Feminist Perspectives on Sex Markets
Sex markets have been a concern to feminists because, historically, the “skin trade” has relied predominantly on female service providers and male consumers. Feminist theorists are divided on the question of whether markets in pornographic materials and sexual services pose a threat to women in all contexts. Some feminist theorists argue that when one is paid for sex, a person contracts to give away her freedom and sexuality. Others argue that selling sex harms women only because the work carries a stigma generated from double standards of sexual morality and negative attitudes to sex, which need to be challenged. The debate over sex commerce extends to a number of social practices, including pornography, prostitution, escort services, erotic dancing and strip shows, phonesex and cybersex, and s/m parlors and swing clubs. Feminist philosophers have primarily focused on the issues of pornography and prostitution, and have subsumed the other practices under one of these broad categories.
- 1. Pornography
- 2. Prostitution
- 3. New Directions
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Pornography emerged in Europe as a distinct cultural genre with the development of mass print culture in the nineteenth century (Hunt 1996, 10). Historians of Europe tell us that pornographic works appeared and flourished at a time when modern democratic states and industrial-capitalist economies were being formed. Pornographic literature and engravings were often vehicles for promoting new political and scientific ideas. (Hunt 1996). Today, sexually graphic publications occasionally have a political aim, but the majority of such materials are marketed for sexual titillation, entertainment, and instruction. Religious and secular moralists have frequently condemned pornography for its harmful impact on sexual mores, children, and public order and decency. As a result, pornography has been regulated in a variety of ways; in the U.S., pornographic materials can violate obscenity statutes if they appeal to “prurient interests,” are offensive to the “average person,” and lack “serious literary, artistic, political, or scientific value” (Miller v. California 1973).
Pornography became a focus of feminist activism as second-wave feminists began to challenge various forms of culturally entrenched violence against women, especially rape and domestic violence. Many feminists allege that pornographic films and magazines eroticize the sexual assault, torture, and exploitation of women. Feminists have debated whether pornography is merely a reflection of a sexist culture or a significant causal factor in the pervasive sexual violence against women. In the 1980s, feminist philosophers and legal theorists argued that pornographic works could precipitate sexual assaults against women because they endorse or recommend the violation and degradation of women (Longino 1980, 43). Helen Longino claims that pornography shows men and women taking pleasure in activities that objectify women and treat women as less than human. By depicting female subjects as dehumanized objects, pornography encourages the idea that women can be treated without moral regard — i.e., raped and tortured. Longino writes, “What's wrong with pornography, then, is its degrading and dehumanizing portrayal of women (and not its sexual content). Pornography, by its very nature, requires that women be subordinate to men and mere instruments for the fulfillment of male fantasies” (Longino 1980, 45).
Some years later, Catharine MacKinnon and Andrea Dworkin defined pornography, in their model ordinance, as “the graphic sexually explicit subordination of women” (MacKinnon 1993, 121, n. 32). The ordinance captured the developing feminist view that pornography is a form of defamatory speech against women and can precipitate invidious forms of discrimination against women. MacKinnon writes, “Women who charge men with sexual abuse are not believed. The pornographic view of them is: they want it; they all want it” (MacKinnon 1987, 191). In other words, by undermining women's ability to seek justice for sexual assaults and harassment, the production and dissemination of pornography promotes gender-based discrimination and oppression. Moreover, MacKinnon argues that “Specific pornography does directly cause some assaults. Some rapes are performed by men with paperback books in their pockets” (MacKinnon 1987, 184). MacKinnon claims both that pornography is used by men “to train women to sexual submission” (MacKinnon 1987, 188), and that “pornography conditions male orgasm to female subordination” (MacKinnon 1987, 190). In other words, pornography shapes both female and male sexual desire into victim/abuser roles that are then treated as natural forms of sexual and gender expression. Furthermore, pornography promotes rights violations not only of the female partners, friends, acquaintances, and relatives of the men who consume pornography, but also of the women who participate in its production, according to MacKinnon. This is because the acts caught on film in much pornography are allegedly coerced through intimidation and money. In MacKinnon's words, pornography represents “sex forced on real women so that it can be sold at a profit to be forced on other real women; women's bodies trussed and maimed and raped and made into things to be hurt and obtained and accessed, and this presented as the nature of women; the coercion that is visible and the coercion that has become invisible — this and more bothers feminists about pornography … pornography causes attitudes and behaviors of violence and discrimination that define the treatment and status of half of the population” (MacKinnon 1987, 147). In short, a number of feminists conclude that pornography is not simply a reflection of sexism and male domination, but that it “nourishes sexism” (Longino 1980, 54) by being a key component of the mechanism for producing and maintaining male domination.
Longino, MacKinnon, and others argue that pornography should not be given the same legal protection as other expressive materials, and recommend that pornography be strictly regulated. However, they advocate the legal regulation of pornography, not as a form of obscene expression, but as a practice that causes injuries to women, individually and as a group. Longino argues that liberal toleration for pornography constitutes toleration for civil and sexual harms against women (Longino 1980, 48). MacKinnon and Dworkin emphasize that, because women possess vastly unequal social power compared to men, women's participation in the production of pornography should not be considered fully consensual (MacKinnon 1987, 128, 148-49; Dworkin 1979, 201). Pornography, on their view, involves the coercive exploitation and public humiliation of vulnerable and disempowered citizens, and it encourages further abuse. For MacKinnon and Dworkin, pornography serves as a critical weapon in maintaining women's second-class social status, for it perpetuates a climate in which women are both defined as sexual objects and constantly threatened with violence, making it impossible for them to exercise whatever formal rights they have won. MacKinnon and Dworkin's model ordinance proposes to make “pornography actionable as a civil rights violation” so that women could seek legal redress when pornographic materials interfered with the exercise of their rights or caused personal harms (MacKinnon 1993, 22, 121, n. 32). They argue that, by protecting the speech of pornographers and shielding them from liability, the state fails to protect women's equality and freedom. MacKinnon writes, “The First Amendment essentially presumes some level of social equality among people … The First Amendment also presumes that for the mind to be free to fulfill itself, speech must be free and open. Andrea's work shows that pornography contributes to enslaving women's minds and bodies. As a social process and as a form of ‘speech,’ pornography amounts to terrorism and promotes not freedom but silence. Rather it promotes freedom for men and enslavement and silence for women” (MacKinnon 1987, 129-130). In sum, a number of feminist theorists maintain that the legal and social suppression of pornography is necessary to achieve gender equality and to resist the oppression of women.
Not all feminist theorists concur with the feminist critique of pornography. While agreeing that the content of pornography condones the objectionable treatment of women, Ann Garry was one of the first to question whether pornography should be held responsible for pervasive gender-based violence and discrimination. Garry writes, “Much of the research on the effects of pornography indicates that any effect it has — positive or negative –is short lived” (Garry 1979, 132). Garry also questions whether treating a woman as a sex object is always bad, and suggests that pornography succeeds in harming women, in part, because viewers assume that sex is generally harmful to women (Garry 1979, 136-37). Garry encourages feminists to support the production of non-sexist pornography rather than try to suppress pornographic materials. Many of the themes of Garry's early essay have persisted in the ongoing feminist pornography debate: the causal properties of pornographic works, the moral significance of sexual objectification, and the legal suppression of pornography.
Reviewing the social science literature on the connection between pornography and rape, Diana Scully writes, “the proliferation of cultural products, like pornography, intensifies the quantity and quality of violence in men's fantasies. Further, particularly when women are depicted as receiving pleasure from the violence directed at them, pornography trivializes rape and, thus, may encourage more men to act on their fantasies. Armed with the myths celebrated in violent pornography, such as women secretly want to be raped, men who rape can and do believe that their behavior is within the normative boundaries of the culture” (Scully 1990, 155). Unlike earlier research, which involved somewhat artificial laboratory experiments to detect the effects of exposure to pornography (56-57), Scully's research compares the consumption of pornographic materials by convicted rapists with a control group of felons. Although she notes some problems with her research design, she concludes that her “data do establish that the majority of convicted rapists were familiar with pornography and that their use of such material was somewhat greater than that of other felons” (Scully 1990, 154).
Deborah Cameron and Elizabeth Frazer question whether accounts of the causal properties of pornography are helpful or illuminating. They argue that such accounts assume a deterministic model of human behavior, in which men lose control over their behavior and respond somewhat mindlessly to pornographic stimuli (Cameron & Frazer 2000, 248-251). The idea that men simply imitate what they see in pornography, or are conditioned to behave in certain ways through exposure to pornography, implies that men are not able to creatively and critically interpret pornographic materials. Although some men may unthinkingly copy what they see, or may even become “addicted” to sexual violence through pornography, these men are the exception, not the rule (Cameron & Frazer 2000, 243). By treating sexual violence as a product of exposure to pornography, feminists promote a view that relieves sexual predators of responsibility for their actions, and blames their actions instead on expressive materials or the pathological conditions they allegedly cause. Although causal theories invoking the loss of the individual control through “imitation” and “addiction” may be useful to defendants in sexual assault and murder cases, Cameron and Frazer point out that these theories undermine the feminist goal of showing that sexual violence is a function of cultural norms and structural inequalities, rather than mental debilitation or disease (Cameron & Frazer 2000, 248). Ironically, causal models may engender social sympathy for the perpetrators of sexual violence and make it difficult to punish them (Cameron and Frazer 2000, 247). Cameron and Frazer conclude that feminists can be critical of “the discourses which inform sexual practice” and imagine alternative discourses, without promoting problematic models of human behavior (Cameron & Frazer 2000, 253).
Some feminist philosophers enlist the tools of speech act theory to explicate the causal properties of pornography, especially the idea that pornography subordinates and silences women. Rae Langton argues that pornographic speech subordinates by virtue of its illocutionary force (Langton 1995, 215). Drawing on the work of John Austin, Langton points out that pornographic words and images are a form of action. For example, by uttering the words “I promise,” “thank you,” or “you're fired” someone may complete the acts of making a promise, thanking, or disemploying someone. Austin distinguished the actions performed by words (illocutionary force) from their literal content (locutionary force), and their effect on particular listeners (perlocutionary force). The literal content of a pornographic work may be the depiction of a particular sexual act, and this may have the effect of arousing particular viewers and shaping their attitudes toward women. The illocutionary force of a pornographic work pertains to the actions performed in depicting sex and women. For example, just as a sign that says “Whites Only” may subordinate Blacks and authorize racial segregation in certain contexts, a pornographic work may, by virtue of its illocutionary force, subordinate women and endorse sexually predatory behaviors. The illocutionary force of a particular utterance will depend on a variety of factors, including the intentions of the speaker and the background conventions that link the literal meanings of words with social practices. Langton argues that there are good, though not conclusive, reasons to think that the factors which determine the hostile illocutionary force of pornographic texts are in place. However, she also suggests that the illocutionary force of pornography may be blocked effectively by the speech acts of its critics, rather than by censorship (Langton 1995, 216).
Jennifer Hornsby deploys speech act theory to explain how pornography silences women. According to Hornsby, pornographic materials reinforce ideas about women that deprive their utterances of their ordinary illocutionary meaning (Hornsby 1995, 227). For example, pornographic works may convey the idea that the women which men find sexy are eager to satisfy their sexual appetites, so that when women say “no,” their utterance constitutes not an act of refusal but an act of teasing. In this way, pornography may reinforce social codes that allow men to systematically misread and discount women's speech. Women may be silenced, then, not by having their speech suppressed but by changes to the background conditions necessary for successful speech acts, such as refusal. If pornography interferes with the ability of women to communicate, then women cannot contest the harm of pornography with more speech, but only by suppressing pornographic materials.
Nadine Strossen has challenged the claim that pornography subordinates and silences women. Strossen argues that pornographic works do not have singular meanings, nor do they command only sexist understandings. In her words: “Procensorship feminists may well view a woman's apparent welcoming of sex with a man as degrading, but this is because of their negative attitudes toward women's ability to make sexual choices. Other viewers are likely to see such a scene as positive and healthy” (Strossen 1995, 162). Furthermore, according to Strossen, “Ambiguous and positive interpretations apply to the full range of sexual speech, including violent imagery and imagery that might well be labeled ‘subordinating’ or ‘degrading,’ such as rape scenes and scenes dramatizing the so-called rape myth — namely that women want to be raped” (Strossen 1995, 146). To illustrate that pornographic texts can produce divergent responses, Strossen examines opposing reactions to films that depict rape, to controversial images of women in popular advertisements or print media, and even to Andrea Dworkin's own sexually graphic novels. Strossen claims that the effect on some viewers, including women, may be positive: “Pornography, including pornographic rape scenes, may serve another, intensely political end for women who read or see them: they go against the grain, thus allowing viewers to express rebellion and individuality. In this sense, too, words or images that literally depict a woman's powerlessness may well have an empowering impact on female viewers” (Strossen 1995, 174). The existence of divergent interpretations and responses to pornographic works challenges the idea that pornography has any single, harmful impact on the background conditions of communication. And without any single, persistent impact on background understandings, it is doubtful that pornographic works would have the power to silence or subordinate women, in any or all contexts. In some contexts, Strossen suggests, pornographic works can even invite viewers to rebel against conventional notions of female vulnerability and respectability, or to explore the origins of disturbing sexual fantasies. At the very least, such materials make aspects of human sexuality available for public debate and critique (Strossen 1995, 176). Ironically, as Georgia Warnke notes, anti-censorship feminists might charge that “antipornography feminism silences women's differing sexual self-expressions by condemning those with which it disagrees as false consciousness … [and] by promoting legislation that would suppress materials through which women can discover different views of an authentic sexuality and, indeed, different ways of being sexual” (Warnke 1999, 124).
Some feminist philosophers argue that pornography violates the moral imperative to treat people as autonomous, rational subjects. According to Alison Assiter, “the Master-Slave dialectic seems to capture the relation between people in pornographic eroticism. In much pornography, people, usually women, become objects for another … In the case of pornography, what happens is that the one person becomes a body desired by the other, but this is not reciprocated” (Assiter 1988, 65). To treat someone as merely a body for another's use, without recognizing that she too is a subject with desires, is to treat someone as a slave, as a subhuman creature or object, and therefore violates her dignity as a human being. Assiter explains that, for Hegel, “‘the Master-Slave dialectic’ is a phase in the development of world history — in the progression towards freedom of the ‘Spirit’ that controls historical change. In fact, the relation is disadvantageous both for the slave and for the master” (Assiter 1988, 65), for neither gains the forms of recognition necessary for self-conscious awareness and emotional fulfillment. Assiter also argues that “the role of the wife in marriage is very like that of the Slave” for the wife's social identity is subsumed by her husband, who holds social power, and thus she is not a social subject in her own right (Assiter 1988, 65).
Harry Brod argues that pornography harms men individually even while it augments men's collective power (Brod 1992, 158). Brod also employs a Hegelian framework and writes, “The female is primarily there as a sex object, not sexual subject. Or, if she is not completely objectified, since men do want to be desired themselves, hers is at least a subjugated subjectivity. But one needs another independent subject, not an object or a captured subjectivity, if one either wants one's own prowess validated, or if one simply desires human interaction. Men functioning in the pornographic mode of male sexuality, in which men dominate women, are denied satisfaction of these human desires” (Brod 1992, 154). For Brod then, pornography enhances men's political power over women, while diminishing the quality of men's intersubjective relationships with women, and thereby contributes to the loss of positive human interaction and self-realization. Brod also argues that pornography contributes to the commodification of sexuality, which enhances men's powers as consumers, although not necessarily their genuine autonomy and freedom.
Catharine MacKinnon invokes Kant's idea of persons as ends to explain the moral problem of pornography: “A person, in one Kantian view, is a free and rational agent whose existence is an end in itself, as opposed to instrumental. In pornography women exist to the end of male pleasure” (MacKinnon 1987, 158). For MacKinnon, pornography involves men treating women as mere instruments in order to satisfy their sexual desires. Such treatment, at best, fails to recognize women as free and equal persons and, at worst, dehumanizes women and encourages their victimization. In response to MacKinnon's claims about the role of sexual objectification in women's lives, Martha Nussbaum has asked whether sexual objectification is always morally objectionable or whether it is only so in certain contexts (Nussbaum 1999, 214). Nussbaum identifies seven distinct kinds of actions that may or may not be part of objectification in any given instance: instrumentality, denial of autonomy, inertness, fungibility, violability, ownership, and denial of subjectivity (Nussbaum 1999, 218). Some of these actions are always morally problematic, but some of them are acceptable when they are part of a larger relationship involving mutual respect. Nussbaum writes, “Denial of autonomy and denial of subjectivity are objectionable if they persist throughout an adult relationship, but as phases in a relationship characterized by mutual regard they can be all right, or even quite wonderful … In a closely related way, it may at times be splendid to treat the other person as passive, or even inert. Emotional penetration of boundaries seems potentially a very valuable part of sexual life, and some forms of physical boundary penetration also, though it is less clear which ones these are. Treating as fungible is suspect when the person so treated is from a group that has frequently been commodified and used as a tool, or a prize; between social equals these problems disappear …” (Nussbaum 1999, 238-39). In other words, some actions in which we use another's body sexually are consistent with recognizing the person so used as an end and do not involve treating her as a mere object, in the Kantian sense. But Nussbaum concludes that most conventional pornography, such as Playboy, fails to meet the Kantian moral standard, and “depicts a thoroughgoing fungibility and commodification of sex partners and, in the process, severs sex from any deep connection with self-expression or emotion” (Nussbaum 1999, 234). Nussbaum therefore concurs with MacKinnon that Playboy treats women as mere objects or trophies that can both enhance men's status and be exchanged for the next sex object at will.
Linda LeMoncheck argues that the sexual fantasies depicted in pornography imply that women's subjectivities are recognized by the consumers of this material (LeMoncheck 1997, 133). The fantasy of overcoming a woman's will assumes that she has a will to overcome (LeMoncheck 1997, 131), and the fantasy that women enjoy being sexually exploited assumes that they have desires that men's sexual use fulfills (LeMoncheck 1997, 133). LeMoncheck writes, “sex work is not merely about treating a woman as an object nor merely about dehumanizing her. Sex work is a complex dialectic between subject and object in which a woman's dehumanization is successful precisely because she is perceived as a person whose will, seductiveness, and power is properly subordinate to men” (LeMoncheck 1997, 134). On this view, pornographic materials and porn consumers recognize women's agency while imagining subduing it. Women are thus recognized as subjects with ends of their own and are not depicted as mere subhuman objects. Susan Bordo similarly recognizes that women are constructed as subjects in pornography, but she argues that they are subjects whose agency expresses itself only as a desire to please the projected male viewer. She writes, “an essential ingredient in porn … is the depiction of a subjectivity (or personality) that willing contracts its possibilities and pleasure to one — the acceptance and gratification of the male … The woman in porn abdicates her will, her sexual discrimination, her independence, but not to become a mute body for the man” (Bordo 1994, 276). For Bordo, there is a mind inside the pornographic female body, but it communicates only a limited range of nonthreatening desires, and therefore it exists as a truncated self.
Laurie Shrage questions the Kantian account of sexual desire that underlies MacKinnon's analysis of sexual objectification (Shrage 2005). Kant holds that the expression and fulfillment of sexual desire are uniquely powerful in their ability to dehumanize and objectify others. Sexual desire is fundamentally an animal urge that is fulfilled by taking control of another's body in a way that disrespects their autonomy and humanity, in almost all contexts. MacKinnon turns Kant's “anti-sex” view into an “anti-porn” one by arguing that the expression and fulfillment of sexual desire under patriarchy involves men taking control of women's bodies in a way that fails to respect women as persons. Shrage argues that Kant and MacKinnon illegitimately assume that the expression and fulfillment of sexual desire are uniquely powerful in their ability to objectify others, and both equate sexualizing someone with the failure to respect her humanity and autonomy. Shrage debunks these assumptions, in part by appealing to Nussbaum's critique of Kant's account of sexual desire. Shrage argues that the use of others involved in pornography is not incompatible with respect for their autonomy and personhood, as long as consumers and producers respect the ends of porn actors. These ends include the desire to exploit for economic gain others' sexual interest in them and their bodies within the conventional boundaries set by various genres of sexual representation and entertainment. The relationship between porn stars and consumers of their images are market relationships and should be held to the norms of those relationships, not the norms of friendships and romance. If sex workers need help from feminists, it should be aimed at protecting their rights as workers, not at protecting them from being sexualized by men outside the personal or family sphere.
Jennifer Saul explores the possible connection between objectification—treating people as things—and personification—treating things as people. Saul critiques earlier feminist claims that men's use of pornographic images involves treating pieces of paper like women, and therefore involves conflating women with inanimate instruments (Saul 2006, 49-50). The inclusion of real women and pornography in a single category—e.g., the category of entities that can arouse and satisfy sexual desire—can undermine respect for women and promote oppressive practices. Saul argues that personification and objectification are only linked in troubling ways if some conditions for morally problematic objectification are already met. Saul draws on Rachel Maines's historical work on the development of a device now known as the personal vibrator and contends that women's use of vibrators to achieve sexual pleasure and orgasm represents a form of personification. For some women, vibrators eventually replaced a service that had been provided by doctors (and midwives and spas). Yet this is not a troubling form of personification—one linked to troubling forms of objectification—because doctors are not likely to be confused with sex toys as a result of women's masturbatory use of vibrating technology. Doctors have other acknowledged medical uses, as well as ends of their own. Therefore, the transformation of their historical role in treating sexually frustrated (or “hysteric”) women, by both new understandings of women's reproductive and sexual health and advancements in vibrator technology, does not contribute to the oppression of doctors. Saul's discussion of the possible equation of people and things, and the background circumstances that may permit this, is useful for considering some new technological developments in pornography. New digital imaging and personal computer technologies enable users to interact and “have sex” with playmate animations on one's computer screen. Computer-mediated interactions with digitally-simulated but fictional people can sometimes be difficult to distinguish from computer-mediated online interactions with real people. Yet such pornographic possibilities do not necessarily involve morally troubling objectification, as long as background conditions enable the recognition of women as subjects, and the recognition more generally of flesh and blood humans as autonomous agents.
MacKinnon and Dworkin's model ordinance has met with mixed support from feminist theorists. Martha Nussbaum, who is sympathetic to MacKinnon and Dworkin's analysis of pornography's contribution to the subordination of women, offers four reservations in regard to their ordinance: (1) the justification for the ordinance fails to distinguish between moral wrongs that are legally actionable and those that are not; (2) violence against women has a variety of causes and it is difficult to isolate the distinct contribution of pornography; (3) making authors responsible for the criminal actions that their work may inspire is likely to have a chilling effect on valuable expression; and (4) officials and courts are likely to misapply the ordinance to controversial but not harmful speech (Nussbaum 1999, 248-249). However, Nussbaum rejects simple appeals to the First Amendment to protect pornographic speech, as she notes that not all speech is protected by the First Amendment (Nussbaum 1999, 247). She also notes that makers of other vice-type products, such as tobacco, can be held liable for the damaging effects of their products, and that other Western democratic countries permit restrictions on hate speech. Nevertheless, Nussbaum suggests that the harms of pornography can be addressed through moral dialogue and cultural critique.
A number of feminist theorists have claimed that women are consumers of pornography, and are not merely the objects on view. Some argue that pornography is about voyeurism and that women, like men, take pleasure in looking at depictions of sex. To explore women's use of pornography, feminist scholars have studied soft-core pornographic genres that are marketed to women, such as pulp romance fiction (Radway 1991). Some have studied lesbian pornography to challenge the idea that pornography always involves men subordinating women (Ross 2000). In 1986, a group of feminists published Caught Looking: Feminism, Pornography, and Censorship, which argues that feminists have targeted pornography out of frustration with their lack of progress in reducing violence against women. The book showcases a variety of pornographic imagery in order to illustrate the types of materials that may be restricted under feminist-supported legal regulations. In the introduction, Kate Ellis, Barbara O'Dair and Abby Tallmer argue that “the feminist movement must not be drawn, in the name of protecting women, into the practice of censoring ‘deviant’ sexual representation or expression … Women had to learn, with the support of other women, to articulate experiences that lay outside the proper sphere of the ‘nice girl,’ to acknowledge our fantasies, and to be proud of our sexual choices … We must speak out when we are victims, but also acknowledge what excites us, and support women who make their living providing that excitement to men and to ourselves” (Ellis et al. 1986, 6). Ann Snitow advocates recentering feminist sexuality discussions on “the right to demand a sexuality more centered on female pleasure,” instead of focusing on controlling male sexuality (Snitow 1986, 11).
In Caught Looking, Lisa Duggan, Nan Hunter, and Carole Vance ask “How can feminists be entrusting the patriarchal state with the task of legally distinguishing between permissible and impermissible sexual images?” (Duggan, Hunter, & Vance 1986, 73). They argue that the task of evaluating the material targeted by MacKinnon-Dworkin ordinances, in terms of the definitions articulated, is quite complicated and subjective. Moreover, such ordinances would surely be applied materials depicting consensual SM, and thus allow the state to persecute sexual minorities. These authors give three further reasons for opposing these laws: “first, the sexual images in question do not cause more harm than other aspects of misogynist culture; second, sexually explicit speech, even in male-dominated society, serves positive social functions for women; and third, the passage and enforcement of antipornography laws such as those supported in Minneapolis and Indiana [MacKinnon-Dworkin ordinances] are more likely to impede, rather than advance, feminist goals” (Duggan Hunter, & Vance 1986, 80-81). More recently, Gayle Rubin has argued that “The scapegoating of pornography will create new problems, new forms of legal and social abuse, and new modes of persecution. A responsible and progressive political movement has no business pursuing strategies that will result in witch-hunts” (Rubin 1993, 38).
Judith Butler examines the role of fantasy in feminist politics and argues for maintaining conditions that permit diverse representations of women. Butler writes, “feminist theory relies on the capacity to postulate through fantasy a future that is not yet” (Butler 2000, 487). According to Butler, antipornography feminists uncritically assume a representational realist ontology in which “depictions” imitate and can causally affect some preexisting reality. Butler argues for a more complex understanding of the relation between representations and their referents, focusing both on the ways that representations can call into question the ontological status of entities and on how ‘the real’ is produced through social action. Curtailing representations will produce new forms of social action rather than protect some undisturbed, preferred version of reality. In Butler's words, “certain kinds of efforts to restrict practices of representation in the hopes of reigning in the imaginary, controlling the phantasmatic, end up reproducing and proliferating the phantasmatic in inadvertent ways, indeed, in ways that contradict the intended purposes of the restrictions itself” (Butler 2000, 490). Butler points out that efforts to censor homoerotic images have led to their greater production and exposure. She concludes that, “Feminist theory and politics cannot regulate the representation of ‘women’ without producing that very ‘representation’: and if that is in some sense a discursive inevitability of representational politics, then the task must be to safeguard the open productivity of those categories, whatever the risk” (Butler 2000, 503).
Butler's view fits in well with feminists who call for more speech as the answer to noxious speech. On this view, disturbing representations of “real sex” should be contested by different representations of sexuality. Drucilla Cornell develops this approach by arguing that “Political action, not legal action, should be the main mode of intervention in the production of pornography” (Cornell 2000, 551). By political action, Cornell means that feminists should form alliances with feminists in the pornography industry to create representations of sexuality that will benefit women. Like Snitow, Cornell argues that feminist activism should focus “on unleashing the feminine imaginary, rather than on constraining men” (Cornell 2000, 553). Moreover, Cornell examines the film and performance work of Candida Royalle, Ona Zee, and Annie Sprinkle to show how “femme” and feminist pornography challenges the ways that conventional pornography captures women and sex. Like Butler, Cornell emphasizes the importance of fantasy for realizing transformative feminist projects. She writes “Without new images and new words in which to express our sexuality, we will be unable to create a new world for women” (Cornell 2000, 564). Furthermore, Cornell criticizes MacKinnon and Dworkin's model ordinance for its tendency to enshrine an old stereotype of woman in the law — woman as vulnerable and in need of protection. She alleges that the ordinance approach relies on the law to enforce social norms and thus fails to struggle “beyond those symbolic forms that have been deeply inscribed in and by the structures of gender” (Cornell 2000, 554).
Whereas the rise of the pornography industry coincided with the emergence of communication technologies, prostitution, it is often said, is the “world's oldest profession.” The historian Gerda Lerner elaborates this idea by explaining that “the most widespread and accepted explanation of the origin of prostitution” is that it began with temple prostitution in places such as ancient Mesopotamia (Lerner 1986, 125). Lerner analyzes “cultic sexual service” in ancient Babylon, in which temple workers and patrons offered sexual services to the gods, often as part of fertility rituals. According to Lerner, “What seems to have happened was that sexual activity for and in behalf of the god or goddesses was considered beneficial to the people and sacred. The practices varied with the gods, the different places and different periods. There was also, especially in the later period, commercial prostitution, which flourished near or within the temple” (Lerner 1986, 125). Lerner argues that scholars have conflated cultic and commercial prostitution, ignoring their distinct social purposes and organizational structures. Moreover, she argues that to understand how prostitution evolved historically, we need to understand “its relationship to the sexual regulation of all women in archaic states and its relationship to the enslavement of females” (Lerner 1986, 124). Lerner writes, “It is likely that commercial prostitution derived directly from the enslavement of women and the consolidation and formation of classes. Military conquest led, in the third millennium B.C., to the enslavement and sexual abuse of captive women. As slavery became an established institution, slave-owners rented out their female slaves as prostitutes, and some masters set up commercial brothels staffed by slaves” (Lerner 1986, 133). Lerner suggests that prostitutes and concubines were used by rulers as symbols of wealth and power, and this practice was then emulated by other men of wealth and status (Lerner 1986, 133). Also, paupers were often forced to sell children, adding to the supply of labor for this purpose. Furthermore, “As the sexual regulation of women of the propertied class became more firmly entrenched, the virginity of respectable daughters became a financial asset for the family. Thus, commercial prostitution came to be seen as a social necessity for meeting the sexual needs of men” (Lerner 1986, 134). These practices created social hierarchies among women, in which women were distinguished on the basis of their sexual availability. At the high end were married women and their marriage-eligible virgin daughters, in the middle were concubines, and at the low end were unmarried temple prostitutes and slave women (Lerner 1986, 137). Although female slavery, concubinage, and temple prostitution are less common today, commercial prostitution and the custom of measuring a woman's social status in terms of her virginity and monogamy carry over to contemporary societies.
Lerner's account connects modern forms of prostitution to oppressive social practices: the enslavement of women and the treatment of non-slave females as sexual property to be exchanged both in and out of marriage. By contrast, rather than attribute the rise of commercial prostitution to slavery and capitalist class formation, Gayle Rubin traces the origins of prostitution to kinship systems in which women are exchanged as gifts among families to cement social bonds (Rubin 1975, 175). Rubin writes, “If women are the gifts, then it is men who are the exchange partners. And it is the partners, not the presents, upon whom reciprocal exchange confers its quasi-mystical power of social linkage. The relations of such a system are such that women are in no position to realize the benefits of their own circulation. As long as the relations specify that men exchange women, it is men who are the beneficiaries of the product of such exchanges — social organization” (Rubin 1975, 174). In other words, in the very creation of society, women were allegedly subordinated through ritual exchange in order to create bonds of kinship among men as the foundation of the social order. Whereas Lerner's account was influenced by Friedrich Engels's writings about the institution of private property and its impact on sexual practices, Rubin's account was influenced by Claude Lévi-Strauss's writings on kinship and marriage systems. Rubin writes “The ‘exchange of women’ is a seductive and powerful concept. It is attractive in that it places the oppression of women within social systems, rather than biology. Moreover, it suggests that we look for the ultimate locus of women's oppression within the traffic in women, rather than within the traffic in merchandise” (Rubin 1975, 175). On both Lerner's and Rubin's accounts, prostitution (women engaging in sexual activities for extrinsic rewards) and trafficking in women (control over women's sexual capacities by others) predates the commodification of things, and it is a transhistorical, transcultural phenomenon that takes on different forms in different contexts.
Laurie Shrage criticizes these origin stories for their assumption that prostitution is a single, culturally familiar social practice, which can be traced to a single cause — the global subordination of women at a particular moment in human history. Shrage contends that, although Lerner's account locates the origins of prostitution in historical and cultural forces and marks important discontinuities in prostitution in different contexts (i.e., temple vs. commercial prostitution), it assumes that patriarchy shaped commercial prostitution in all contexts in similar ways. Shrage points out that Rubin's account fails to explain why women, rather than men or opposite-sex pairs, were exchanged in early kinship systems (a possibility that Lévi-Strauss acknowledged), and thus it does not really explain how men have gained some control over women's sexual capacities (Shrage 1994, 105, 131-32). Shrage tries to show how these accounts import into the past features of prostitution that developed in contemporary, industrialized capitalist societies. By trying to explain contemporary prostitution and trafficking in persons in terms of earlier historical and cultural developments, these accounts overlook important differences in sex commerce in different cultural and historical contexts. For example, commercial sex providers have not always been regarded as ineligible for marriage and have, in some places, been integrated into their communities to a high degree (Shrage 1994, 109, 115; White 1990, 19; Rossiaud 1988, 70). Shrage concludes that feminist analyses of prostitution should attempt to understand the variety and distinctness of different economic and cultural practices that are often lumped together as “prostitution.”
Carol Pateman deploys the basic concepts of liberal political theory to explain the existence of prostitution in modern societies. She argues that the social contract, which establishes the rights and freedoms of men in a liberal civil society, also establishes the terms of women's subjection. In the patriarchal social order, there is an implicit agreement among men granting them sexual access to women (Pateman 1988, 2). Men acquire rights to particular women through formal marital and informal prostitution contracts. In other words, men have a class privilege — a right to sexual relief from women — which they can exercise by asserting their rights as husbands or johns. Like Lerner and Rubin, Pateman challenges the notion that prostitution results from men's biologically driven behavior, and instead explains prostitution as the incorporation of a particular conception of masculinity into modern political and social structures (Pateman 1988, 198-99). For Pateman, the incorporation of prostitution into modern societies renders suspect political structures that are associated with freedom and equality. In this respect, Pateman's origin story differs from Lerner's and Rubin's, who associate prostitution with earlier practices of slavery or patriarchal and bourgeois kinship arrangements and thereby render prostitution a suspect social practice. Pateman condemns prostitution not merely for its problematic origins, but for other reasons that I will discuss below.
Regardless of its social origins, many feminists claim that sex work is harmful to women. Some allege that the harm results from inherent features of sex work, while others allege that the harm results from contingent features of the social environment in which it is performed. Carole Pateman argues that the work of a female prostitute is different from other jobs, as it expresses the inferior social and political status of women. Moreover, because people's bodies and sexual capacities are an integral part of their identity as men and women, the woman who works as a prostitute sells her womanhood and therefore herself (Pateman 1988, 207). Christine Overall similarly argues that prostitution is a transaction in which one person must be defined as a social subordinate who caters to the desires of another. She claims that the prostitute's work differs from that of other low-status workers in that it is a form of labor that cannot be reciprocated (Overall 1992, 718). Elizabeth Anderson develops this idea and argues that the good of sex is “realized only when each partner reciprocates the other's gift in kind, offering her own sexuality in the same spirit in which she received the other's — as a genuine offering of the self. The commodification of sexual ‘services’ destroys the kind of reciprocity required to realize human sexuality as a shared good,” and may corrupt non-market sexual relationships by promoting the valuation of women in terms of their market worth (Anderson 1993, 154-55; see also Radin 1996, 133). Contra these views, Shrage has argued that the prostitute's work is objectionable on feminist grounds, not because sex has an inherent purpose that markets can corrupt or because our sexual capacities have an essential relation to ourselves, but because sex markets are currently organized according to principles that relegate women to subordinate positions. Moreover, tolerating their existence in this form perpetuates social myths that stigmatize women (Shrage 1989, 357). Debra Satz similarly argues that “If prostitution is wrong it is because of its effects on how men perceive women and on how women perceive themselves. In our society, prostitution represents women as the sexual servants of men” (Satz 1995, 78). Satz conjectures that the negative image of women promoted by prostitution “shapes and influences the way women as a whole are seen” (Satz 1995, 79).
Martha Nussbaum questions whether the sale of sexual services genuinely damages the persons who provide them or women as a whole. Nussbaum points out that, two centuries ago, the use of one's artistic talents for pay, such as singing or acting, was regarded as a form of prostitution (Nussbaum 1999, 277). Nussbaum acknowledges that sex workers are currently stigmatized for their profession, but questions whether the stigma that attaches to their work is justified. By tracing this stigma both to aristocratic prejudice toward waged laborers and to moralistic attitudes and anxieties regarding female sexual expression, Nussbaum challenges the rational basis of the stigma (Nussbaum 1999, 278-79, 286-88). She concludes that feminists should oppose the stigmatization of sex work rather than oppose sex work for its contribution to the stigmatization of women. Nussbaum also questions seven common claims against prostitution: it involves excessive risks, the prostitute has little autonomy, it violates the prostitute's bodily integrity, prostitution has a destructive effect on non-commercial intimate relationships, prostitution violates a person's inalienable right to her sexuality, it contributes to a male-dominated social order, and it relies on the economic coercion of workers. Nussbaum argues that the problems associated with prostitution are components of many other kinds of work and social practices, such as marriage, and that these problems are not inherent to the work but are often a function of the prostitute's working conditions and treatment by others (Nussbaum 1999, 288-97).
Scott Anderson resists the move to treat prostitution like other forms of work. He argues that normalizing prostitution undermines the general right to sexual autonomy, which is an important value defended by radical feminists. Prostitutes waive their right to sexual autonomy because their jobs place them under contractual obligations to have sex, and thus diminish their control over when and with whom they have sex. Anderson acknowledges that all jobs, to some degree, diminish various forms of autonomy. He contends that sexual autonomy should be valued differently from other forms, such as a person's control over when and to whom they serve food, provide a massage or dance, offer expert advice, or talk philosophy. He writes, “a person's sexuality almost always figures prominently as an aspect of his or her self-conception, status in society, and economic and social prospects...It is because sex plays such a pivotal role in the lives of most adults...that it creates its own special...realm within which one can be more or less autonomous” (Anderson 2006, 386). Anderson here echoes Pateman's contention that our sexual capacities and practices are an integral part of who we are as men and women. Their arguments against prostitution rest on the assumption that sexuality should be non-alienable, like children or body parts, because to alienate these is to destroy a person's wholeness or integrity. According to Nancy Tuana and Laurie Shrage, many sex workers argue that they are not alienating their sexual capacities but rather their sexual labor. Selling labor under conditions that limit an employer's capacity to exploit a worker is generally permissible in capitalist societies (Tuana and Shrage 2003, 33). An actress performing a sex scene, a nurse taking care of a patient, a “nanny” taking care of an infant, are all exchanging intimate bodily labor and nurturing capacities that shape social identities and economic prospects (Shrage 1999, 260).
Kamala Kempadoo argues that “the global sex trade cannot be simply reduced to one monolithic explanation of violence to women” (Kempadoo 2001, 28). Kempadoo claims that older feminist models, which see prostitution as reflection of patriarchy or violence to women, are “inadequate to capture the various histories, oppression, and experiences of women of color” (Kempadoo 2001, 35, 37). Kempadoo examines how histories of racism, colonialism, militarism, and globalization structure the choices of first and third-world women of color. Although Kempadoo urges feminists to understand prostitution in terms of a broader range of social forces, she maintains that feminist theorizing about prostitution should avoid overlooking the agency of women of color by treating them as mere passive victims of oppression (Kempadoo 2001, 43). Kempadoo writes: “The agency of Brown and Black women in prostitution has been avoided or overlooked and the perspectives arising from these experiences marginalized in dominant theoretical discourse on the global sex trade and prostitution. Our insights, knowledges, and understanding of sex work have been largely obscured or dominated by white radical feminist, neo-Marxist or Western socialist feminist inspired analyses that have been either incapable or unwilling to address the complexities of the lives of women of color” (Kempadoo 2001, 40). Rather than conceptualize prostitution in terms of the sexual objectification and degradation of women, Kempadoo advocates understanding prostitution as a kind of labor that is often performed by marginalized people (Kempadoo 2001, 45; Kempadoo and Doezema 1998, 4-5; see also Leigh 1997). By conceptualizing prostitution as a form of labor and avoiding moralistic discourses about sexuality, feminists can avoid unrealistic abolitionist approaches (Kempadoo and Doezema 1998, White 1990, Shrage 1996). Instead, they can address the problems of prostitution in terms of working conditions and worker empowerment, the legal status of the work, and the occupational alternatives available to people oppressed by race, class, gender, and nationality.
Feminists are divided on the legal status of prostitution. Some feminist theorists promote stringent anti-trafficking laws, both internationally and locally (Jeffries 1998; Barry 1996). However, many feminist theorists worry that laws against prostitution will be applied unfairly to women, and will permit the state, though its police force, to persecute women for sexual promiscuity. Because prosecuting women for prostitution can compound their victimization, some feminists advocate prosecuting only the client who coerces sex with money, or the “pimp” who recruits women into prostitution (Satz 1995, 296).
Feminist activists generally distinguish views on the legal status of prostitution in terms of “abolition,” “decriminalization,” and “legalization.” “Abolition” refers to an approach that aims to eliminate all forms of paid sex through legal prohibition and social programs that “rescue” women and children from “sex slavery” or servitude. “Decriminalization” refers to the repeal of all laws that criminalize the action of taking money for sex. Advocates of decriminalization regard commerce in sex as essentially similar to commerce in other personal services. “Legalization” refers to an intermediate approach that regards prostitution as inevitable, but in need of special social controls and regulation. These special controls may include a state registry for prostitutes, mandatory health exams and condom use, zoning, and other laws that aim to protect third parties from harm and render prostitution businesses relatively invisible to the public.
The arguments for decriminalization and legalization often appeal to the ideal of individual privacy in matters of sexuality. Some argue that the right to control one's sexuality includes the right to use one's sexual capacities to make a living. Some feminists argue that a woman's right to control her own body extends to the right to grant sexual access to it for money (Almodovar 2002, 75). These arguments imply that governments abuse their power when they interfere with voluntary sex for hire by adults. Arguments for decriminalization and legalization also appeal to the notion of equal protection. Some feminists argue that men are generally not prosecuted for buying or selling sex, and therefore equality requires that the state either not prosecute female prostitutes (and “jeans”) or apply similar sanctions to johns and male prostitutes (Jaggar 1993, 124).
Feminists who take abolitionist approaches often compare markets in sexual services to markets in babies and bodily organs. The assumption is that laborers enter such markets only out of desperation and poverty, and thus their existence allows the more fortunate to egregiously exploit the less fortunate. Some abolitionists argue that women's labor is available for prostitution primarily because other markets and occupations are socially prohibited, due to traditional and sexist notions about a woman's place in society. Feminist critics of neo-colonialism see prostitution as a component of a global imperialist system in which women from poor countries are conscripted to provide “comfort and recreation” for the military personnel of rich and powerful nations. These feminists allege that prostitution is also used by social elites in poor countries to promote tourism and attract foreign investment (Enloe 1989, 36, 86; O'Connell Davidson 1998, 75; Bishop and Robinson 1998). What these abolitionist accounts have in common is a conception of sex work as manifestation of deep social inequalities and injustices.
While acknowledging the global injustices that both shape sex markets and explain the social characteristics of those who enter them, advocates of legalization or decriminalization argue that inequalities of power and opportunity shape all markets in goods and services in the contemporary world. That is, political and economic inequalities are producing sweatshop working conditions in many manufacturing trades, and exploitative trades in domestic work and childcare, as well as in sexual services. To address these problems, some feminists advocate a politics that focuses less on single issues, such as prostitution, and more on challenging the global inequalities of wealth and power that keep half the world's population destitute and vulnerable. International sex worker rights groups argue that, rather than challenging sex work, those concerned with the plight of sex workers should seek ways to end slavery and bondage, including all forms of child labor and sexual exploitation, and all forms of involuntary labor and sex. Together with advocating greater global economic justice, some feminists advocate lending support to worker-led movements, such as the many international and national sex worker organizations (Shrage 1996, 43). Rather than dictate from the ivory tower what marginalized women need, some feminists argue that we need to lend our expertise and social connections to disempowered women workers, including sex workers, while at the same time listening to and engaging them respectfully on the issues of strategy and goals (Kempadoo 1998, 24).
In the past several decades, women in sex industries around the world have formed numerous labor, civil rights, health, and educational networks to advocate for basic human rights and better working conditions. Also, a body of research has developed on the lives of sexual and gender dissidents, such as lesbians and transexuals, and, more recently, on the lives of third-world women of color. Both of these developments are changing feminist research on sex markets. New areas of concern that are emerging from the confluence of these developments include colonialism and the regulation of sex markets (Levine 2003), and queer sex workers (Pendleton 1997; Highleyman 1997, Queen 1997). Some of the latter work adds to a small amount of earlier research examining the role of sex workers in radical social movements and dissident communities (Nestle 1987). In addition, some new research focuses on the political work of third-world sex workers, and examines the forms of agency exhibited by women in oppressed circumstances (Kempadoo 1999; Rajan 2003). Furthermore, many feminist sex worker activists continue to challenge feminist research about their lives and work, and offer alternative analyses (Nagle 1997, Sprinkle 1998, Quan 2001, Bernstein 2000, Leigh 2004). Regarding pornography, feminists are challenging new attempts at censorship in light of concerns about the Internet and child sexual abuse (Levine 2002), and some are continuing to explore how women consume pornography (Matrix 1996). And some feminists are responding to the feminist anti-censorship movement, restating earlier positions in light of feminist criticism (Leidholdt and Raymond, 1990, Stark and Whisnant 2004).
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- Truong, Thanh-Dam, 1990, Sex,Money and Morality: Prostitution and Tourism in Southeast Asia, London: Zed Books.
- Vance, C., (ed.), 1984, Pleasure and Danger: Exploring Female Sexuality, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.
- Walkowitz, J., 1980, Prostitution and Victorian Society: Women, Class, and the State, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Williams, L., 1989, Hard Core: Power, Pleasure, and the “Frenzy of the Visible”, Berkeley: University of California Press.
- Prostitutes' Education Network
- Coalition Against Trafficking in Women
- Bibliography by Marit Synnevåg
- The Feminist Sexual Ethics Project
- EServer Feminism and Women's Studies
- The Men's Bibliography
- Philosophy Talk