean of the faculty, Briart, who did arrange a formal interview between Erasmus and Lee in his presence to seek a resolution; but this rather half-hearted effort failed, and the quarrel dragged on until Briart's death in 1520. Although Lee was the aggressor and disturber of peace, Erasmus was the one whose local reputation suffered. No further action against Lee followed, even after Lee, frustrated by his inability to find a local publisher at Louvain for his complaints against Erasmus' biblical scholarship, published his criticisms at Paris, thus making an internal quarrel public.
Other issues also generated tension at Louvain. Ever since he returned from working on the second edition of the New Testament in Basel, Erasmus was deeply engaged in helping to carry out a plan to use a large legacy for the founding at Louvain of a new institute, the Collegium Trilingue, devoted to the teaching and study of the three ancient languages (classical Latin, Greek, and Hebrew) that biblical humanists like Erasmus deemed essential to the future study of theology. Erasmus never made a secret of his conviction that trilingual learning had become essential for the education of a competent theologian; he prefixed to the 1516 New Testament an essay, Paraclesis, that defended the application of Greek language and textual criticism to biblical scholarship; and the second edition (1518) contained a more complete statement of that conviction, Ratio verae theologiae. Even when they appeared as part of his biblical editions, these ideas were a potential challenge to the theologians, for if trilingual study was essential for the training of a competent theologian, then none of the Louvain theologians was truly competent. Erasmus' involvement in the foundation of this new trilingual institute right in their midst was a direct challenge; indeed, not only the theologians but also many in the faculty of arts resisted its foundation and its incorporation into the university. In March 1519, one of the ablest of the Louvain theologians, Jacobus Latomus, published a book flatly denying that trilingual knowledge was necessary for a competent theologian. The book was not explicitly directed against Erasmus, but no one doubted that its intention was to refute him, his biblical prefaces, and the new Collegium trilingue as well.
A troubling sign of increased tensions occurred earlier in 1519 when the dean, Briart, speaking at the formal promotion of a doctoral candidate, bitterly denounced Encomium matrimonii, a book that Erasmus had written many years ago in honor of the marriage of his friend Lord Mountjoy but had published only recently. Briart did not explicitly name the suspicious book or its author, but he interpreted its praise of marriage as heretical because by praising marriage, it weakened the church's traditional preference for celibacy as the ideal form of life for all Christians. Erasmus complained to Briart personally, and the dean confessed that he had misunderstood the intent of the little book. He agreed that since his attack had been public, it was only fair to let Erasmus publish a reply. Erasmus wrote a cautious Apologia that mentioned Briart with great respect and carefully explained the innocence of his own book. But the incident caused harm, for Briart's disciples continued to snipe at Erasmus. At the same period, the publication of several satirical works by German humanists against the anti-Erasmians at Louvain made conditions very tense, even though Erasmus was not complicit in their publication. Although he and Briart remained formally civil, Erasmus suspected that Briart was secretly encouraging attacks on him. Except for Dorp, who had become a loyal friend, and perhaps a few others, the Louvain theologians were increasingly hostile.
Just at this period, the most prominent irritant of all began to manifest itself. This was the incipient religious upheaval set off in Germany by Martin Luther's bold challenge to the practice of indulgences. With remarkable rapidity, reform-minded young German humanists (and many older ones also) who had become admirers of Erasmus identified Luther's ideas and reform program with those of Erasmus, regarding Luther and Erasmus as leaders of a single movement. The emergence of Luther caused serious problems for Erasmus across a broad front, including his situation in Louvain. The similarity between Luther's ideas of theological method and those of Erasmus was obvious; the differences, which existed from the very beginning, were not. While Erasmus' humanist admirers enthusiastically identified Luther's cause with Erasmus' ideas of reform, many of the Louvain theologians saw the same similarities but drew opposite conclusions. Theological conservatives like Briart, Latomus, and the outspoken Carmelite theologian Nicolaus Baechem suspected that Erasmus secretly favored Luther, that Luther's heretical doctrines were derived from Erasmus' ideas, even that Erasmus was the real author of the books published under Luther's name. Erasmus came under intense pressure to join in their denunciation of Luther, but he was unwilling to do so, claiming that he was so busy that he had read none, or almost none, of Luther's publications. In reality, he had read at least some of Luther's books with great interest and had concluded that while Luther took extreme positions on some questions and might have made some errors, there was much to be praised in his works. In a private letter to Luther's main protector, the Electoral Prince Frederick of Saxony, Erasmus implied that the charges of heresy were not valid but were merely part of a conservative plot to destroy recent progress in humanistic studies He urged the Elector to resist pressure to surrender Luther into the hands of his enemies, who would surely put him to death. Erasmus never published this letter, but the Elector sent a copy to Luther and his friends at Wittenberg, who promptly had it printed. This letter must have been known to the Louvain theologians who were denouncing Erasmus as a supporter of Luther and were demanding that he publicly dissociate himself from the new heresy. Erasmus received a careful and polite letter from Luther himself and sent a cautious reply that was friendly but explicitly refused to endorse either side in the controversy. He published both of these letters (written in March and May 1519) in a collection of his correspondence. Indeed, Erasmus was involved in a quiet effort to bring about a settlement of the crisis through mediation among the ruling German princes when they met with the newly elected Emperor Charles V at Cologne in November 1519. In conjunction with a reform-minded Dominican friar, Johannes Faber, he drafted a formal proposal to be laid before the princes, providing that a mediatory commission be appointed to bring about a peaceful resolution of the theological controversy. Erasmus traveled to Cologne to promote this plan, which was well-intentioned but never had a chance of success since no pope would ever surrender his authority to a commission. At Cologne he also had a private interview with Luther's protector, the Elector Frederick, who had asked to meet with him. Erasmus bluntly criticized Luther's pugnacity and arrogance, but he did not regarded him as a heretic and clearly opposed burning Luther's books or turning him over to his enemies. Erasmus returned from Cologne to Louvain, where hostility among the theologians was growing. The faculty was preparing a formal condemnation of Luther's heresies, and it was clear that if he wanted to avert suspicion of supporting those heresies, he was expected to join in the attack. This he refused to do.
In 1520, Luther made Erasmus' life at Louvain even more difficult by publishing three brilliant but radical tracts that repudiated the whole medieval ecclesiastical system. After reading the first of these, On the Babylonian Captivity of the Church, Erasmus realized that the opportunity for quiet doctrinal compromise no longer existed. He remained convinced that Luther's most extreme opponents, including many at Louvain, were really intending to destroy not just the Saxon reformer but also the whole movement of humanist reform. The university and the Habsburg government of the Netherlands obviously expected him to join in the attack on Luther or else be regarded as a supporter of heresy. If he stayed in Louvain, he would be subject to constant attacks and perhaps to prosecution.
By 1521, however, he had another option. By that time, Johann Froben in Basel had become his publisher of choice. Since his initial trip to Basel in 1514, Erasmus had made several lengthy stays in that city to work on forthcoming publications. He found in Froben's workshop a remarkable collection of young collaborators, men learned in the subjects on which Erasmus published, strongly favorable to him and to the cultural, moral, and religious reforms he had promoted. These employees of the press were the nucleus of a broader local humanist community which also included some professors and students in the local university and some of the better educated civic officials and local businessmen The outstanding member of the Basel faculty of theology, Ludwig Baer, had become a close friend, a useful consultant on questions involving scholastic theology. Basel was also a safe place for Erasmus. It was a self-governing city republic within the German Empire, and in 1501 it also became a member of the powerful Swiss Confederation. Located at the head of navigation on the Rhine river, it had excellent commercial and cultural links with the most culturally and economically advanced regions of Germany, extending all the way north to the Netherlands. It had easy overland links to the west with the Habsburg-ruled Franche-Comté and with the French capital. Basel was an ideal location from which to observe, but remain aloof from, the incipient religious and social upheaval that Luther had unleashed, free from the political, ecclesiastical, and academic pressures that he faced in Louvain.
In the autumn of 1521, Erasmus moved from Louvain to Basel, not necessarily intending the move to be permanent. He lived there for nearly eight years, from 1521 until the full conversion of the city to the Protestant Reformation in the spring of 1529, when he felt morally obligated, as a man determined to remain loyal (in his own way) to the old church, to leave a city where open Catholic worship was suppressed. He moved to the near-by city of Freiburg-im-Breisgau, also a university town, which, being directly under Habsburg rule, was not in danger of falling into the hands of the Protestants. He never made an irrevocable commitment to either Basel or Freiburg, sometimes considering a move to Rome, where three successive popes urged him to come and join in the task of healing the schism. Some of his letters mentioned the possibility of returning to France, to England, but especially to the Netherlands. But even after he broke openly with Luther in 1524, he had no intention of becoming an agent of the effort to suppress Luther and his followers. Basel was a safe refuge, a place from which he could still try to intervene in the interests of unity, peace, and moderate reform. Most of this participation was through his continued writing, producing a flood of new or revised editions of patristic texts, classical authors, improved editions of the New Testament, and a series of Paraphrases on the books of the New Testament that restated the scriptural message (as he understood it) in his own words. Erasmus did not move to Basel in order to hide from the problems of his age, only to remove himself from daily encounters with a hostile environment and in order to preserve his freedom to pursue his reform program in his own way.
Almost as soon as Luther's opinions became a source of conflict in the church, many people urged Erasmus to challenge Luther publicly. Moving to Basel relieved the pressure to some extent, but even there, he felt the pressure from friends and patrons who had remained Catholic to speak out against Luther. The pressure came from the Emperor Charles V and many of his officials who were Erasmus' friends; from the emperor's younger brother Ferdinand, who directed Habsburg (and Catholic) interests in the German empire; from Duke George of Saxony, cousin (and dynastic rival) of Luther's protector, the Elector Frederick; from three popes, Leo X, Adrian VI, and Clement VII. All of these powerful men were generally favorable to Erasmus and to the humanist reform program that he had defined. There were widespread doubts about his loyalty to the old church, and these and other patrons tried to persuade him that if he wanted to remove those doubts, he must speak out. This was hard to do, since he never believed that Luther was really a heretic. Yet he was alarmed by the emerging division within the church and by the popular agitation and social unrest in German and Dutch cities. Once he had read Luther's three radical tracts of 1520, he began warning friends, especially his own young humanist disciples who were attracted to Luther, that they should be careful about embracing what seemed certain to become a source of lasting division. In time, some of these warnings got into print, sometimes with Erasmus' complicity. Finally, in 1524, he published an open attack on one central doctrine of Luther's theology, De libero arbitrio (On Free Will), beginning a public confrontation that will be discussed below.
Erasmus also opposed the variant form of Reformation that had emerged in the cities of Switzerland and southwestern Germany under the leadership of Huldrych Zwingli of Zürich, a former Erasmian humanist. Zwingli's eucharistic docrtrine, which came to be described as Sacramentarian, was especially offensive to Erasmus because as he interpreted it, it held that there was nothing at all in the communion except material bread and wine. It was also threatening to him, because some of the young leaders who supported the Sacramentarian position had been very close to him as assistants at Froben's press. Indeed, his own tendency to interpret religious ceremonies as essentially inward and spiritual rather than external and material was akin to their own beliefs about the eucharist, and those who had been especially close to him claimed that they had learned their eucharistic doctrines from him. He bitterly resented what he regarded as dishonest exploitation of past association in order to present him as the author of their new heresy. Yet he also had to concede that their views (which Luther denounced vehemently) were plausible. When the city council of Basel in 1525 asked for his advice whether a book that Johannes Oecolampadius, the leading local Protestant preacher and a former colleague at the Froben press, had published on the eucharist should be permitted to be sold, he replied that he found the book “learned, well written, and thorough. I would also judge it pious, if anything could be so described which is at variance with the general opinion of the church, from which I consider it perilous to dissent” (Ep 1636, CWE 11:343–344); he advised that it should not be sold at Basel. In 1526, a letter that he sent to a conference of the Swiss cantons called to organize opposition to the spread of Zwinglian doctrines again stated his objections to Sacramentarian doctrine. It also included a clear statement of the governing principle in his decision to remain loyal to the old church despite his disagreement with many of its practices and despite its many corruptions. This was the principle of consensus omnium, the universal agreement that had prevailed throughout the many centuries of Christian history on certain basic beliefs. This general consensus must outweigh the personal conclusions of any individual even if those conclusions seem reasonable and well grounded in Scripture (summary in introduction to Ep 1708, CWE 12:198, and Erasmus' own words on pp. 202–203; also Augustijn 1991:152–153, and McConica 1969:2:77–99).
This declaration of his willingness to submit to the judgment of the church was not enough to convince many conservative Catholic theologians and monks of his loyalty, just as his public break with Luther from 1524 failed to impress them or end their attacks. From at least the time of Dorp's warning about the dangers of his projected work in 1514, before the Lutheran heresy even existed, Erasmus had faced the unremitting hostility of a number of determined groups who accused him of heresy or at least of imprudent statements that unsettled the beliefs of the faithful. Although Dorp himself changed his opinion, most of his colleagues among the Louvain theologians remained either suspicious or actively hostile. After the emergence of Luther's doctrines, Erasmus' opinions were constantly misinterpreted as veiled support for the Lutheran heresy. Louvain became a source of many open attacks, the most vehement ones by the Carmelite theologian Nicholas Baechem, the most effective ones by Jacobus Latomus and, at the end of the 1520s, some younger Louvain theologians. Paris, the most authoritative center of traditional theology, became another center of attacks, led by the syndic of its faculty of theology, Noël Béda, who from 1524, acting on his own initiative, investigated the orthodoxy of Erasmus' Paraphrases on Luke and subsequently, other paraphrases. Béda combed through Erasmus' publications and made lists of passages that he judged to be heretical or at least likely to create scandal in the church. Erasmus soon learned what Béda was doing and decided to forestall conflict by corresponding directly with Béda and trying to defend his own orthodoxy. The correspondence was reasonably civil at first, though Béda soon made it clear that he did not recognize Erasmus as a qualified theologian. By 1526, the veneer of courtesy expressed in their earlier letters had worn very thin. Béda was not a distinguished theologian, but he was a consummate academic politician and had established a dominance over the Paris faculty that was seldom challenged with success. In 1526 he published his notes criticizing the statements he had found objectionable in Erasmus' publications. Erasmus vigorously protested against what he regarded as dishonest and slanderous attacks on his good name and even secured a royal order that Béda's book should be suppressed. Béda was relentless, pushing for his ultimate goal of securing a formal condemnation of the Erasmian passages he had extracted. Finally, after a lengthy series of hearings, in December of 1527 the faculty adopted a condemnation of some of Erasmus' most important works, such as his Paraphrases on the New Testament. Since the faculty knew that the king would be angered by this action, the anti-Erasmian leaders did not publish the condemnation and bided their time until 1531, when political conditions had changed. Béda was not the only Paris theologian to publish books against Erasmus.
In addition to attacks from Paris and Louvain and also from some German theologians, Erasmus learned that the mendicant orders in Spain had been attacking him because a number of his religious works, especially the Enchiridion, had been translated into Spanish and had become popular. In this case, however, the grand inquisitor and archbishop of Seville, Alonso de Manrique, had a favorable opinion of Erasmus. He summoned the superiors of the mendicant orders and commanded them to stop their members from attacking Erasmus in their sermons; instead, if they truly believed that Erasmus' works were harmful, he told them to meet in private and compile lists of any heresies and errors and then present these lists before a special inquisitorial commission that he would appoint. This commission met at Valladolid in the summer of 1527 and held twenty-one sessions at which various issues in Erasmus' works were debated. The mendicants were unable to secure a condemnation, though there was also no formal exoneration. Erasmus, who knew little about conditions in Spain, felt compelled to write and publish anApologia against these Spanish mendicants, acting against the advice of his supporters in Spain. In the short run, the outcome in 1527 seemed to be a victory for Erasmus, but by the early 1530s, the enthusiasm for Erasmus' religious ideas in Spain was waning. A more conservative brand of Catholicism gained the upper hand. By mid-century, it was dangerous even to own a book by Erasmus.
Erasmus also found antagonists in Italy. After he left Italy in 1509, he always retained some friendly connections in the peninsula; but his own memories of Italy, and especially of the curial society at Rome, were unfavorable. These memories crop up at times in revised editions of The Praise of Folly, the Adages, and other works. These unfavorable memories of Italy are central to a dialogue, Ciceronianus (1528), written in part out of resentment against the sniping by some Italian humanists at the quality of his own Latin prose. His critics, mostly humanists employed in the papal bureaucracy, charged that his Latin was inferior to the style of Cicero, the perfect model for good Latin. Erasmus, too, admired Cicero and had edited several of his works. But he had developed a highly personal style of Latin that in the opinion of his Italian critics was deficient because it freely used words and constructions found in later Latin authors but not in Cicero. The un-Ciceronian vocabulary included plentiful use of words from ecclesiastical Latin and the Church Fathers to express ideas not found in pre-Christian literature. In his Ciceronianus Erasmus criticized and derided the rigid verbal purism of the Ciceronians. The characters in the dialogue regarded such strict purism as nonsense: the world has changed since the time of Cicero, and language has to change with it.
Unwisely, Erasmus then turned to an evaluation of contemporary writers in order to prove that it is possible to write good Latin without being hobbled by an effort to ape Cicero's style. The problem was that any contemporary author who was not mentioned and praised felt left out. Even some who were included felt that the recognition given in Ciceronianus was inadequate. Erasmus did not intend to make invidious comparisons, but that was how many of his peers perceived what he wrote. For example, one of his characters ranks Guillaume Budé as inferior to Josse Bade as a writer of Latin. Since Budé was the glory of contemporary French humanism and Bade was essentially a publisher, with no great intellectual or stylistic pretensions, this passage was taken to be a deliberate insult to him and even to French scholarship in general. Budé himself declared the matter unimportant, and Erasmus wrote an apologetic letter. Budé was in fact deeply offended; he never answered Erasmus' apologetic letter or any other letter that Erasmus sent him (Betty I. Knott, “Introductory Note,” in CWE 27:331). Erasmus had omitted several others who thought that they should have been mentioned. He had not realized when he decided to discuss the writings of some contemporary humanists that his book would be regarded as a sort of Who's Who of contemporary authors.
Erasmus had not expected such complaints, for Ciceronianus was aimed chiefly at the secretaries at the Roman curia. Here he did intend to give offense, for in addition to ridiculing their narrow conception of Latin style, he made it clear that he regarded their enthusiastic embrace of ancient Rome as reflecting acceptance of the moral and even religious values of pagan Rome, not just its forms of language. He criticized the curial Ciceronians for avoiding specifically Christian terms and for the habit of using circumlocutions or openly pagan terms to discuss religious matters without committing the sin of using words not found in Cicero. Most of them, he regarded as Christians in name only, happy to take ecclesiastical incomes but lacking any genuine faith.
Erasmus also became involved in an ugly controversy with an influential Italian author who accused Erasmus of being the original source of Luther's heresies. What made this challenge particularly worrisome was that this critic was a man of high social rank, fully conversant in classical and modern humanistic culture, and politically connected to the highest ecclesiastical and political authorities in Italy. He was Alberto Pio, prince of Carpi, the son of a ruler of a small Italian principality and of a sister of the philosopher Giovanni Pico della Mirandola. After his father's premature death, his uncle Giovanni Pico supervised the boy's education and engaged the humanist Aldus Manutius (the future Venetian publisher) as his tutor. Dethroned and exiled by a conspiracy within his own family, Pio studied at the University of Ferrara under the most famous Aristotelian philosopher in Italy, Pietro Pomponazzi. During a varied political career, he had been employed as a diplomat, including time as the imperial ambassador at Rome. At the curia, he was close to the Roman Academy, which had a reputation for neopaganism. Yet Pio himself was noted for his Christian piety. Because of his pro-French political connections, when the Emperor Charles V took military control of Italy, Pio lost his claim to the principality of Carpi; and when the imperial army conquered and plundered Rome in 1527, he fled to France. This was a dangerous antagonist. Erasmus learned from friends at Rome about 1525 that Pio was denouncing him at the curia. As he did with the unfriendly Paris theologian Noël Béda about the same time, Erasmus sought to head off conflict by writing directly to his accuser. He declared that charges that he and other northern humanists were the source of Luther's heresies were a mere smokescreen for the desire of obscurantist theologians and monks to destroy the growth of humanist studies and prevent a genuine reform of the church. He added that people living comfortably at Rome had no idea of the chaotic conditions in Germany and no right to criticize loyal Christians who struggled to uphold the Catholic faith in a country that was in turmoil.
In reply, Pio wrote a treatise in the form of a letter that amounted to an accusation that Erasmus' ideas were virtually identical to Luther's heresies and were in fact the source of those heresies, and that if Erasmus wanted to be accepted as a genuine Catholic, he must admit his own guilt and publicly recant the errors in his books. Pio wrote this attack in 1526 but did not publish it until 1529, after he had gone into exile at the French court. But it circulated earlier in the tight-knit circle of intellectuals at the curia. By September 1526 Erasmus had received a manuscript copy directly from the author. At almost the same time, Erasmus learned that he was also the target of another attack at the curia, an anonymous work called Racha that made accusations similar to Pio's and that he thought (probably correctly) was the work of his former friend Girolamo Aleandro. This work also circulated at the curia; it has never been published. Erasmus dared to respond to Pio's manuscript but did not dare to challenge Aleandro, who had become too powerful to be confronted. Erasmus began his defense with a letter directly to Pope Clement VII that reasserted his loyalty to the Roman church and protested against scurrilous attacks against him that circulated within the curia (Ep 1987, Basel, 3 April 1528, in Allen 7:378–379). He finally learned that Pio had settled in Paris after he fled from Rome and wrote him there, urging him to delay publication of his attack until he could consider Erasmus' defense (Ep 2080, Basel, 23 December 1528, in Allen 7:544–545). His letter arrived too late; Pio's Responsio was published at Paris in early January 1529. In March, Erasmus then published his own Responsio, which denied that he had ever encouraged Luther. By June 1530, he learned that Pio was preparing a second attack. Shortly after Pio's death in 1531, the Paris publisher Josse Bade brought out this book, an attempt to prove Pio's original charges by reproducing parallel passages from Luther and Erasmus. Erasmus promptly published an Apologia that accused Pio of publishing lies and false citations
Even earlier, Erasmus had faced attacks by two Spanish scholars. First was a series of attacks published by a Spanish philologist and theologian, Jacobus Stunica (Diego López Zúñiga) on the first edition of Erasmus' New Testament (1516). Having never heard of Stunica, Erasmus initially dismissed his opinions as unworthy of attention. But Stunica was a learned scholar, competent not only in Latin and Greek but also in Hebrew, Aramaic, and Arabic; he was one of the team of scholars that Cardinal Ximénes brought together to produce the great polyglot Bible published at Alcalá. Stunica had written hostile notes not long after Erasmus' New Testament came out in 1516, but when Erasmus heard of his plan and complained to the cardinal, Ximénes warned Stunica not to publish his criticisms. After the death of the cardinal in 1517, Stunica felt free to return to the topic and in 1520 brought out his Annotationes, directed against Erasmus' biblical scholarship. He then moved to Rome, where he taught Greek in the pontifical university. Erasmus published an Apologia (1520) against these criticisms. So far, the opposing publications were respectful. But Stunica was stubborn, and in 1522 he published at Rome a vehement attack on Erasmus, Erasmi Roterodami blasphemiae et impietates, which charged that the whole Erasmian program of humanistic reform was heretical. Another exchange of hostile pamphlets followed until the new pope, Adrian VI, imposed silence on Stunica. After Adrian's early death, however, Stunica rushed three additional attacks into print in 1523 and 1524. The next pope, Clement VII, again imposed silence on him, acting at the request of Erasmus. Erasmus published one additional Apologia in 1524 and much later (1529) issued a final defense in a letter to a Dutch friend. The second Spanish critic proved less troublesome. Sancho Carranza de Miranda, a theologian who had relocated to Rome in 1522, published a volume of criticisms of Erasmus; but this book was less hostile than Stunica's and politely urged Erasmus to explain certain points more clearly in order to silence critics. Erasmus published a fairly courteous reply the same year (1522), and eventually the two men became rather friendly.
Erasmus lived through many similar quarrels and devoted an enormous amount of time and energy to reading these attacks and preparing and publishing apologetic works in his own defense, in many cases leading to a long series of back-and-forth polemical books. With a few of his critics, he managed to maintain a spirit of courtesy, but with most of them the debate soon degenerated into bitter attacks. Three of his opponents, Lee, Stunica, and Béda, were the most troublesome because they clung to him so persistently that he could not bring the quarrel to a conclusion. Erasmus always felt obligated to defend his good name and produce a refutation when he faced an attack, though in some cases he did try to head off open controversy through a direct approach to the critic.
Especially after his break with Luther in 1524, his quarrels with fellow-Catholics were more troublesome to him than his controversies with Protestants. Though he still had some positive things to say about many individuals who supported the Reformation, he was now publicly identified as their opponent and was not deeply troubled by their attacks (with the exception of Luther's scurrilous accusation that he was a non-believing hypocrite, an atheist). But the attacks by Catholics were more difficult to cope with. He had publicly and strongly asserted his identity as a loyal Catholic willing to accept the doctrines and practices of the church and to recognize the authority of the ecclesiastical hierarchy, though he was not willing to refrain from criticizing practices and conditions that he found to be unwholesome and harmful to genuine piety. He had no intention of letting ultra-conservative monks and theologians drive him out of the church to which he had declared his loyalty. What particularly enraged him was that many of these Catholic critics were quite unimpressed by his open rejection of Luther's major doctrines. In their correspondence, Béda made it clear that Erasmus' defense of free will and his rejection of Luther's extreme position on man's dependence on grace made no difference to him; what he expected from Erasmus was a complete cessation of his frank and public criticism of abuses in the traditional church, a total repudiation of his long-standing dream of a purified, spiritually reawakened church that would be reformed gradually and peacefully from within the old structures. In a sense, Béda and some other conservative critics regarded the nuts and bolts of traditional religious observance, the popular emphasis on external acts like pilgrimages, prayer to the saints, use of images, and other external actions and observances as more crucial to their conception of the Catholic faith than the big theological issues on which Erasmus had attacked Luther, Zwingli, and the other leaders of the Reformation. Yet for Erasmus himself, these traditional acts of external observance, while not necessarily practices to be rejected completely, were secondary matters and in many cases had been abused by grasping, corrupt clergymen as devices to exploit the simple, trusting faith of gullible believers.
The scholar who has most carefully analyzed these controversies that involved Catholic rather than Protestant antagonists has concluded that though Erasmus was well trained to undertake the task of emending scriptural texts, his temperament made him unsuited for public controversy. “He was proud of his achievements and sensitive to criticism. He had moreover a sharp tongue and ready wit and did not suffer fools gladly.” Though he was repeatedly involved in conflicts, his performance as a controversialist was poor. “Although Erasmus often adopts a superior tone, he is superior to his opponents only in learning; in pettifogging, peevishness, and intellectual pride he is their match” (Rummel 1989:1: 189–190).
Erasmus retained the loyalty of many moderate and pious humanists on both the Protestant and the Catholic side of the religious divide. Those humanists who shared his determination to remain loyal to the traditional church despite its shortcomings continued to respect him and seek his advice. In particular, they shared his hope that eventually the divisions in Christendom could be patched up. As a provisional solution for Germany, Erasmus was willing to grant de facto toleration to those Protestants who accepted the major and ancient beliefs of the church (which he tended to identify with the brief text of the Apostles' Creed) and to ignore the lesser issues on which agreement was impossible: better a stalemate with some toleration for dissidents than a civil war. When the imperial diet at Augsburg proclaimed for 1530 drew near, he corresponded with the papal legate to the Diet, Cardinal Lorenzo Campeggio, and frankly suggested that this might be the only possible outcome.
In 1529, Erasmus lost his place of refuge in Basel. The city where he had found the most physically and intellectually comfortable home he ever had, like most German cities, was strongly attracted to Luther and even more attracted to the more radical Zwinglian or Sacramentarian version of the Reformation. Gradually, through the preaching of Johannes Oecolampadius, a former collaborator of Erasmus at the Froben press and a learned humanist, the citizens who supported the Reformation grew in numbers and political influence. The city council still wanted to prevent a total Protestant victory, but gradually it made numerous concessions so that by the late 1520s, five of the six parish churches were controlled by priests who supported the Reformation. The council decreed that all citizens should have freedom of conscience and no one should be compelled to attend either the Catholic mass or the new Reformed services. This policy suited Erasmus, but it did not suit the spirit of the age. Oecolampadius lamented that even after several years when the Gospel was openly preached in Basel, a large part of the population still accepted the mass and supported the idolatrous observances associated with the cult of the saints. He and his followers wanted the city to become exclusively Protestant. Under intense public pressure, in January 1529 the council decreed that a maximum of three masses per day might be celebrated in the city and that a formal disputation between Protestant and Catholic theologians should be held in May to resolve the religious disagreements. The stalemate did not last even that long. Oecolampadius had pressed for changes but wanted to avoid violence and was willing to wait until the disputation planned for May. His followers, however, were not. The city's guilds had become strong supporters of religious change. To the horror of Erasmus and many of his friends, an insurrection led by the guilds took the decision out of the council's hands. In December, the guilds had petitioned the council to approve legal establishment of the new Reformed church as the religion of the city. The council had delayed a response. On 8 February, the guilds gave the city council an ultimatum. The following day, while the council debated inconclusively, a mob of several thousand people who had been waiting for a decision entered the cathedral and several parish churches and began smashing the “idols” (the images of the saints). At that point, the twelve Catholic members of the council resigned, and that evening the remaining councillors approved the guilds' demands. For two days and two nights, the destruction of religious images continued. The mass was abolished, and all citizens were required to receive the Lord's Supper under the new Protestant forms. Most of the substantial group of citizens who would have preferred to keep the old religious observances conformed reluctantly. Erasmus' closest friend, Bonifacius Amerbach, would not consider leaving his city but stubbornly refused to attend the new communion services. All of the canons of the cathedral chapter, including Erasmus' theologian friend Ludwig Baer, moved to the near-by city of Freiburg, which was controlled by Archduke Ferdinand of Habsburg and hence remained safely Catholic.
Erasmus viewed these events with dismay, both because of the suppression of the old religion and because of the violence of the mob. Life in Basel during this turmoil had become insupportable for him, even though the magistrates assured him he would not be compelled to conform. He could justify remaining in a city where both religions were able to practice their faith, but not in a city that was legally Protestant and had outlawed his own religion. He considered going back to the Netherlands or even moving to Rome, but he knew that living in either of these places would destroy the freedom to express his opinions candidly that had attracted him to Basel in 1521. But he was an old and sickly man who shrank from undertaking a long and exhausting journey to either of these places. Although he considered other places in Germany, he really had his eye on the near-by university town of Freiburg-im-Breisgau, just sixty kilometers away. Because it was under Habsburg control, Freiburg would not turn Protestant. Because its overlord, Archduke Ferdinand, was favorable to him, he would be sheltered from the Catholic extremists. Freiburg was also a university town, where Erasmus knew that he had admirers among the faculty and the students. Erasmus arranged a private conference with Oecolampadius, whom he still respected as a scholar despite their growing alienation on religious issues. Oecolampadius declared his continuing friendship for Erasmus and urged him to remain in Basel, but to no avail. Erasmus wanted to depart privately at a remote location for the trip down the Rhine, but the city council insisted on his using the traditional landing at the Rhine bridge. They wanted to demonstrate publicly that he was leaving by his own choice and still had their good will. When he arrived at the point of embarkation on 13 April 1529, hoping to depart quietly, a large crowd of citizens and civic officials was waiting to see him off.
When he reached Freiburg, Erasmus received a warm welcome. The city council provided use of a large house. Since he still thought it likely that he would eventually move elsewhere, Freiburg was an excellent location, with easy access to the Habsburg-ruled Franche-Comté and France to the west and easy travel down the Rhine to the Netherlands. In 1531 he bought a house. Since he had the favor of Archduke Ferdinand, he was treated with respect and was able to continue writing and publishing as he wished. Yet there were disadvantages to Freiburg. Although there was a local group of humanists, the city was smaller than Basel and much less intellectual. Freiburg had no local publishers comparable to Froben. He continued to publish his new and revised works with the heirs of Froben at Basel.
Erasmus lived at Freiburg for six years, from 1529 to 1535, and continued his studies and writing. His love for peace and his continuing if forlorn hope for reunification of the church produced Liber de sarcienda ecclesiae condordia (On Restoring Unity in the Church), published at Basel in 1533. The main point of this little book is a plea for mutual tolerance on practices of secondary importance and the prohibition of books likely to foment violence. Most Protestant leaders denounced the book, which essentially endorsed a somewhat relaxed but still basically unchanged Catholic religion. Its greatest appeal seems to have been to the moderate Catholics who, like the author, still believed that good-faith negotiation between men of good will could restore religious unity. These moderate Catholics, many of them still inspired by Erasmus, remained influential at Rome and in many parts of the Catholic world for a decade after Erasmus' death in 1536, but in the 1540s they gradually lost influence and were eventually overwhelmed (or at least silenced) by conservative Catholics who thought it better to restore traditional Catholicism without compromise and to suppress heresy wherever they were strong enough to do so. De sarcienda was rejected by the conservatives, dismissed as just another example of Erasmus' religious unreliability. His late works included a Christian catechism based on the simplest and most ancient of the traditional statements of faith, the Apostles' Creed. He also wrote a treatise on preparation for death, Praeparatio ad mortem (1534), where he maintained that the truly important preparation was not a set of last-minute ceremonies around the deathbed but (as he had asserted long before in his Enchiridion and in some of his Colloquies) a process that goes on continuously throughout each person's life. At Freiburg he also completed the longest of all his works, Ecclesiastes, a manual on preaching that he had promised friends he would write but had never managed to finish. He had long charged that the old church had neglected preaching as well as its other pastoral responsibilities, and this book was a response to the need to make preaching one of the principal duties of priests. Erasmus also continued to edit classical and patristic texts at Freiburg. He published editions of Ptolemy's De geographia (1530), the complete works of Aristotle (1531), and Suetonius' Lives of the Twelve Emperors (1533); also patristic texts including new editions of the works of St. John Chrysostom (1530) and St. Basil of Caesarea (1532), and a first edition of the works of Origen (1536). In 1535, his last edition of the New Testament came off the Froben press. Erasmus' health became increasingly feeble, but he kept working almost to his final day.
Erasmus had never found Freiburg a very congenial place to live. Although the leading local intellectual, Ulrich Zasius, was a warm admirer, once they lived in the same town they did not become particularly close. The patronage of Archduke Ferdinand made him secure at Freiburg, but he knew that some local clergy and laymen were not favorable to him. He had never made a firm decision to stay there forever and still occasionally wrote of other places as possible future destinations. He had continued to use the Froben press as his publisher while he lived in Freiburg, but in 1535, as he prepared to bring out his longest book, Ecclesiastes, he decided that he should be physically present at the press as the final work went on. Sometime in the summer of 1535, his closest friend at Basel, Bonifacius Amerbach, travelled to Freiburg and brought his old friend back home. The move was easier to accept because although the city was now legally Protestant, the violent agitation of 1529 was long past. In 1534, the city's religious leaders had been willing to make a private theological compromise with Amerbach that convinced him that he could receive the legally required Protestant communion with good conscience. The religious situation at Basel seemed more acceptable if Amerbach was comfortable with it. He resided in the home of his publisher, Hieronymus Froben. Being in feeble health, he rarely went out. Despite poor health, he continued to work on Ecclesiastes, the revised edition of the New Testament, his edition of Origen, and several shorter publications.
In several of his later publications, including De sarcienda, his 1532 revisions of his Paraphrase on Romans, and one of his very last short tracts, De puritate tabernaculi, he seems to have moderated, but not wholly abandoned, the optimistic strain that typified his earlier work, including his earlier confidence in the power of education to make people morally better. De puritate expressed a somewhat pessimistic view of human nature and emphasized faith in God's grace (which had always had an important place in his religious thought) even more than in the past, and human powers aside from grace considerably less. He seems to have regarded human sinfulness as more powerful than he had in earlier works. Consciously or not, he now leaned a bit more in Luther's direction than he had during their quarrel in the mid-1520s. Although his opposition to the Reformation became more open and harsh in works written after his conflict with Luther, and his insistence that the unity of the church must be maintained at all costs became stronger as the actual unity of the church collapsed, he never believed that Luther was truly a heretic in the same sense as the heretics condemned by the early church. In person, he remained stubbornly Catholic, but in his own way. He published the prayers, many of them expressing devotion to the saints, that he had written over many years, and remained convinced that the humanistic, tolerant, and moralistic Catholic reform program that he had enunciated before anyone had heard of Martin Luther not only was fully orthodox but also represented the only hope of bringing all Christians back together without the violence of the religious wars that he feared.
By June of 1536 it was clear that Erasmus was failing rapidly. Being a Catholic living in a legally Protestant city, he did not have a priest available to administer last rites, and there is no evidence that he desired such ministrations, which he had always respected if done in the right spirit but never considered very important. He died during the night of 11–12 July. A whole host of ailments contributed to his end, but dysentery was the immediate cause. In his last moments, he commended his soul (in Latin, of course) to Mary and to Jesus, but his very last words, according to a close friend who was present, was in the language of his childhood, Dutch: “Lieve God!” Dear God! His will of 1536 did not mandate use of his property (rather considerable in his final years) to fund a full edition of all his works, as his first will of 1527 had done; but Bonifacius Amerbach, whom both wills appointed administrator of his estate, arranged for the Froben firm to publish his collected writings, Opera omnia, which appeared in a set of nine volumes in 1540. After bequests made to personal servants and close friends, his will left part of the balance to provide dowries for the marriage of poor girls, and all the rest for the support of students at the University of Basel.
Erasmus was no philosopher and never wrote any work that was intended to be a philosophical treatise. In general, he was suspicious or even hostile toward philosophers, though his general admiration for classical civilization led him to include philosophers among the other ancient authors—poets, historians, dramatists—whose works he read carefully and cited in his own writings. He was well acquainted with the major ancient philosophers, as well as with Christian Church Fathers who often cited pre-Christian philosophical works. To a degree often overlooked by modern students of his thought, he also knew and cited, usually (but not always) in a negative sense, the major authors and schools of medieval scholastic philosophy and theology. Yet even his works on topics of philosophical significance generally avoided the dialectical arguments of Aristotelian and scholastic philosophers and proceeded by citation of biblical passages instead. His major treatises on pacifism, Dulce bellum inexpertis and Querela pacis, present the case for pacifism and against war through citations and analyses of biblical passages, not through rationalistic proofs, though they do regard war as irrational as well as un-Christian. The works produced in his quarrel with Martin Luther over grace and free will, except for his explicit adoption of Academic skepticism as a guiding principle, hinged entirely on his and Luther's divergent interpretations of the biblical passages they judged relevant to the disputed topics.
The Erasmus scholarship of the nineteenth and earlier twentieth centuries sometimes regarded Erasmus as under strong Platonic and even Neoplatonic influence, but evidence of a major interest in Plato as a philosophical guide, as distinct from fairly frequent use of Plato as a literary reference (such as use of the allegory of the cave from the Republic), is slender. In his earliest major publication, Enchiridion militis christiani, he emphasizes the importance of constant study of the Bible, though he concedes (as most Renaissance humanists would) that “a kind of preliminary training in the writings of the pagan poets and philosophers” is permissible, even helpful, “provided that one engages in these studies with moderation.” He continues, “Of the philosophers I should recommend the Platonists because in much of their thinking as well as in their mode of expression they are the closest to the spirit of the prophets and of the gospel” (CWE 66:33). In criticizing modern scholastic theologians, he complained that they studied only Aristotle and not Plato or the Pythagoreans, although St. Augustine preferred the two latter traditions “both because many of their ideas are perfectly consistent with our religion” and because they use “a figurative mode of expression” and frequently employ allegory, practices that are “very close to the language of Sacred Scripture” (CWE 66:69). The modern editor of the Enchiridion suggests that “the Platonists” are probably the Neoplatonists such as Plotinus and Proclus since these had much influence on the Greek Fathers as well as on Ambrose and Augustine (Charles Fantazzi, in CWE 66:278 n39). On the other hand, if the thousands of Erasmus' surviving letters are a valid indication of his interests, he referred to Proclus (a second-hand reference to the Sphaera that was taken from his friend Thomas Linacre) only once (Ep 2422, Allen 9:107, 108) and received one letter from an Italian acquaintance who sought his help in locating a better Latin translation of Proclus than the thirteenth-century version currently available (Ep 1552, CWE 11:47 and n5). His correspondence contains no reference to Plotinus. He certainly must have used the fine Latin translation of Plato's works by the leader of the fifteenth-century Florentine Platonists, Marsilio Ficino, when he read and cited Plato, but his correspondence mentions Ficino only once, merely as one name in a list of recent Hellenists who had translated Greek philosophers into Latin (Ep 862, CWE 6:10). Erasmus' letters never mention any of the original philosophical works written by Ficino. His correspondence mentions the other leading philosopher conventionally included among Florentine Neoplatonists, Giovanni Pico della Mirandola, more frequently but not often, and in almost all of these cases, the name appears merely in a list of Hellenists active during the fifteenth century.
Erasmus does cite Plato himself fairly often, but in most cases not as a philosophical authority to be followed (or rejected) but simply as an ancient author cited to illustrate a point, just as he would cite literary figures like Vergil, Pliny, Cicero, or Euripides. Although he does cite with approval Plato's ideal of the philosopher-king in the Institutio principis christiani, the educational treatise he wrote in 1515 for the future Emperor Charles V (CWE 27:203, 213–214), he also noted in a far more widely read work, The Praise of Folly, that states that have fallen into the hands of “some dabbler in philosophy or literary addict” (CWE 27:100) have been plagued by these rulers; this is in a section where Folly seems to be voicing Erasmus' own views and dismisses the philosophers as useless for practical affairs (CWE 27:99–100). Socrates was the ancient philosopher he most admired, probably because the Socratic method of investigating a problem through posing questions was akin to the Academic skepticism that Erasmus used as a guide in his debate with Martin Luther over free will. In his colloquy “The Godly Feast” (1522), while discussing virtuous pagans who seem to surpass most Christians in piety and moral righteousness, one of the characters exclaims that such holiness in a man who did not know Christ makes him hardly able to refrain from praying, “Saint Socrates, pray for us” (CWE 39:194).
The common impression that Erasmus' thought was shaped by Platonic influence rests largely on his first major publication, the Enchiridion. One of the most perceptive modern students of Erasmus' thought (John W. O'Malley, in CWE 66:xliii) observes that the Platonic references most probably reflect his enthusiasm not for Plato himself but for the allegorical interpretation of Scripture presented by the patristic author Origen, who was indeed influenced by Plato and had studied with the first major figure of Alexandrian Neoplatonism, Ammonius Saccas. Although he continued to admire Origen and even edited his works late in life, Erasmus became increasingly “evangelical” and correspondingly less open to Platonic influence as he first plunged deeply into study of the New Testament and then struggled to confront the theology of Martin Luther. He “began to put more emphasis on the utter gratuity of grace and began to see fides [faith] less as intellectual assent and more as trust in God” (O'Malley, CWE 66:xliii; also xxvii). He continued to draw illustrations and examples from Plato and Aristotle (the latter usually on matters of natural philosophy), for example in De immensa Dei misericordia (On the Immense Mercy of God), a work published in the same month (September, 1524) as his first book against Luther, De libero arbitrio). But such references consistently ranked Christian authorities over philosophical ones. He cited Socrates' statement (reported in Cicero's Tusculan Disputations, which he had recently edited) that he probably would have led a profligate life devoted to sensual pleasure if philosophy had not taught him moderation, but then immediately turned to a story about St. Francis, told in the medieval Legenda aurea, where the saint, while being scurrilously denounced for committing heinous crimes and sins, retained his composure and “more correctly” than Socrates ascribed his avoidance of those sins not to philosophy but to God's mercy (CWE 70:93). An even more telling example of Erasmus' desire to link any praise of Socrates with a Christian theme is Erasmus' adage Sileni Alcibiadis (“The Sileni of Alcibiades”), first published in the expanded Adagia of 1515. A Silenus was an ancient Greek statuette of the satyr Silenus, the ugly jester of the gods, cast in two halves so that when opened it displayed the image of a god or some other beautiful thing. Erasmus' essay explains this meaning and cites a passage from Xenophon where a youth makes fun of the ugly old Socrates as “far more hideous than the Sileni”; he then cites a speech in praise of Socrates in the Symposium of Plato that compares Socrates (and three other philosophers, Antisthenes, Diogenes, and Epictetus) to a Silenus, unprepossessing in outward appearance but inwardly beautiful and morally admirable. Yet, Erasmus continues, “What of Christ? Was not he too a marvelous Silenus,” obscure in social rank and power, doomed to a life of hardship and a disgraceful and painful death? Similar Sileni would be John the Baptist and the Apostles. “Aristotle himself would seem a foolish and ignorant dilettante, when compared with these men.” Aristotle was indeed a most learned man, but “what light can shine so bright that when compared with Christ it is not darkened (Adagia III.iii.1, in CWE 34:262–265)?”
Erasmus' message was clear. The philosophers and sages of pre-Christian antiquity may indeed be good and worthy of study, but they are far inferior to Christ or any saintly Christian. In an influential work on educational theory, De pueris instituendis (On Education for Children), probably written in 1509 but not published until 1529, Erasmus presented “a Christian humanist reformulation of the classical ideal of a liberal education” (Beert V. Verstraete, in CWE 26:393), strongly influenced by Plutarch's On the Education of Children and Quintilian's Institutio oratoria. Obviously, the ideal of classical education still appealed to him at the time of publication, late in his life when he had become more “evangelical,” more inclined to emphasize the unique value of Christian faith and more reserved about the value of secular learning. Yet he was more reserved about ancient sources than in his youth. In one of his last works, Explanatio symboli apostolorum sive catechismus (An Explanation of the Apostles' Creed, or Catechism) (1533), he seems much less convinced of the adequacy of ancient moral philosophy. He declares that the Stoic philosophy founded by Zeno “promises peace of mind, but only in this life, and a false peace at that. For nothing gives true peace to our souls except the grace of Christ…” (CWE 70:246), and he sharply criticizes Plato (Phaedrus 246–9) and his followers for their “outlandish blasphemies” involving belief in the transmigration of souls, exactly the sort of speculative Platonic text that he had avoided whenever he cited Plato in a positive sense. In his De immensa Dei misericordia (1524) he had already attacked contemporary philosophers for neglecting the teaching of Christ in the Gospel and preferring to heed “your Platos and Aristotles” (CWE 70:123), a remark that may have been intended as a blow against modern humanist Neoplatonists as well as against the scholastic thinkers for whom Aristotle long had been “the Philosopher.”
Erasmus' own “philosophy of Christ,” a phrase that he seems to have used for the first time in the Paraclesis, the introductory essay for the first edition of his New Testament in 1516 (Adams 1962:119) and then repeated in other works, including his prefatory letter to Paul Volz in the edition (1518) of the Enchiridion that marks the emergence of that book as a best-seller, was really not a philosophy at all, but a phrase expressing his effort to transform contemporary Christianity into an inner spiritual appropriation of the Gospel, based on familiarity with the Bible and expressed in personal piety and moral conduct rather than in currently fashionable ceremonies and a rigid adherence to the words (but not the inner spirit) of the religion preached by Christ and the Apostles. Philosophy in the usual sense, according to The Praise of Folly, involves arrogant claims to full understanding of the works of nature, useless speculation, constructing theoretical pictures of the universe that are mere wild conjectures, and sometimes even claims to foretell the future from the stars. Philosophers cannot provide the guidance that humanity needs, for “their total lack of certainty is obvious enough from the endless contention amongst themselves on every single point” (CWE 27:126).
With one significant exception, Erasmus' ideas on politics were conventional for his times and unremarkable. Despite his relatively brief contact with the court of the Habsburg Netherlands, he had little direct experience of politics. Both by choice and by the circumstances of his life, he was apolitical. Like nearly all of his contemporaries, he accepted monarchy as the best and most natural form of government. He did think that a king ought to be expected to consult with the magnates and people of his country, though he expressed no opinion on just how this vague idea should be carried out in real life. He frankly declared, even in his educational treatise Instututio principis christiani, addressed in 1515 to the future Emperor Charles V, that hereditary succession seemed a risky way to choose a ruler and that election by the leaders of the community would be a more reasonable way to ensure having a competent ruler (CWE 27:206). Yet he realized that hereditary succession was the almost universal practice of his time, and he accepted it without complaint as perfectly normal. Like most educated contemporaries, he assumed that the masses of people, those without property or some established trade, were not qualified to share political power and that “the mob,” easily misled by false prophets, was potentially a danger to social order and internal peace.
Since he had no concept of how his preference for political consultation might be put onto an institutional basis, the only suggestion he could make for safeguarding the people from a corrupt and tyrannical ruler was that the heir to the throne should receive a good education, concentrated especially on moral philosophy and including indoctrination in the principles of a genuine Christian faith. A future ruler's education should aim to make him eager to use power for the welfare of the people rather than for personal self-aggrandizement. Erasmus knew enough about court life to be aware that any ruler or royal heir would be constantly surrounded by men and women who would curry favor by encouraging the ruler to put the general interest of society out of mind and to pursue policies and pleasures that would permit them to influence royal policy in ways suited to their own social and economic advancement. His short Institutio was an effort to indoctrinate young Prince Charles as well as to show appreciation for his own recent appointment as an honorary councillor. It is revealing of Erasmus' limited conception of politics that his treatise concentrated solely on the moral indoctrination of the future ruler through education and not at all on the institutions and actual policies of the state, wholly unlike the almost exactly contemporary political masterpiece, Utopia, by his close friend Thomas More. As was the case with Utopia, the political thought of Plato (especially in the Republic) was the most frequently cited classical source, though Aristotle's Politics, the Cyropedia of Xenophon, and the Moralia of Plutarch also had significant influence. All of these classical authors, together with the Roman moralists Cicero and Seneca and the Roman historians Livy and Sallust, are included on the reading list that Erasmus prescribes for a royal pupil. This emphasis on the ability of moral philosophy to plant “the seeds of morality” (CWE 27:206) in the soul of a prince, or any pupil, is typical of the educational writings of Renaissance humanists. Indeed, moral philosophy was the only philosophical field included among those academic subjects that humanistic educational writers defined as the essential parts of a good education, the “humanities,” or studia humanitatis (Kristeller 1961:10). Historical authors (almost always Roman) were added to the reading list in order to provide examples of morally good and morally bad actions and their consequences. Although Erasmus loathed the traditional chivalric culture of medieval courts and aristocrats, and feared that every prince was likely to be corrupted by ambitious courtiers, he was no democrat. A prince's tutor must instill an education that will act as “an antidote, against the poison of what the common people think” (CWE 27:210). He compares the masses of people to the prisoners confined in Plato's cave (CWE 27:212). In the Institutio, Erasmus praises Plato's ideal of the philosopher-king (CWE 27:214), but in The Praise of Folly, he (or his character Folly) observes that societies that have philosophers as their ruler rarely fare well (CWE 27:100).
Although this discussion of monarchical government makes Erasmus' political thought seem conventional for the early sixteenth century, he was unconventional in one respect: his pacifism or near-pacifism, an opinion that war is the besetting vice of monarchical government, largely because ambitious courtiers seeking their own advantage promote aggressive policies through which the ruler will win glory and increase his power, territory, and wealth. Erasmus hoped that proper indoctrination of future rulers in moral philosophy and the principles of Christian life would safeguard them from such foolish and destructive policies and would convince them that the true path to glory is not military victory and territorial expansion but rather is to encourage justice and promote the happiness and prosperity of the people whom a prince already rules. He warns the prince not to undertake the risks and waste of blood and treasure involved in warfare, and to avoid dynastic marriages that will create future territorial claims and so breed future wars. Inevitably, any prince will be tempted and constantly urged by flatterers intent on their own advantage to seek military glory and territorial gain by wars of conquest. He warns any prince that wars breed future wars, and that any ruler contemplating war must apply reason to calculate the true cost of the war, including not merely the expenditure on military preparations but also the anxieties, uncertainties, and dangers involved. A special cost of war is the need to hire and pamper mercenary soldiers, a class whom Erasmus despised and described as “a barbarian rabble, made up of all the worst scoundrels.” (CWE 27:282). He noted that Plato called it sedition, not war, when Greek fought against Greek, and suggested that the same objection holds when Christian fights Christian. He contended that the traditional concept of the just war, though approved by St. Augustine and most later theologians, is specious, for any ruler who wants to start a war will find a way to convince himself that his cause is just. The first and most undeserving victims of such a ruler's decision will be his own people: “a prince cannot revenge himself on his enemy without first opening hostilities against his own subjects” (CWE 27:285), who will be taxed by their own government, plundered and abused by their own troops as well as by the enemy, and forced to bear the loss of husbands and sons as well as widowhood, mourning, and impoverishment. He warns against the malign influence of national stereotypes by which other nationalities are slandered, whereas in reality the foolish national labels that divide Christians are less important than the name of Christ that should unite all who claim his name. Even against the Turks, war should not be rashly undertaken. He laments that although wise priests should turn people away from hatred and war, in his own time priests and bishops often incite hostility. This warning against the dangers, follies, and un-Christian nature of war is the concluding point in the Institutio, which was written at the urging of the political leader who had arranged Erasmus' appointment as a councillor and who was a leader of the “national” faction in court politics, those who urged a policy of peaceful accommodation with France, looking out for native Netherlandish interests, in opposition to other court figures who promoted the aggressive anti-French policy encouraged by both of Charles's grandfathers, the Emperor Maximilian and King Ferdinand of Spain (Tracy 1978:54, 56).
The Institutio was in full accord with Erasmus' personal convictions about war. If not totally a pacifist (he conceded that in some circumstances a defensive war to resist Ottoman expansion in the Balkans might be unavoidable, though he rejected the idea of a crusade), he was generally opposed to war under almost any circumstances, especially to war between people who called themselves Christians and then ignored Christ's call to peace and brotherhood. His hatred of war and scorn for the mercenary riffraff who composed the armies of his time appears frequently in his vast correspondence and was already a major theme in one of his earliest publications, the Panegyricus, an oration pronounced in honor of Prince Philip of Habsburg in January 1504. The Panegyricus does not adopt a radically pacifist viewpoint, but it presents war as always an evil to be avoided and never to be undertaken in pursuit of false glory or conquest of new territories (CWE 27:50–61).
This early expression of hostility to war sounds a theme that recurs often in Erasmus' writings, sometimes only in passing but also in two works that came to be inspirations for later Western critics of war. One of his most ambitious works, revised and expanded throughout his career, was his collection of wise sayings culled from his mastery of ancient literature, the Adagia. In the expanded edition of 1515, where for the first time he added to certain adages his own essays, some of them of considerable length, on issues that concerned him, one of these additions was Dulce bellum inexpertis (“War Is Sweet to Those Who Know It Not”), which was also printed as a separate pamphlet in 1517 and then was reprinted many times in Latin, twice in German translation, and once (1533 or 1534) in English during the sixteenth century.
In this adage Erasmus deplores the insouciance with which contemporary rulers rush into war for the most trivial reasons and the cruelty and barbarity with which it is waged, “not only by pagans but even by Christians, not only by laymen, but even by priests and bishops” (Adages IV.i.1, in CWE 35:401), not only by young and inexperienced rulers but even by old ones who ought to know better. Those who rush into war are not so much the common people as the princes, whose proper task should be to restrain the folly of the rabble, not incite it. War, he argues, is contrary to human nature, which is dependent on sociability. Humans are not naturally equipped with claws or horns for combat but are gifted with the capacity for speech and reason, which should enable humans to avoid combat and coexist peacefully. Man as the image of God should care for the well-being of all of God's creatures. Erasmus contrasts with this ideal of peace and harmony the cruelty, violence, and bloodshed, the immorality, of war. War crept into human practice gradually and insidiously. In earlier times, at least, it was fought with bravery and honor rather than with the lust for killing that nowadays prevails. Today, war dominates human existence, pitting Christians against Christians, while priests on both sides encourage and sanctify this butchery. Those who wage war claim that they do so unwillingly, merely to defend their rights, but such excuses are hypocritical.
Erasmus contrasts the brotherhood preached by Christ with the shamefulness of wars pitting Christian against Christian. He denounces the worldly influence of Aristotle as a force corrupting Christian piety, even among the clergy, who gradually accepted Aristotle's opinions on the need for material goods and so began accepting money, initially as alms for the poor, then for their own needs, and finally as something worthy of honor among Christians for its own sake. After wealth came desire for power, and as the clergy accumulated power and wealth, every bishop thought that he deserved more power and wealth. Such worldly ambition led Christians to accept war against other Christians, even though Christ commanded his disciples to put up the sword and to avoid all battles except those against love of money, anger, ambition, and fear of death. Erasmus explicitly rejected the “two swords” theory by which medieval popes attributed supreme power, both civil and ecclesiastical, to themselves as successors of St. Peter. Although it is true that some popes and patristic authors have instigated and abetted war, such examples come from recent times, not from the early Christian leaders, who uniformly condemned war. Christian rulers should be less ready to resort to war when disputes arise, and should employ existing councils and authorities in order to resolve their disputes by arbitration. Erasmus even questioned whether Christians should be planning war against the Turks, who might be more readily won for Christ if Christians gave an example of virtuous living. If Christians are attacked, then armed resistance might be justified, though even in such a case, Turks should feel that they are being invited to be saved and not being attacked for the sake of plunder. If Christians will embrace the cause of peace, then Christ will claim them as his own. Popes, princes, and other Christian rulers should come together to stop the shedding of Christian blood. If princes incite conflict, the pope should intervene to settle the dispute.
Erasmus had witnessed the formal occupation of the conquered city of Bologna by Julius II in 1509 and had been shocked at the sight of a pope, clad in pontifical robes and astride his horse, leading his army into Bologna to accept the surrender of the city's magistrates. He is almost certainly the author of a biting satire, Julius exclusus, that must have been written shortly after the pope's death in February 1513 and circulated widely in manuscript before its first dated edition, published at Louvain in September 1518, without the author's name; there had been several undated editions, probably from as early as 1516, and there were many reprints. Contemporaries speculated about its authorship, and from the very beginning, Erasmus was the favorite suspect. The satire depicts the deceased pope, wearing the triple crown of the popes and bearing the symbols of the papal office, appearing at the gate of heaven, only to find that he cannot get in. In response to Julius' furious commands, neither St. Peter nor his assistants will admit him. In the dialogue that follows between Julius and Peter, Julius is rejected because of his arrogance, worldly life, and lack of spiritual qualities, but especially because of his use of violence and bloody warfare to pursue political power and the territorial expansion of the papal state. Erasmus never admitted that this satire was his own work, and in letters to Cardinals Campeggi and Wolsey, he deplored the circulation of “such scandalous stuff” (CWE 27:156); but several scholars have noted that in his denials, he denies responsibility for publishing (but not explicitly for writing) the satire. The consensus of nearly all modern scholars is that the little dialogue, though too extreme for him to embrace publicly, was another manifestation of his hatred for war and his antipathy toward Julius II as the chief warmonger of his time.
Although this hostility to war appears in many of Erasmus' works, he dedicated one additional treatise specifically to the cause of pacifism. This was his Querela pacis (The Complaint of Peace), written about a year after the adage Dulce bellum at the request of his most influential and helpful patron at the time, Jean Le Sauvage, chancellor of Burgundy and Castile. Yet Querela pacis was not a mere piece of propaganda favoring one court faction over another. Above all, it was another expression of his hatred of war. The little tract is a dramatic monologue in which Peace addresses an unspecified audience. Peace declares herself to be the source of “all the good things of heaven or earth” (CWE 27:293), including prosperity, security, and all that is sacred, while war is inherently bloody, destructive of prosperity, “and the greatest immediate destroyer of all piety and religion.” Nature has produced “only one animal gifted with reason,” only one animal capable of good will and concord (CWE 27:293–294). Yet the other animals, though they lack reason, live together peacefully according to their species; only humans, who most greatly need concord to preserve themselves, do not manage to live together peacefully. Helpless at birth and urgently needing affection and care, humans need harmony more than any other creature; but some Fury seems intent on destroying them through their own lust for fighting. If Nature is not sufficient to incline them to peace, then surely Christ should be able to draw them to peace and mutual good will. The common people may be ruled by passion, but Peace finds that the courts of princes, who are supposed to be wiser than ordinary folk and in addition are the earthly representatives of the Prince of Peace, are more bellicose, motivated more by selfish ambition than by reason. If Peace turns to scholars for aid since philosophy makes men good and theology makes them holy, she again is thwarted, for scholars also engage in warfare, though of another kind, not so bloody but just as insane. Scholars contend against scholars. Philosophical truth differs according to which side of the Alps an author lives on. Within the same university, logicians squabble with rhetoricians and theologians with lawyers. Among philosophers and theologians, Scotists quarrel with Thomists, nominalists with realists, Platonists with Peripatetics. Looking for some hope, Peace turns to religion, for all Christians hold the same faith. Yet among the clergy, members of cathedral chapters quarrel with their bishop and among themselves. Among the religious orders, each order struggles against all the others, Dominicans with Franciscans, Benedictines with Bernardines. Within individual orders, there is wrangling between reformed or observant communities and those who are less strict. This disunity contrasts with the concord and love expressed in Christ's life. Among rulers, Christian princes make up frivolous pretexts to justify their wars, and some rulers foster discord among their own subjects in the belief that harmony among their subjects undermines the ruler's authority. It is especially disgraceful that the clergy, whom even in the Old Testament God forbade to shed blood, have become promoters of war. The pope, the supreme authority among Christians, instead of using his authority to impose peace, promotes war. Anyone should know that peace is not based on treaties and alliances, which often lead to wars. A wise king should think himself great if he can make his people free, prosperous, and happy. If he thinks this way, would he extort money from his subjects to hire barbarian mercenaries, or expose his people to the hazards of war? The princes who bear the image of Christ should heed the voice of Christ, who summons them to peace. All of Erasmus' anti-war works, the Panegyric, the adage Dulce bellum, the Querela, and even the Institutio on the education of a prince, declare that war is evil because it is contrary to reason, incompatible with Christ's commands, and destructive of the life, prosperity, and happiness of the people. These tracts constitute the century's most powerful and influential statement of pacifist ideals.
Erasmus never wrote a treatise on human nature or even included a lengthy discussion of that topic as part of another work, but a few of his writings alluded to it. One aspect of his references to human nature goes far to explain why many students of his thought have exaggerated the influence of Plato, whom he generally used merely as a classical reference, parallel to his many references to ancient poets, orators, and dramatists, rather than as a source of philosophical method or doctrine. His view of human nature is often described as dualistic, and this is seen as a Platonic influence. Certainly he was no materialist; he valued the spiritual side of human experience more highly than the corporeal and constantly reiterated this judgment. In the Enchiridion, which is regularly described as the work where Platonic influence is strongest, he endorses a dualism between a godlike soul and a physical body similar to the body of any animal. In the Timaeus, he says, Plato describes a two-part soul, one part being immortal and divine, the other being subject to various disorders such as pain, fear, anger, lust, love, passion, and desire for pleasure. True happiness in life consists in repressing these disorders and letting the highest part of the soul, reason, rule as king over the mortal part, especially the digestive and sexual appetites, the parts most likely to rebel against reason. Reason, the part closest to God, can be overthrown by passion and the other weaknesses, but it cannot itself be corrupted. Although philosophers generally agree that reason and not the passions must rule, different schools have different emphases. The Stoics strive to eliminate the influence of the passions entirely and render man impassive; the Peripatetics (the followers of Aristotle), on the other hand, have taught that it is impossible to eradicate the passions, which are part of our nature and can even be useful, capable under some circumstances of driving us to seek virtue. Erasmus thinks that Socrates agrees with the Stoics when he defines philosophy as a meditation on death; the mind should avoid corporeal and sensible things as much as possible and should concentrate on things perceived by reason (CWE 66:42–44). He comments that these philosophical doctrines would be without value if the same teachings were not also found in Scripture. Just as Plato distinguished two souls in man, the rational and the passionate (the part dominated by the body), St. Paul labeled the rational part “spirit” and the passionate part “flesh.” Plato wrote of two souls; Paul wrote of two men stuck together and contending for control, yet bound to go together either to heaven or to hell.
But after expounding what he views as a Platonic account of human nature, Erasmus suggests a different concept, the opinion that man is divided into three parts, not just two. This tripartite conception of human nature comes from the patristic theologian Origen, whose works Erasmus had recently discovered and had embraced with great enthusiasm. In Thessalonians, Paul refers to body, soul, and mind. From this and other biblical passages, Origen concluded “with good reason” (CWE 66:51) that there are three parts in man: first the body or the flesh, the lowest part, in which after the sin of Adam the law of sin is rooted, leading us to evil deeds and hence to the Devil; second, the spirit, the highest part, which is modeled on God's own nature, by which we are drawn to God and made one with him; and “a third and middle soul between the other two, which is capable of sensations and natural movements” (CWE 66:51). Thus the human being is divided, for the middle part or soul is drawn both to the spirit, through which it can become spiritual, and to the desires of the body or the flesh. If a person yields to the desires of the bodily or fleshly part, the total person degenerates into body. In an early works like the Enchiridion, written long before he faced the challenge from Martin Luther, the human being through his will is free to choose whichever side he wishes: the [middle] soul can incline toward the spirit, or it can incline toward the flesh. Erasmus cites from Paul's Epistle to the Corinthians (1 Cor. 6:16–17) the example of a man joined to a harlot (that is, ruled by the body) versus a man joined to the Lord (ruled by the spirit). “Therefore the spirit makes us gods, the flesh makes us brute animals. The soul constitutes us as human beings; the spirit makes us religious, the flesh irreligious, the soul neither the one nor the other” (CWE 66:52). This tripartite division of human nature, at this early stage of Erasmus' life (1503–1504) when he was not yet challenged by feeling a need to relate this discussion to the action of divine grace, suggests that in preferring Origen's theory, he has turned away from Platonic dualism. The middle soul stands between the most divine part, spirit, and the least dignified and most readily corrupted part, flesh or body. The Enchiridion does mention grace and declares that it is necessary for salvation, for Erasmus had no intention of becoming a Pelagian heretic; but grace is much less prominent than in his later discussions of the soul. In a letter written in 1519 to an educated Bohemian nobleman, when he had spent much more time pondering the meaning of the New Testament and had begun to hear of Luther, Erasmus clearly has moved toward greater emphasis on God's role in the justification of man. He asserts that “the whole of the Christian philosophy lies in this, … that all our hope is placed in God, who freely gives us all things through Jesus his son…, that we might be dead to the desires of this world and live by his teaching and example…, so that we claim nothing for ourselves, but ascribe any good we do to God” (Ep 1039, CWE 7:126–127).
Erasmus' initial position on human nature had been fundamentally optimistic, in the sense that humans, having free will, can be directed toward moral virtue and piety if they receive the proper education, though he always added that this movement toward righteousness required the assistance of grace. This optimistic assumption underlies all of his tracts on education, where the shaping of moral integrity and learning to avoid or control temptations were the dominant concern. Erasmus' close study of the New Testament, which involved not just editing and translating the text but also probing its meaning in his accompanying annotations and in his Paraphrases, made him far more aware of the inadequacy of secular learning, even though he continued to regard the best classical authors, especially the moral philosophers, as conducive to piety and as an essential part of a good education. This work on Scripture also made him far more aware of man's dependence on grace. The destructive wars among the rulers of Christian Europe, the squabbling among theologians (including the leaders of the Reformation but also the schools of scholastic theology), the social upheaval and bloodshed of the Peasant War of 1524–1525, and most urgently the scenes of mob violence that accompanied popular pressure to enact drastic religious change in many German cities, including his own adopted city of Basel in 1529, combined to darken his view of human nature.
Despite his gradually increasing awareness of fundamental differences with Martin Luther, Erasmus learned much about theology from the Saxon Reformer, whom he continued to read with great attention despite his claim that he had been so busy that he had read only scattered fragments. Luther forced him to confront issues that he would have preferred to leave undefined, specific questions about grace, sin, and evil that Luther raised in stark form. Erasmus' Paraphrases on the gospels of John, Luke, and Mark frequently used phrases and terms such as sola fides and fiducia that were integral to Luther's theology, a tendency noted by the malevolent eye of the Paris theologian Noël Béda, who was determined to prove that Erasmus was really a Lutheran and concluded (surely correctly) that Erasmus had been reading Luther as he worked on his Paraphrases (Tracy 1972:229). Erasmus was painfully aware that he agreed with Luther on many issues but also disagreed deeply on others. Eventually, not just because he was constantly pressed by patrons and friends but also because he felt obliged by his own prominence in the intellectual and religious life of the age to speak out publicly against Luther on at least one major dogmatic issue, the freedom of the will, he began to read or re-read Aristotle, Aquinas, Wyclif, Gabriel Biel, but above all, Augustine's anti-Pelagian treatises, where he found a deeply pessimistic view of human moral abilities. To accept an independent human capacity to make good moral choices, the position he longed to affirm and had inclined toward in his earlier works, seemed dangerously close to the heresy of Pelagius that Augustine had condemned. In 1529, he published an early work, De pueris instituendis (On Education for Children), probably written about 1509, that emphasized the value of a classical education inspired by Plutarch's On the Education of Children and Quintilian's Institutio oratoria. This publication suggests that he had not totally abandoned his optimistic youthful confidence that proper education can shape and improve human character. But by the 1530s, Erasmus had abandoned his opinion that if the spiritual side of human nature can control the passionate and corporeal side, virtue was attainable. He had become more “evangelical,” somewhat closer to Luther's pessimism, than he was even in the mid-1520s when he challenged Luther. In one of his late publications (1533), De sarcienda ecclesiae concordia, he conceded that reason, too, “counts for nothing before God, without whom human powers can do nothing. It too is corrupted by sin…” (quoted by Schoeck 1993:354, and Tracy 1972:233). Also in 1533, he published his explanation of the Apostles' Creed (Explanatio symboli apostolorum sive catechismus), which challenges the adequacy of moral philosophy. He notes that the Stoic philosophy founded by Zeno “promises peace of mind, but only in this life, and a false peace at that. For nothing gives true peace to our souls except the grace of Christ…” (CWE 70:246). He had not wholly abandoned his optimistic opinion that a liberal education in the moral philosophy of antiquity could incline a person toward moral virtue. According to his very last lengthy work, Ecclesiastes (1535), the “flesh” condemned by St. Paul means not just lust or drunkenness, not just sins of the body, but also “man's very reason, indeed all his faculties, as long as the spirit of Christ be absent” (quoted by Tracy 1972:233). In other words, unless the soul is moved by grace, it is helpless to avoid sin, a position pretty close to the opinion of Luther that he attacked in De libero arbitrio (1524). A short work published in the very last year of his life (1536), De puritate tabernaculi (On the Purity of the Tabernacle), suggested serious doubt that (unless grace is present) it is possible to educate men morally or lead them to choose the good: “Great is the rudeness and sluggishness of the human mind; so much so that the Decalogue, which was given to a coarse and rebellious people, has but three precepts commanding what is virtuous, while the others prohibit manifest crimes” (Schoeck 1993:353; Tracy 1972:232). Unless the soul is moved by grace, it is helpless to do good or avoid sin. In 1517, in his Paraphrase of Romans, while admitting that inherent human righteousness, in comparison with the action of grace, “seems like nothing at all,” Erasmus contended that nevertheless “some part of it depends on our own will or effort.” In 1523 Luther cited this passage in accusing Erasmus of Pelagian heresy. In the revised edition of that Paraphrase published in 1532, Erasmus deleted this passage, perhaps partly in response to Luther's accusation but also because in preparing the revised edition, he had carefully re-read and pondered the text of Paul's letter. By 1535, though he was still firmly committed to the unity and catholicity of the church and willing to submit to the judgment of the traditional authorities even on questions where he found the official decision hard to understand, his view of human nature had drawn much closer to Luther's: without the grace promised to the faithful, humans are helpless and unable to keep from sinning (Schoeck 1993:354; Tracy 1972:234). Erasmus had not abandoned all trust in the value of classical education; neither, for that matter, had Luther. He still thought that the best ancient authors pointed the way to the more complete truths of Christian faith; but his earlier confidence that careful indoctrination through study of the moral philosophers would help make a prince, or any pupil, into a truly righteous man was no longer tenable.
Erasmus' earlier, more positive evaluation of human nature was the basis for his discussion of a topic of major philosophical interest, the freedom of the human will, which became the central issue in a conflict that began in September 1524 when he published De libero arbitrio diatribè sive collatio (A Discussion of Free Will), in which he directly attacked a central doctrine of Martin Luther's theology, his assertion in his defense against the papal bull of excommunication (article 36) that contrary to the opinion of scholastic theologians, the human will after Adam's sin was so disordered that it was unfree, unable through its own power to make even the slightest positive response to God's saving grace, unable to do anything that was not a sin. Luther's doctrine meant that only those sinners whom God by his own will had elected for salvation, without any merit on their own part, would escape eternal damnation for their sins. Erasmus' rather reluctant decision to confront Luther was a tardy response to the urging of many Catholic friends and patrons (including popes and kings), all of whom had been warning him that it was his duty to oppose Luther's heresies if he wanted to preserve his own reputation as a Catholic theologian. Although Erasmus had put them off for several years and obviously was not spoiling for a conflict with Luther, there were causes other than these external pressures that finally compelled him to speak out. He still found much in Luther's writings that he approved, but Luther's harsh and divisive language and his abusiveness against those who opposed him made Erasmus doubt that the spirit that moved him truly came from God. Luther's three revolutionary treatises of 1520, especially The Babylonian Captivity of the Church, where he flatly rejected the whole sacramental system of the medieval church and denied the authority of the institutional church and its established hierarchy, convinced Erasmus that the compromise and conciliation that he had been quietly but actively encouraging to end the conflict were no longer possible, and that Luther was creating a serious division in the Christian community.
Gradually, but especially after reading Luther's three treatises of 1520, Erasmus' opinion of Luther shifted from cautious approval in 1518 to increasingly strong criticism. Initially, he expressed these growing reservations in private letters, mostly to younger humanists who were his own admirers but who found Luther attractive and assumed that because there were so many similarities between Luther's reform ideas and those of Erasmus, Luther represented nothing more than a powerful new voice in one and the same program of religious reform.
Although Luther welcomed the warm support of the German humanists and hoped also for Erasmus' support or at least his silence, he himself as early as 1516 decided that Erasmus' reform ideas lacked a sound theological foundation. In that year, still an obscure young professor of theology, he indirectly communicated to Erasmus a warning that the doctrine of grace expressed in the annotations and preface to his edition of the New Testament (1516) essentially reiterated the heretical view of free will for which the monk Pelagius had been condemned in the fifth century by St. Augustine. Luther was aware that his own theological studies had been vastly enhanced by Erasmus' biblical scholarship and so did not make a public issue of what he judged to be Erasmus' failure to understand grace. But by 1517 in private correspondence he was warning close friends that despite his great scholarly achievements and his welcome criticism of the corruption of the institutional church, Erasmus was not theologically competent. These criticisms became widely known among the close network of humanists who initially had found both Luther and Erasmus appealing. As early as 1521, some of Erasmus' critical letters began appearing (without his approval) in the publications of other humanists. The collection of his own correspondence that he published in September 1522 made some of these judgments public. He was urging his humanist friends not to embrace Luther's reform movement even though there were good things in it. The first of these critical letters to be published, addressed to Ludwig Baer, professor of theology at Basel and a good friend of Erasmus, did not raise the issue of free will at all, but it did mention Luther's views on the unfreedom of the will in his Assertiones (1520) against the papal decree excommunicating him. That letter deplored Luther's radical rejection of the medieval sacramental system and the authority of the hierarchy in his Babylonian Captivity and his contemptuous burning of the papal bull and the published text of the corpus of canon law, actions which had “made the evil [that is, the growing schism] to all appearance incurable” (Ep 1204, CWE 8:212).
From the Lutheran side also came expressions of growing disagreement. Erasmus reported in letters written in the winter and spring of 1522 that Luther's supporters were denouncing him as a Pelagian heretic, on the basis of some parts of his Enchiridion but mainly because of a passage in his Paraphrase on the ninth chapter of Paul's Epistle to the Romans (Epp 1259 and 1275, CWE 9:23 and 9:65). Not until 1523 did Erasmus directly mention freedom of the will as a point of contention in his correspondence with friends, once just in passing (Ep 1342, CWE 9:399) and once more clearly in a letter to Huldrych Zwingli, a friend of long standing and already the leader of the Reformation in Zurich, whom Erasmus still chose to regard as a humanist reformer and not as a committed follower of Luther. Here he mentions Luther's claim in his Assertiones that all the works of the saints are sin, “that free will is mere words,” and “that man is justified by faith alone and works are nothing to the point,” statements that Erasmus dismisses as “riddles which are on the face of it absurd” (Ep 1384, CWE 10:81). Even so, Erasmus still denied that Luther, despite the official condemnation by the pope, was a heretic; and in an expanded edition of his widely read Colloquies in 1524, when he had already decided to write against Luther, he added a new colloquy, Inquisitio de fide (“An Examination Concerning the Faith”), in which he adopted an irenic tone and concluded that since Barbatius, the character who represents Luther, accepts every article of the Apostles' Creed in a fully orthodox sense, Barbatius (hence, Luther) is not a heretic (CWE 39:419–447; see the Introduction by Craig E. Thompson, p. 419). This dialogue does not mention freedom of the will, even though Erasmus had already begun writing De libero arbitrio. Apparently although he had decided to focus his attack on this issue alone and regarded Luther's opinion as erroneous, he still regarded the issue as an obscure and peripheral matter, not an essential article of true Christian doctrine. It was a “paradox,” a statement that Luther had made but could not possibly have meant to be taken literally.
At one early stage, Erasmus had conceived his confrontation with Luther in the form of a dialogue, a format that permitted great informality and avoided a direct and definitive statement of opinion by the author. The dialogue was one of his favorite literary forms. But what he finally decided to write was a theological treatise, a genre wholly untypical of his previous writings. Indeed, it and his second work against Luther, Hyperaspistes, were the only theological treatises he ever wrote. His decision surprised most contemporaries and has also surprised many later students of his thought. Erasmus had decided that he must make a plain, simple, and open challenge on a point of doctrine, not just to satisfy his fellow-Catholics but also because he felt obliged to confront directly this over-zealous though sincere reformer who was dividing the Christian community. His treatise was polite, avoiding vituperation and inviting discussion of a specific issue. Surprisingly, but in line with his long-standing insistence that many of Luther's teachings were at least partly valid, he avoided a number of important issues on which he had privately criticized Luther, such as his radical repudiation of the sacramental system of the church, his rejection of the authority of the pope and other members of the ecclesiastical hierarchy, or even his public defiance of authority in the presence of a large crowd when he burned the text of the canon law along with a copy of Pope Leo's bull of excommunication. On all of these issues (except the open act of defiance), Erasmus had his own doubts and qualifications, even though he regarded Luther's positions as extreme. Hence he selected one abstract and largely theoretical doctrine, freedom of the will, on which he had concluded that Luther not only had erred but also had seriously distorted the very authority that both of them accepted as definitive, the Bible.
The issue raised in Erasmus' carefully polite De libero arbitrio was in fact central to the whole Reformation debate (Luther himself complimented Erasmus on picking the essential issue even though otherwise he claimed that Erasmus was incompetent in theology), for the defense or rejection of free will led directly to the question of the relative importance of divine grace and human works in the salvation of every human. It was also a question on which Erasmus had taken a public stance in several of his previously published works. He was fully aware that the issue of free will had a long and complicated history both in patristic thought and in medieval scholasticism. Some biographers have expressed surprise that he undertook to write a theological treatise, and Luther rudely insisted that Erasmus was simply out of his depth, incompetent as a theologian. Although Erasmus did not usually present himself as a theologian, he was in fact remarkably learned in the traditional theological systems that he rejected and more learned than any of his contemporaries in the ancient patristic theology and the new, exegetically based humanistic theology of which he himself was a creator. Through his years of devotion to patristic and biblical studies he had also acquired considerable knowledge of recent scholastic theology. Before writing De libero arbitrio, he consulted the works of many patristic authorities (notably Origen, John Chrysostom, Ambrose, Jerome, and Augustine) and also major medieval theologians like Bernard of Clairvaux, Thomas Aquinas, and Duns Scotus. In his treatise he also cited knowledgeably the distinctive views on free will held by late-medieval theologians of the via moderna or nominalist tradition. He also knew and cited (and rejected) the deterministic opinion of Lorenzo Valla , and he cited the most learned of the English bishops, John Fisher, whose book against Luther gave much attention to the issue of free will (Augustijn 1991:136). The open conflict with Luther began with publication of De libero arbitrio in September 1524. Erasmus then had to wait well over a year before Luther's response, De servo arbitrio (On the Enslaved Will), a brutally hostile book that shocked and angered Erasmus by accusing him of being a hypocrite and an atheist, was published on the very last day of 1525. Erasmus rushed to provide an immediate response to Luther's slanderous accusations, deciding that his new work, Hyperaspistes diatribae adversus Servum arbitrium Martini Lutheri (A Defensive Shield Against the “Unfree Will” of Martin Luther), would have to be written in two parts so that at least some of his rebuttal would circulate on the European book market simultaneously with Luther's book. The rather brief first volume of Hyperaspistes came off the press at the end of February 1526, barely in time to go on sale at the March session of the semiannual Frankfurt book fair through which Luther's book would also gain most of its international distribution. Erasmus delayed completion of the much longer second volume of Hyperaspistes, which was not published until September 1527. There was no further reply from Luther, whose contempt for Erasmus had become so great that he did not bother with a rebuttal. There was a brief renewal of the controversy when Luther wrote a renewed attack on “the viper” Erasmus in a letter to Nikolaus von Amsdorf that was published early in 1534, and Erasmus quickly produced a short rebuttal, Purgatio, published in April of the same year. After one unfriendly exchange of letters in 1526 (Luther's letter, sadly, has not survived), the two men never corresponded again.
When he wrote De libero arbitrio in 1524, Erasmus no longer had much expectation that the clash between Luther and the ecclesiastical authorities could be settled through the negotiation and conciliation for which he had been pleading, but he carefully avoided harsh denunciation. He called this book a diatribè (a Greek word meaning not “diatribe” but “discussion” or, in Latin, collatio), a careful comparison and evaluation of the case for and against the freedom of the human will. The argument he presented (like Luther's response) did not involve a real philosophical debate conducted through dialectical reasoning. That would have been the scholastic way, but both Erasmus and Luther rejected the whole procedure as a corruption of Christian theology based on the rationalism of Aristotle, a pagan philosopher whose thought, while possibly useful for questions of natural philosophy and other purely secular matters, was worse than useless, indeed positively harmful, if allowed to govern decisions on matters of religious belief. In addition, both Erasmus and Luther believed that the question of free will—that is, whether people can freely make choices or only have the illusion that they can—was beyond the very limited capacity of human reason, a question insoluble by any of the known schools of philosophy. Their debate, therefore, did not involve the question whether human reason could prove or disprove the freedom of the will; both of them agreed that it could not. The dispute was based entirely on conflicting interpretations of the meaning of relevant passages in both the Old and the New Testaments, with special attention to passages in the Epistles of Paul, the part of the Bible that most directly addressed issues of free will and grace. This was a theological discussion based on the method of humanistic theology that Erasmus had created and Luther had fully adopted. Dialectical argumentation had no role in such a discussion; theology was based on exegesis of the sacred text, not on reasoning.
Although Erasmus was a far more competent theologian than Luther would concede, his concept of a new and reformed (but fully Catholic) theology involved the application of humanistic learning to biblical exegesis. This meant mastery of the source-languages of the Bible, Hebrew and Greek and also the patristic Latin of the first Christian centuries. It also meant adopting humanistic methods of interpreting a particular text by viewing it in the broader context of the whole work of which it was a part and also in terms of the probable intention of the author. From early in his own development, Luther had embraced this essentially Erasmian approach; and the publication of Erasmus' New Testament in 1516 was a crucial turning-point in his own development.
Their disagreement did not involve whether to rely on Scripture as the fundamental source of truth on questions of doctrine and practice, but their differing methods of interpreting the meaning of a passage (that is, their different hermeneutic principles) became a central issue in their debate. For Luther, the true meaning of any scriptural passage was evident to any believer who understood the central principle of Christianity, that faith in the redemptive power of Christ's crucifixion and resurrection was the only source of salvation. Any apparently unclear passage could be understood by reference to other scriptural passages that dealt with the same matter. The sacred words were plain, and their true meaning was obvious to any pious reader. Erasmus, on the other hand, viewed the sacred text as complex and unclear on many important points and insisted that when a passage gives rise to conflicting interpretations, the reader must ultimately defer to the consensus of the whole Christian community through the many centuries of Christian history. Scripture was still the foundation, but it must always be read within the context of the one true and universal church. Erasmus also conceded to the ecclesiastical hierarchy (despite the manifest flaws of individual popes, bishops, and priests) the authority to define that traditional consensus, and hence to define the meaning of the Bible. Luther did not concede this authority because he believed that for many centuries, the ecclesiastical hierarchy had defected from true Christian doctrine and so had forfeited any claim to authority.
Their disagreement regarding free will focused on two specific issues. First, Erasmus concluded from a careful, itemized survey of relevant biblical passages (from the Old Testament as well as the New) that taken as a whole, the Scripture relevant to the freedom of the will is unclear. Indeed, he wrote, “in Holy Scripture there are some secret places into which God did not intend us to penetrate very far” (CWE 76:8). The questions of free will and grace are of that type. If we attempt to speak with certainty on issues where the relevant biblical passages appear contradictory and unclear, we are likely to fall into error. Indeed, as Erasmus concludes after observing that disagreement on the freedom of the will and human dependence on grace has continued since the earliest days of the church, the greater number of ancient Church Fathers and of modern (scholastic) theologians concludes that some freedom to choose or reject the grace offered by God remains. Early in De libero arbitrio, he explicitly adopts a skeptical position on human knowledge (CWE 76:7). In general, he declares, he will regard any question as open to debate unless clear biblical texts or the decrees of the church dictate otherwise, in which case he will believe what Scripture declares and what the church has determined, even if he does not understand the reasons. This principle of respect for decisions of church councils and the general consensus of the community of believers through the centuries was the main conviction that kept Erasmus loyal (by his own standards, at least) to the traditional Roman Catholic Church despite his sharp criticism of many of its practices and the corruption and unworthiness of many of its leaders.
The second specific issue of disagreement between Erasmus and Luther was on the goal of the writings in which theologians address the problems and disagreements that were tearing the Christian community apart. Erasmus was a pacifist in religious as well as political matters. When he wrote De libero arbitrio and even the two parts of his second work on free will, Hyperaspistes, produced in response to Luther's savage attack on him in De servo arbitrio, his goal was to preserve peace, harmony, and unity in the church. That was why he called his first treatise a diatribè or collatio—a comparative discussion of biblical texts. His initial goal was to investigate, compare, and identify certain truths on which all or nearly all Christians could agree, reserving to further scholarly study and continuing negotiation (but not to public discussion by the uneducated) those issues, such as the precise extent of the will's freedom, on which substantial agreement could not be reached.
Erasmus, being a humanist or rhetorician at heart, was approaching the issue of free will in a rhetorical rather than a philosophical or dialectical way (Boyle 1983:5–8). Convinced that the question of free will is beyond the capacity of human reason, he turned to rhetoric, the quintessential humanistic subject. Although this term in recent times (often modified by the adjective “mere”) implies windy, inflated verbiage, that was not its primary meaning for Renaissance humanists or for their ancient sources. For them, rhetoric was the art of attaining probable conclusions (which medieval logicians dismissed as “opinion”) on issues where certitude was not possible. Rhetorical argument had its classical base in the field of oratory and implied a skeptical epistemology, not the radical and extreme skepticism of the Greek Pyrrhonists but the more limited skepticism of the Academic philosophers of Hellenistic Greece and their Roman disciples. The positive side of Academic skepticism was that while we may not be able to determine the truth with certitude, we can calculate which of several possible solutions to a problem is the most probable. Academic skepticism found its major Roman exponent in Rome's greatest orator, Cicero, whose philosophical work Academica was the principal direct source for knowledge about ancient skepticism throughout the Middle Ages and the Renaissance. Since the biblical texts provided no clear and definitive answer to the question whether, after Adam's sin, free will is only an empty name and can only lead man into sin, Erasmus contended that the question must be regarded as debatable. Reason cannot attain certainty on this issue, but rhetorical argument, based on comparative study of all relevant biblical texts as well as on the Church Fathers and later theologians, can demonstrate that the opinion that the human will retains some limited capacity to accept or reject saving grace is more probable than the opposite view that the will is totally enslaved by sin and that only the arbitrary decision of God to count some persons as righteous and others not—that is, only predestination without concern for human merit—offers any hope of salvation.
In support of this defense of free will, Erasmus also offered a supplemental argument, his conviction that denial of free will would undermine morality because if human actions were not the result of the individual's own choice, people would conclude that virtuous actions would not receive eternal rewards and evil deeds would not result in eternal damnation, and thus the masses of people would be less hesitant to sin. If people believed they had free will, they would feel more hopeful, less inclined to fall into despair. It is best not to dwell on free will more than necessary, for public discussion of the question “is not conducive to godliness” (CWE 76:87). Discussion of such sensitive issues should be confined to calm and quiet interchange among qualified scholars and should be kept far from the masses (CWE 76:11–12). Even if the conclusions of John Wyclif and Luther that everything happens by necessity were true, or if St. Augustine really meant it when he wrote that God is the cause of both our good and our evil deeds, making such opinions widely known “would open the door to godlessness in countless mortals” (CWE 76:13). The Bible is so full of figures of speech that uneducated people can easily misunderstand it. It “has its own way of speaking accommodated to our understanding” (CWE 76:14) and is to be taken figuratively, not literally.
In constructing his rhetorical argument in favor of a limited freedom of the will, Erasmus as a skilled rhetorician consciously chose to pursue one particular rhetorical mode, the deliberative. His collatio or comparative discussion of free will is an investigation (indagatio) of the sources of virtue, concerned to promote a conclusion that is both morally righteous and also socially expedient, good for the concord of the community of faithful Christians (Boyle 1983:14–17). The kind of Academic skepticism followed by Erasmus assumes that absolute certitude is out of reach but that a high degree of probability is attainable. Erasmus did not really believe that free will was an open question: the greater weight of biblical, patristic, and theological opinion favored it; and while Scripture did not provide a definitive answer, the institutional church at the Council of Constance had already spoken definitively when it condemned the English heretic John Wyclif for teaching a determinism that was essentially the same as what Luther was now teaching (CWE 76:16–17).
Martin Luther, in his harsh but rhetorically effective reply, De servo arbitrio, would not play Erasmus' gentle game of polite, gentlemanly discussion of a debatable issue under the guidance of Cicero's Academic skepticism. “The Holy Spirit,” he retorted, “is no skeptic.” He rejected Erasmus' proposal for calm comparison of obscure biblical passages. For a person with real Christian belief, he insisted, the Bible is not obscure at all but means exactly what the words say. The passages that seem to imply freedom of the will need to be interpreted in the light of other passages that are more clear and more authoritative, especially the views in Paul's Epistle to the Romans. Luther had no interest in reconciling statements and making comparisons: “I have not compared, but have asserted and do assert…” (quoted in Boyle 1983:46). A true Christian is not allowed to adopt a skeptical method and argue both sides of an issue. On all questions that are clearly determined in Scripture (and the questions of grace and free will are among those), a Christian must affirm exactly what the Bible says. Against Erasmus' skeptical arguments he employed arguments taken from ancient Stoic criticism of Academic skepticism, probably borrowed from a patristic source he knew well, St. Augustine's Contra Academicos (Boyle 1983:55–56).
Although he claimed no special expertise in rhetorical learning and had received a traditional scholastic education, not a humanistic one, Luther understood the modes of rhetorical discourse very well and shrewdly shifted the discussion from Erasmus' deliberative mode to Cicero's judicial mode, which aimed not to moderate and reconcile but to win decisions in the law courts. He sought not mutual harmony and compromise but a definitive judgment affirming what the Holy Spirit declared in the Epistles of Paul. His careful choice of words shows that in rhetorical terms he knew exactly what he was doing. He repeatedly calls his debate with Erasmus not a collatio but a causa (a legal case) and claimed that no matter what Origen and other patristic authors might say, by upholding the literal truth of what Paul wrote in the Epistle to the Romans, he is upholding the causa Christi (Christ's case). He plays the role of an advocate pleading Christ's side against Satan's side before the Supreme Judge (Boyle 1983:58–73). He classes Erasmus not among the Ciceronian rhetoricians but among the sophists, both ancient and modern, who habitually beg the question and conceal a weak case behind a flood of words and irrelevant considerations. Thus, he says, Erasmus is simply beyond his depth, incompetent as a theologian, because he has never really understood or experienced the fundamental Christian concept of grace.
Luther's rhetorical skill in organizing De servo arbitrio was so unlike his usual style that Erasmus suspected that some other author, some skilled humanist, had written it or helped write it. Since (for quite other reasons) Luther delayed writing his rebuttal for more than a year after publication of De libero arbitrio, Erasmus (who was inclined to suspect conspiracies against himself) grumbled in the preface to his hasty counter-rebuttal, part 1 of Hyperaspistes, that De servo arbitrio “is the work of many people produced over a long period of time” (Ep 1667, CWE 12:41). In reality, Luther considered not deigning to write any reply to De libero arbitrio and eventually produced the rebuttal entirely by himself in just a few weeks of the autumn of 1525, after which it was promptly published, appearing on the very last day of the year. Erasmus had expected a sharp reply despite early assurances from Luther's close associate Philipp Melanchthon that his book had aroused no special anger at Wittenberg. Melanchthon described his own reaction, but not Luther's. Luther went far beyond challenging the adequacy of Erasmus' rhetorical arguments and his explicit adoption of a skeptical line of argument. He made scurrilous charges, treating Erasmus not just as the defender of false theology but as a conscienceless hypocrite who had no religious convictions at all:
By such tactics you only succeed in showing that you foster in your heart a Lucian, or some other pig from Epicurus' sty who, having no belief in God himself, secretly ridicules all who have a belief and confess it. Permit us to be assertors, to be devoted to assertions and delight in them, while you stick to your Skeptics and Academics till Christ calls you too. The Holy Spirit is no Skeptic, and it is not doubts or mere opinions that he has written on our hearts, but assertions more sure and certain than life itself and all experience. (quoted from introduction to Ep 1688, CWE 12:135)
Luther followed this insulting attack with a letter that has not survived but must have been full of similar contempt for Erasmus, judging from the cold and distant tone of Erasmus' reply (Ep 1688, Basel, 11 April 1526, CWE 12:135–138). The two men never corresponded again, though Erasmus maintained a civil and even friendly correspondence with Melanchthon, a talented humanist and educational reformer.
Erasmus' integrity, even his self-respect, had been challenged by Luther's charges against his competence but especially against his religious sincerity. He felt obligated to reply, and his Hyperaspistes, published in two parts in March 1526 and September 1527, was his extremely lengthy rebuttal. It was considerably less mild than De libero arbitrio, although not nearly so harsh as Luther's attack. Luther's book was published at the very end of 1525, and Erasmus had difficulty even getting a copy. Erasmus, who had been impatiently waiting for more than a year to hear from Luther, and who was prone to suspicions of conspiracy, was convinced that “they” (that is, Luther and the fellow-conspirators he thought had colluded with him) had deliberately timed the publication so that he would be unable to publish a response in time for the spring session of the semi-annual Frankfurt book fair through which nearly all books of more than local interest were distributed. He felt obliged to make a speedy reply since he did not want Luther's book to monopolize public discussion during the several months before the autumn session of the book fair. He decided, therefore, to write his reply in two parts. Fortunately for him, he had at his disposal in Basel one of the greatest publishing firms of the age. After he received a copy of De servo arbitrio, he had about two weeks to read it, write a reply, and get the book into print in time for the March fair. His publisher, Johann Froben, worked just as hard as he, devoting six presses working simultaneously to the task of printing.
This first part of Hyperaspistes answered only Luther's remarks on the preface and introduction of De libero arbitrio. Erasmus began by upbraiding Luther for his arrogance and undeserved hostility. Then he explained what he meant when he called himself a skeptic, and clarified the distinction between theological issues that have been authoritatively determined by the church and hence are no longer debatable and other issues that are open to debate. Here he took pains to reaffirm his loyalty to the traditions of the church and to the papacy as the guarantor of unity. At this point he also returned to the question of the clarity of Scripture and rejected Luther's claim that the meaning of the crucial passages in the epistles of Paul is always simple and clear. He also defended his longstanding belief that only a few essential articles of faith need to be taught to the masses of the population and that intricate and debatable issues like free will should not be fought out in public. In this discussion he showed a remarkably thorough knowledge of scholastic theology (Charles Trinkaus, Introduction, CWE 76:xxxix). In a third section of the first volume, he reasserted the need for respect for the authorities of the church and for centuries of well-established and universally accepted belief. Tradition, he insisted, supports his position on free will, not Luther's; and it is a better guide than Luther's claim that his understanding of the Bible is guided by his personal insight into what the Holy Spirit meant. He challenged Luther's claim that free will is only a hollow label without clear meaning. He carefully parsed the views of various past theologians on grace and free will. He explained the opinion of St. Augustine, who accepts free will but concedes no power to it unless it is reinforced by grace, a very narrow position that he found uncomfortable but better than Luther's. He evaluated free will according to the medieval theologians of the via moderna, a position that he found attractive but did not fully endorse because it seemed too close to Pelagianism. He ended part 1 by rebuking Luther once more for the incivility of his response to the civil tone of De libero arbitrio.
Despite the encouragement and even the nagging of Catholic friends and patrons, Erasmus was slow to complete and publish the second part of Hyperaspistes, which was not published until November 1527. Part of the reason, as he made clear in his correspondence, was that he had many other important works in progress. In addition, as he complained bitterly, he was constantly being attacked by conservative Catholics who were unimpressed by his confrontation with Luther and continued to regard him as a Lutheran. These included a number of monks in Spain, who were attempting to have several of his works (very popular in Spanish translations) condemned, and attacks from the Paris theologians, who in December 1527 formally condemned several of his books. These distractions certainly contributed to the delay, but he also delayed because he found his task extremely challenging. Although he wanted to attribute to humans some independent ability to respond to grace by an act of free will, and thus to reject Luther's opinion, he admitted in a candid letter to Thomas More, “If I follow Paul and Augustine very little is left to free will” (Ep 1804, Allen 7:8, translated by Tracy 1972:231).
In the second part of Hyperaspistes, when it was finally published in September 1527, Erasmus put most of his effort into a detailed examination of the biblical passages he had cited in De libero arbitrio in support of free will. The task is long because he explains each of his original arguments, each of Luther's elaborate rebuttals, and then his further elaboration of each disputed passage. He analyzes complex and difficult terms and applies patristic texts, especially from John Chrysostom, to illustrate how the Epistles of Paul may be interpreted in a pastoral sense that would be a valid alternative to Luther's exegesis, emphasizing his principle that biblical passages must be understood in relation to the context in which they were written. He presents his own interpretation of human nature as viewed from a biblical perspective. He gives much attention to the most influential patristic statement on free will, the works that St. Augustine wrote in opposition to the heresy of Pelagius, concluding that since Pelagianism is no longer a current issue, the Epistles of Paul need not be interpreted in Augustine's way. His discussion shows that he feels attracted to the scholastic distinction between “congruous merit” and “condign merit” as developed by the theologians of the via moderna, and he seems somewhat more favorable to this tradition, which Luther denounced as crassly Pelagian, than in his earlier works. Augustine receives special attention not only because of his dominant influence on the issue but also because he represents a barely acceptable minimalist position on free will, avoiding the total determinism of Wyclif and Luther but yet making the decision of the will meaningless and useless unless assisted by grace. Luther judged even Augustine's very tiny concessions to free will as excessive, a conclusion that Erasmus equated with a total determinism that he denounced as approaching the errors of the ancient Manichean heretics. Erasmus' Hyperaspistes proved to be a very learned book, but an excessively long and poorly organized one.
Luther made no reply to either part of Hyperaspistes. He had long since written Erasmus off as a serious theologian, or even a Christian; but he did continue to read Erasmus' publications. He expressed dislike for the Explanatio symboli, an exposition of the Apostles' Creed that Erasmus published in 1532; and like nearly all Protestants (and all of the more conservative sort of Catholics) he flatly rejected Erasmus' book Liber de sarcienda ecclesiae concordia (1533), which pleaded for Christian reunification through mutual toleration of minor differences and generous-spirited emphasis on the many doctrines on which Protestants and Catholics still agreed rather than on complex issues on which they disagreed. After several years of private complaints but public silence, he took one last shot at Erasmus in a letter addressed to Nikolaus von Amsdorf that was printed early in 1534 as Epistola…de Erasmo Roterodamo. Here he depicted Erasmus as a madman, a “viper,” a fawning flatterer of princes and bishops who give him valuable gifts, but above all as an “amphibian” who loves equivocation. Erasmus produced a brief rebuttal, Purgatio adversus epistolam…Lutheri, published that April, which refuted Luther's interpretation of the disputed biblical passages. The great debate on free will ended in vituperation and petty bickering, followed by silence.
Erasmus never wrote a work, or a major portion of a work, on skepticism or on any issue in epistemology, but since he was the most distinguished humanist of his time, an ardent promoter of what his century defined as the studia humanitatis (humane studies), he was an expert on grammar (the study of language, in his case embracing Greek and classical and patristic Latin) and rhetoric (the study of eloquence). As a grammarian, he translated many ancient texts from Greek into Latin, published critical editions and Latin translations of classical authors, ancient patristic writers, and (most famous of all) the Greek text of the New Testament, accompanied by his own Latin translation and extensive annotations But Erasmus was also a rhetorician, the other major linguistic art included among the five academic subjects that constituted the studia humanitatis (Nauert 2006:12–16). Only one of the five humanistic subjects, moral philosophy, was avowedly philosophical; but in the practice of Erasmus and many other humanists, rhetoric functioned as a sort of anti-philosophy, a rival to the dialectical philosophy that had ruled medieval scholastic thought. The term rhetoric did not mean the windy, verbose decoration of oratory and writing that the term often implies today—“mere rhetoric.” Humanists regarded it as a practical way to investigate questions on which dialectical argumentation based on logic had proved unable to produce certitude. As noted in the preceding section of this entry, rhetoric was the procedure to be used in pursuit of conclusions that could not be proved beyond doubt but were the most probable choice among the alternatives explored. Many humanists, Erasmus among them, thought that many (or perhaps all) conclusions about abstract issues, including theological questions, were beyond the reach of human reason. Nevertheless, they believed, careful consideration of the various alternative solutions of a question could determine which one was the most probable opinion. Thus for Erasmus, rhetoric was the art of probable argumentation, ending not in the certitude claimed by logicians but in a conclusion that one of the outcomes was more probable than the others and could tentatively be regarded as true. (Nauert 2006:215–216).
In ancient times, rhetorical argumentation was related to oratory, used in political debates or legal proceedings. Its most influential Roman practitioners were Cicero and Quintilian, and their rhetoric had strong affinities with the Academic skeptics of Hellenistic Greece. Cicero was the most influential rhetorician and representative of Academic skepticism in Roman literature, and his Academica was the main source of knowledge about ancient skepticism until the publication of Latin translations of the skeptical works of Sextus Empiricus between 1562 and 1569 (Popkin 1960:17–19). Sextus represented the most radical form of ancient skepticism, Pyrrhonism, which left all issues in doubt and recommended suspension of judgment. Erasmus knew of Pyrrhonist skepticism only at second hand, through ancient handbooks and summaries, but he knew the Academic type, which did not stop with suspension of judgment but sought to determine degrees of probability, very well, since he was thoroughly familiar with the writings of Cicero.
Rhetorical argumentation implied a discursive form favorable to use of two literary genres, the dialogue and the oration, that Erasmus adopted for many of his own literary works. His Colloquies, presented as informal conversations among friends about a great variety of questions, were his most popular and widely known works throughout the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries. Beginning in 1522, after publication of several unauthorized editions based on manuscripts that had circulated as simple manuals of Latin conversation, Erasmus took control of this early work and developed the Colloquies into informal discussions of a whole host of philosophical, religious, social, and political issues that were current at the time. Since they remained a widely used textbook in the schools in order to help pupils learn how to converse in Latin, and since they were written in the author's fluent Latin style and were enlivened by frequent dashes of humor, they provided a remarkably effective means for Erasmus to diffuse his critical opinions about the contemporary world, covering questions of social life, politics, and (above all) religion. The very procedure used in a colloquy involved rhetorical discourse, and the end product was not a logical determination of truth but an informal consensus among the participants involving a judgment about probable truth. Erasmus used these dialogues to diffuse his ideas without making formal assertions. A good example is “The Godly Feast,” first published in the expanded edition that Erasmus himself superintended in 1522. Its main topic is the relation between study of classical (hence pre-Christian, or “pagan”) authors and the faith of Christian readers. The colloquy ends not with a philosophical conclusion but with a friendly consensus that the noblest and best works by classical authors who wrote on moral issues are harmonious with the Christian faith, and perhaps providentially intended to prepare the Roman world to accept the new religion (CWE 39:171–243). An even more clear example of Erasmus' use of the Colloquies as a way to promote his opinions is his Inquisitio de fide, published in a further expanded edition of 1524. Although he must have been working on his attack on Luther at the same period, he was still convinced that while Luther was often offensive and extreme, he (or at least his followers) was not a heretic. In the conversation between a Catholic who regards Luther as a heretic and his friend who sympathizes with Luther, the discussion demonstrates that Luther's followers accept all articles of the most basic statement of Christian belief, the Apostles' Creed, and hence cannot be dismissed as heretics. Any matters on which they disagree with traditional religion are of limited importance and do not justify a schism (CWE 39:418–447). The Apostles' Creed is certain, because it has been sanctioned by centuries of use in the church and acceptance by all believers over many centuries. The issues currently under debate in the church, on the other hand, have not been decided by the authority of the church and therefore cannot be determined with sufficient conviction to justify the breaking of unity. This discussion ends in a probable conclusion; the procedure is rhetorical and assumes a skeptical attitude toward a more definitive resolution of the religious debate.
Another of Erasmus' most popular and widely read works, his satire The Praise of Folly, written in 1509, first published in 1511, and significantly expanded in several revised editions between 1514 and 1521, is equally rhetorical in nature. It is not a dialogue but an oration, or dramatic monologue, in which a personified Folly expresses her opinion on a variety of controversial social, political, intellectual, and religious issues. Its genre is satire. In it, the speaker, Folly, shifts her persona at several points, sometimes putting forth opinions presented seriously and at other times engaging in humorous but meaningful self-criticism. In both the original text and the additions made in later editions, there are sharply critical remarks about the church, theologians, monks, the clergy, but also about political leaders and most of the learned professions. The monologue is clearly rhetorical as well as satirical, for the purpose is not to establish rational proofs but to ruminate on matters of opinion. At the end, the discussion shifts to the Bible, which is contrasted with the contentious and useless doctrines of the theologians, and the final section emphasizes “the folly of the Cross,” the willingness of the Son of God to suffer pain and death for the salvation of a sinful humanity. Measured against worldly conceptions of the good life, Christian belief itself is folly, since it values holiness and matters of the spirit far above the material goods for which human wisdom strives.
In his only two explicitly theological works, De libero arbitrio and Hyperaspistes, both directed against Martin Luther's assertion that the human will is enslaved by sin, Erasmus presents a rhetorical defense of his own belief that the will is (to some degree) free by explicitly adopting a skeptical point of view. This controversy has been discussed in the preceding section and will not be repeated here. Neither of Erasmus' two theological treatises against Luther involves a study of epistemology, but he relied on the skeptical implications of rhetorical discussion to make his case for free will.
The sheer bulk of Erasmus' writing is enormous. The complete edition of his works put together under the direction of the administrator of his estate, Bonifacius Amerbach, Opera omnia, filled nine large volumes, published at Basel in 1540. This collection, with a few titles added from time to time, was reprinted several times until the early eighteenth century, when an even more comprehensive edition in nine folio volumes appeared. This edition is still the most complete, and is still the standard source for works not yet published in a modern critical edition; but such a modern edition is in course of publication. In the early twentieth century, Erasmus' letters were collected and published in a critical edition by P.S. Allen and his associates. Letters from the correspondence are normally cited by the sign Ep and the sequential number of the letter in Allen's edition; the same letter numbers are valid for the ongoing edition of Erasmus' correspondence in English translation, an integral part of the series Erasmus in English, in course of publication by the University of Toronto Press. The standard citation forms follow, in alphabetical order, with “Erasmus, Desiderius,” as the universal author entry:
|Allen||Opus epistolarum Des. Erasmi Roterodami, 11 vols + index volume. Edited by P.S. Allen and others. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1906–1958.|
|ASD||Opera omnia. Amsterdam: North Holland Publishing Co., 1969. (Many volumes, with critical introductions and annotations, have already appeared.)|
|CWE||Collected Works of Erasmus. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1974-. (English translation of all works of Erasmus, in course of publication. Many volumes have already appeared. Where a particular work has appeared in ASD [see above], the English translation is based on the ASD text. The Correspondence subseries is incorporated into CWE. Except for a small number of letters discovered after the publication of Allen, the English translation is based on the Latin text in Allen.)|
|LB||Opera omnia. 10 vols. Edited by Johannes Clericus. Lugduni Batavorum [Leiden]: Peter van der Aa, 1703–1706. (LB is commonly used for the Latin text of works not yet published in ASD.)|
In addition to these texts, a number of works not included in LB were discovered after its publication and edited by Wallace K. Ferguson as Erasmi opuscula. The Hague: M. Nijhoff, 1933. The present article contains no citations from this source.
There have been many biographies of Erasmus, some of high quality and some highly partisan and tendentious. The following are among the best available in English:
- Augustijn, Cornelis (1991). Erasmus: His Life, Works, and Influence. Translated by J.C. Grayson. Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
- Bainton, Roland H. (1969). Erasmus of Christendom. New York: Charles Scribner's Sons.
- Halkin, Léon-E. (1993). Erasmus: A Critical Biography. Translated by John Tonkin. Oxford: Blackwell.
- Huizinga, J[ohan]. (1952). Erasmus of Rotterdam. Translated by F. Hopman. London: Phaidon Publishers Inc. Reprint of first English-language edition, New York, 1924.
- McConica, James (1991). Erasmus. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Phillips, Margaret Mann. (1949) Erasmus and the Northern Renaissance. London: Hodder & Stoughton Limited, for The English Universities Press.
- Schoeck, Richard J. (1960). Erasmus of Europe: The Making of a Humanist, 1467–1500. Savage, MD: Barnes & Noble Books.
- ––– (1993). Erasmus of Europe: The Prince of Humanists, 1501–1536. Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.
- Tracy, James D. (1996) Erasmus of the Low Countries. Berkeley: University of California Press.
- ––– (1972). Erasmus: The Growth of a Mind. (Travaux d’Humanisme et Renaissance, 126.) Geneva: Librairie Droz.
Interest in Erasmus has produced a great number of publications, addressed to both scholarly and general audiences. What follows is a rather small selection from this vast literature. Readers should also be aware that some of the introductions to the texts published in ASD and CWE contain valuable discussions of questions of broad interest for understanding Erasmus' thought. Not all books listed below are cited in the text.
- Adams, Robert P. (1962). The Better Part of Valor: More, Erasmus, Colet, and Vives, on Humanism, War, and Peace, 1496–1535. Seattle: University of Washington Press.
- Béné, Charles. (1969). Érasme et Saint Augustin: Influence de Saint Augustin sur l’humanisme d’Érasme. (Travaux d’Humanisme et Renaissance, 103.) Geneva: Librairie Droz.
- Bentley, Jerry H. (1983). Humanists and Holy Writ: New Testament Scholarship in the Renaissance. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
- Boyle, Marjorie O'Rourke (1977). Erasmus on Language and Method in Theology. Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
- ––– (1983). Rhetoric and Reform: Erasmus' Civil Dispute with Luther. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
- Chantraine, Georges (1981). Érasme et Luther, libre et serf arbitre: Étude historique et théologique. Namur: Presses Universitaires de Namur.
- Chomarat, Jacques (1981). Grammaire et rhétorique chez Érasme, 2 vols. Paris: Société d’Édition “Les Belles Lettres.”
- Christ-v. Wedel, Christine (1981). Das Nichtwissen bei Erasmus von Rotterdam: Zum philosophischen und theologischen in der geistigen Entwicklung eines christlichen Humanisten. (Basler Beiträge zur Geschichtswissenschaft, 142). Basel: Verlag Helbing & Lichtenhahn.
- Gleason, John (1989). John Colet. Berkeley: University of California Press.
- Godin, André (1982). Érasme, lecteur d’Origène. (Travaux d’Humanisme et Renaissance, 190.) Geneva: Librairie Droz.
- Hoffmann, Manfred (1994). Rhetoric and Theology: The Hermeneutic of Erasmus. Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
- Holeczek, Heinz (1984). “Erasmus' Stellung zur Reformation: Studia humanitatis und Kirchenreform.” In Renaissance-Reformation: Gegensätze und Gemeinsamkeiten, 131–153. Edited by August Buck. (Wolfenbütteler Abhandlungen zur Renaissanceforschung, 5.) Wiesbaden: Otto Harrassowitz.
- Jardine, Lisa (1993). Erasmus, Man of Letters: The Construction of Charisma in Print. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
- Kohls, Ernst-Wilhelm (1966). Die Theologie des Erasmus, 2 vols. (Theologische Zeitschrift, Sonderband I, 1 and 2). Basel: Friedrich Reinhardt Verlag.
- Kristeller, Paul Oskar (1961). Renaissance Thought: The Classic, Scholastic, and Humanist Strains. New York: Harper & Brothers.
- McConica, James Kelsey (1969). “Erasmus and the Grammar of Consent.” In Scrinium Erasmianum, 2: 77–99. Edited by J[oseph]. Coppens. 2 vols. Leiden: E.J. Brill.
- Mann, Margaret (1934). Érasme et les débuts de la Réforme française. Paris: Librairie Ancienne Honoré Champion.
- Mansfield, Bruce (2003). Erasmus in the Twentieth Century. Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
- ––– (1979). Phoenix of His Age: Interpretations of Erasmus, c. 1550–1750. Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
- Nauert, Charles G. (2006). Humanism and the Culture of Renaissance Europe, 2nd ed. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. (Chapters 4, 5, and 7 discuss Erasmus and Erasmian humanism.)
- Oberman, Heiko A. Luther: Man between God and the Devil. Translated by Eileen Walliser-Schwarzbart. New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 1989.
- Payne, John B. (1970). Erasmus: His Theology of the Sacraments. Richmond, VA: John Knox Press.
- Phillips, Margaret Mann (1964). The ‘Adages' of Erasmus: A Study with Translations. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Pineau, J.-B. (1924). Érasme: Sa pensée religieuse. Paris: Les Presses Universitaires de France.
- Popkin, Richard H. (1960). The History of Scepticism from Erasmus to Descartes. Assen, The Netherlands: Van Gorcum & Comp. N.V.
- Post, R.R. (1968). The Modern Devotion: Confrontation with Reformation and Humanism. (Studies in Medieval and Reformation Thought, 3.) Leiden: E.J. Brill.
- Rummel, Erika (1989). Erasmus and His Catholic Critics, 2 vols. (Bibliotheca Humanistica et Reformatorica, 45.) Nieuwkoop: De Graaf Publishers.
- ––– (1986). Erasmus' Annotations on the New Testament: From Philologist to Theologian. Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
- ––– (1985). Erasmus as a Translator of the Classics. Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
- Thomson, D.F.S. (1963). Erasmus and Cambridge: The Cambridge Letters of Erasmus. Introduction by H.C. Porter. Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
- Tracy, James D. (2005). The Low Countries in the Sixteenth Century: Erasmus, Religion and Politics, Trade and Finance. Aldershot, Hants., United Kingdom: Ashgate/Variorum.
- ––– (1978). The Politics of Erasmus: A Pacifist Intellectual and His Political Milieu. Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
- List of webpages containing texts by Erasmus, provided through a search of EpistemeLinks.com.
- Erasmus, article by Jean-Claude Margolin, originally published in Prospects: The Quarterly Review of Comparative Education (Paris, UNESCO: International Bureau of Education), Volume XXIII, Number 1/2, 1993, pp. 333–352.
Aquinas, Saint Thomas | Aristotle | Aristotle, General Topics: rhetoric | Augustine, Saint | Cicero | ethics: ancient | Ficino, Marsilio | free will | humanism: in the Renaissance | pacifism | Pico della Mirandola, Giovanni | Plato | Plotinus | Plutarch | Seneca | skepticism | skepticism: ancient | Socrates | Valla, Lorenzo