Philosophy of Biology

First published Fri Jul 4, 2008

The growth of philosophical interest in biology over the past thirty years reflects the increasing prominence of the biological sciences in the same period. There is now an extensive literature on many different biological topics, and it would be impossible to summarise this body of work in this single entry. Instead, this entry sets out to explain what philosophy of biology is. Why does biology matter to philosophy and vice versa? A list of the entries in the encyclopedia which address specific topics in the philosophy of biology is provided at the end of the entry.

Three different kinds of philosophical enquiry fall under the general heading of philosophy of biology. First, general theses in the philosophy of science are addressed in the context of biology. Second, conceptual puzzles within biology itself are subjected to philosophical analysis. Third, appeals to biology are made in discussions of traditional philosophical questions. The first two kinds of philosophical work are typically conducted in the context of a detailed knowledge of actual biology, the third less so.

Philosophy of biology can also be subdivided by the particular areas of biological theory with which it is concerned. Biology is a diverse set of disciplines, ranging from historical sciences such as paleontology to engineering sciences such as biotechnology. Different philosophical issues occur in each field. The latter part of the entry discusses how philosophers have approached some of the main disciplines within biology.


1. Pre-history of Philosophy of Biology

As is the case for most apparent novelties, closer inspection reveals a prehistory for the philosophy of biology. In the 1950's the biologist J. H Woodger and the philosopher Morton Beckner both published major works on the philosophical of biology (Woodger 1952; Beckner 1959), but these did not give rise to a subsequent philosophical literature. Some philosophers of science also made claims about biology based on general epistemological and metaphysical considerations. Perhaps the most famous example is J. J. C Smart's claim that the biology is not an autonomous science, but a technological application of more basic sciences, like ‘radio-engineering’ (Smart 1959, 366). Like engineering, biology cannot make any addition to the laws of nature. It can only reveal how the laws of physics and chemistry play out in the context of particular sorts of initial and boundary conditions. Even in 1969 the zoologist Ernst Mayr could complain that books with ‘philosophy of science’ in the title were all misleading and should be re-titled ‘philosophy of physics’ (Mayr 1969). The encouragement of prominent biologists such as Mayr and F.J Ayala (Ayala 1976; Mayr 1982) was one factor in the emergence of the new field. The first sign of philosophy of biology becoming a mainstream part of philosophy of science was the publication of David Hull's Philosophy of Biological Science in the prominent Prentice-Hall Foundations of Philosophy series (Hull 1974). From then on the field developed rapidly. Robert Brandon could say of the late 1970's that “I knew five philosophers of biology: Marjorie Grene, David Hull, Michael Ruse, Mary Williams and William Wimsatt.” (Brandon 1996, xii–xiii) By 1986, however, there were more than enough to fill the pages of Michael Ruse's new journal Biology and Philosophy.

2. Three Types of Philosophy of Biology

Three different kinds of philosophical enquiry fall under the general heading of philosophy of biology. First, general theses in the philosophy of science are addressed in the context of biology. Second, conceptual puzzles within biology itself are subjected to philosophical analysis. Third, appeals to biology are made in discussions of traditional philosophical questions. The first major debate in the philosophy of biology exemplified the first of these, the use of biological science to explore a general theme in philosophy of science. Kenneth F. Schaffner applied the logical empiricist model of theory reduction to the relationship between classical, Mendelian genetics and the new molecular genetics (Schaffner 1967a; Schaffner 1967b; Schaffner 1969). David Hull argued that the lesson of this attempt was that Mendelian genetics is irreducible to molecular genetics (Hull 1974; Hull 1975). This debate reinforced the near-consensus in the 1970's and 1980's that the special sciences are autonomous from the more fundamental sciences (Fodor 1974; Kitcher 1984). However, the apparent absurdity of the claim that the molecular revolution in biology was not a successful instance of scientific reduction also led the formulation of increasingly more adequate models of theory reduction (Wimsatt 1976; Wimsatt 1980; Schaffner 1993; Waters 1994; Sarkar 1998).

In another important early debate philosophers set out to solve a conceptual puzzle within biology itself. The concept of reproductive fitness is at the heart of evolutionary theory, but its status has always been problematic. It has proved surprisingly hard for biologists to avoid the criticism that, “[i]f we try to make laws of evolution in the strict sense we seem to reduce to tautologies. Thus suppose we say that even in Andromeda ‘the fittest will survive’ we say nothing, for ‘fittest’ has to be defined in terms of ‘survival’” (Smart 1959, 366). In the 1970's the new generation of philosophers of biology began by noting that fitness is a supervenient property of organisms: the fitness of each particular organism is a consequence of some specific set of physical characteristics of the organism and its particular environment, but two organisms that have identical levels of fitness may do so in virtue very different sets of physical characteristics (Rosenberg 1978). Alexander Rosenberg and Mary B. Williams went on to argue that fitness is an irreducible primitive which derives its meaning from its place in an axiomatic formulation of evolutionary theory (Rosenberg 1983; Sober 1984a; Williams and Rosenberg 1985). But by far the most widely-favoured solution to the ‘tautology problem’ was to argue that this supervenient property is a propensity—a probability distribution over possible numbers of offspring (Mills and Beatty 1979). Although fitness is defined in terms of reproductive success, it is not a tautology that the fittest organisms have the most offspring, any more than it is a tautology that dice produce even numbers more often than they produce sixes. The propensities of fit organisms to survive and of dice to fall equally often on each side both allow us to make fallible predictions about what will happen, predictions that become more reliable as the size of the sample increases. It remains unclear, however, whether it is possible to specify a probability distribution or set of distributions that can play all the roles actually played by fitness in population biology.

The phrase ‘conceptual puzzles’ should be understood very broadly. The conceptual work done by philosophers of biology in many cases merges smoothly into theoretical biology. It also sometimes leads philosophers to criticise the chains of argument constructed by biologists, and thus to enter directly into ongoing biological debates. In the same way, the first kind of philosophy of biology I have described—the use of biological examples to work through general issues in the philosophy of science—sometimes feeds back into biology itself through specific recommendations for improving biological methodology. It is a striking feature of the philosophy of biology literature that philosophers often publish in biology journals and that biologists often contribute to philosophy of biology journals. The philosophy of biology also has a potentially important role as a mediator between biology and society. Popular representations of biology derive broad lessons from large swathes of experimental findings. Philosophers of science have an obvious role in evaluating these interpretations of the significance of specific biological findings (Stotz and Griffiths 2008).

A third form of philosophy of biology occurs when philosophers appeal to biology to support positions on traditional philosophical topics, such as ethics or epistemology. The extensive literature on biological teleology is a case in point. After a brief flurry of interest in the wake of the ‘modern synthesis’, during which the term ‘teleonomy’ was introduced to denote the specifically evolutionary interpretation of teleological language (Pittendrigh 1958), the ideas of function and goal directedness came to be regarded as relatively unproblematic by evolutionary biologists. In the 1970's, however, philosophers started to look to biology to provide a solid, scientific basis for normative concepts, such as illness or malfunction (Wimsatt 1972; Wright 1973; Boorse 1976). Eventually, the philosophical debate produced an analysis of teleological language fundamentally similar to the view associated with modern synthesis biology (Millikan 1984; Neander 1991). According to the ‘etiological theory’ of function, the functions of a trait are those activities in virtue of which the trait was selected. The idea of ‘etiological’ or ‘proper’ function has become part of the conceptual toolkit of philosophy in general and of the philosophy of language and the philosophy of mind in particular.

3. Philosophy of Evolutionary Biology

Philosophy of biology can also be subdivided by the particular areas of biological theory with which it is concerned. Until recently, evolutionary theory has attracted the lion's share of philosophical attention. This work has sometimes been designed to support a general thesis in the philosophy of science, such as the ‘semantic view’ of theories (Lloyd 1988). But most of this work is concerned with conceptual puzzles that arise inside the theory itself, and the work often resembles theoretical biology as much as pure philosophy of science. Elliott Sober's classic study The Nature of Selection: Evolutionary theory in philosophical focus (Sober 1984b) marks the point at which most philosophers became aware of the philosophy of biology. Sober analyzed the structure of explanations in population genetics via an analogy with the composition of forces in dynamics, treating the actual change in gene frequencies over time as the result of several different ‘forces’, such as selection, drift, and mutation. This sort of careful, methodological analysis of population genetics, the mathematical core of conventional evolutionary theory, continues to give rise to interesting results (Pigliucci and Kaplan 2006; Okasha 2007).

The intense philosophical interest in evolutionary theory in the 1980's can partly be explained by the controversies over ‘sociobiology’ that were provoked by the publications of E.O. Wilson's eponymous textbook (Wilson 1975) and still more by Richard Dawkins's The Selfish Gene (Dawkins 1976). The claim that the real unit of evolution is the individual Mendelian allele created an explosion of philosophical work on the ‘units of selection’ question (Brandon and Burian 1984) and the issue of ‘adaptationism’ (Dupré 1987). Arguably, philosophers made a significant contribution to the rehabilitation of some forms of ‘group selection’ within evolutionary biology in the 1990's, following two decades of neglect (Sober and Wilson 1998).

The debates over ‘adaptationism’ turned out to involve a diffuse set of worries about whether evolution produces optimal designs, the methodological role of optimality assumptions, and the explanatory goals of evolutionary theory. Philosophical work has helped to distinguish these strands in the debate and reduce the confusion seen in the heated and polemical biological literature for and against ‘adaptationism’ (Orzack and Sober 2001).

4. Philosophy of Systematic Biology

Philosophical discussion of systematics was a response to a ‘scientific revolution’ in that discipline in the 1960's and 1970's, a revolution which saw the discipline transformed first by the application of quantitative methods, and then by the ‘cladistic’ approach, which argues that the sole aim of systematics should be to represent the evolutionary relationships between groups of organisms (phylogeny). Ideas from the philosophy of science were used to argue for both transformations, and the philosopher David L. Hull was an active participant in scientific debates throughout these two revolutions (Hull 1965; Hull 1970; Hull 1988; see also Sober 1988).

The biologist Michael Ghiselin piqued the interest of philosophers when he suggested that systematics was fundamentally mistaken about the ontological status of biological species (Ghiselin 1974). Species are not types of organisms in the way that chemical elements are types of matter. Instead, they are historical particulars like nations or galaxies. Individual organisms are not instances of species, as my wedding ring is an instance of gold. Instead, they are parts of species, as I am a part of my family. As Smart had earlier noticed, this has the implication that there can be no ‘laws of nature’ about biological species, at least in the traditional sense of laws true at every time and place in the universe (Smart 1959). This has led some philosophers of biology to argue for a new conception of laws of nature (Mitchell 2000).

However, the view that species are ‘individuals’ leaves other important questions about species unsolved and raises new problems of its own. Around twenty different so-called ‘species concepts’ are represented in the current biological literature, and the merits, interrelations, and mutual consistency or inconsistency of these has been a major topic of philosophical discussion.

Biological species are one of the classic examples of a ‘natural kind’. The philosophy of systematics has had a major influence on recent work on classification and natural kinds in the general philosophy of science (Dupré 1993; Wilson 1999).

5. Philosophy of Molecular Biology

I mentioned above that the reduction of Mendelian genetics to molecular genetics one of the first topics to be discussed in the philosophy of biology. The initial debate between Schaffner and Hull was followed by the so-called ‘anti-reductionist consensus’ (Kitcher 1984). The reductionist position was revived in a series of important papers by Kenneth Waters (Waters 1990; Waters 1994) and debate over the cognitive relationship between the two disciplines continues today, although the question is not now framed as a simple choice between reduction and irreducibility. Lindley Darden, Schaffner and others have argued that explanations in molecular biology are not neatly confined to one ontological level, and hence that ideas of ‘reduction’ derived from classical examples like the reduction of the phenomenological gas laws to molecular kinematics in nineteenth century physics are simply inapplicable (Darden and Maull 1977; Schaffner 1993). Moreover, molecular biology does not have the kind of grand theory based around a set of laws or a set of mathematical models that is familiar from the physical sciences. Instead, highly specific mechanisms that have been uncovered in detail in one model organism seem to act as ‘exemplars’ allowing the investigation of similar, although not necessarily identical, mechanisms in other organisms that employ the same, or related, molecular interactants. Darden and others have argued that these ‘mechanisms’—specific collections of entities and their distinctive activities—are the fundamental unit of scientific discovery and scientific explanation, not only in molecular biology, but in a wide range of special sciences (Machamer, Darden et al. 2000; see also Bechtel and Richardson 1993).

Another important topic in the philosophy of molecular biology has been the definition of the gene (Beurton, Falk and Rheinberger 2000; Griffiths and Stotz 2007). Philosophers have also written extensively on the concept of genetic information, the general tenor of the literature being that it is difficult to reconstruct this idea precisely in a way that does justice to the apparent weight placed on it by molecular biologists (Sarkar 1996; Maynard Smith 2000; Griffiths 2001; Jablonka 2002).

6. Philosophy of Developmental Biology

The debates over ‘adaptationism’ in the 1980's made philosophers familiar with the complex interactions between explanations of traits in evolutionary biology and explanations of the same traits in developmental biology. Developmental biology throws light on the kinds of variation that are likely to be available for selection, posing the question of how far the results of evolution can be understood in terms of the options that were available (‘developmental constraints’) rather than the natural selection of those options (Maynard Smith, Burian et al. 1985). The debate over developmental constraints looked at developmental biology solely from the perspective of whether it could provide answers to evolutionary questions. However, as Ron Amundson pointed out, developmental biologists are addressing questions of their own, and, he argued, a different concept of ‘constraint’ is needed to address those questions (Amundson 1994). The emergence in the 1990's of a new field promising to unite both kinds of explanation, evolutionary developmental biology, has given rise to a substantial philosophical literature aimed at characterizing this field from a methodological viewpoint (Maienschein and Laublicher 2004; Robert 2004; Amundson 2005; Brandon and Sansom 2007).

7. Philosophy of Ecology and Conservation Biology

Until recently this was a severely underdeveloped field in the philosophy of biology. This is surprising, because there is obvious potential for all three of the approaches to philosophy of biology discussed above. There is also a substantial body of philosophical work in environmental ethics, and it seems reasonable to suppose that answering the questions that arise there would require a critical examination of ecology and conservation biology. In fact, an important book which sought to provide just those underpinnings—Kristin Shrader-Frechette and Earl McCoy's Method in Ecology: Strategies for Conservation (1993)—was an honorable exception to the philosophical neglect of ecology in earlier decades.

In the past decade philosophers have started to remedy the neglect of ecology and a number of major books have appeared (Cooper 2003, Ginzburg and Colyvan 2004, Sarkar 2005, MacLaurin and Sterelny 2008). Discussion has focused on the troubled relationship between mathematical models and empirical data in ecology, on the idea of ecological stability and the 'balance of nature', and on the definition of biodiversity.

8. Methodology in Philosophy of Biology

Most work in the philosophy of biology is self-consciously naturalistic, recognizing no profound discontinuity in either method or content between philosophy and science. Ideally, philosophy of biology differs from biology itself not in its knowledge base, but only in the questions it asks. The philosopher aims to engage with the content of biology at a professional level, although typically with greater knowledge of its history than biologists themselves, and less hands-on skills. It is common for philosophers of biology to have academic credentials in the fields that are the focus of their research, and to be closely involved with scientific collaborators. Philosophy of biology's naturalism and the continuity of its concerns with science itself is shared with much other recent work in the philosophy of science, perhaps most notably in the philosophy of neuroscience (Bechtel, Mandlik et al. 2001).

Even the distinction between the questions of biology and those of philosophy of biology is not absolutely clear. As noted above, philosophers of biology address three types of questions: general questions about the nature of science, conceptual puzzles within biology, and traditional philosophical questions that seem open to illumination from the biosciences. When addressing the second sort of question, there is no clear distinction between philosophy of biology and theoretical biology. But while this can lead to the accusation that philosophers of biology have abandoned their calling for ‘amateur hour biology’ it can equally well be said that a book like The Selfish Gene (Dawkins 1976) is primarily a contribution to philosophical discussion of biology. Certainly, the professional skills of the philosopher are as relevant to these internal conceptual puzzles as they are to the other two types of question. All three types of questions can be related to the specific findings of the biological sciences only by complex chains of argument.

Bibliography

Recent textbooks include Elliott Sober's Philosophy of Biology (Sober 1999), Kim Sterelny and Paul Griffiths's Sex and Death: An Introduction to Philosophy of Biology (1999), Brian Gavey's Philosophy of Biology (2007), and Alexander Rosenberg and Daniel McShea's Philosophy of Biology: A contemporary introduction (2008). Valuable edited collections designed to supplement such a text are Elliott Sober's Conceptual Issues in Evolutionary Biology (Sober 2006) which collects the classic papers on core debates, David Hull and Michael Ruse's The Philosophy of Biology which aims at a comprehensive survey using recent papers (1998), and the Cambridge Companion to the Philosophy of Biology (Hull and Ruse 2007) and Blackwell Companion to the Philosophy of Biology (Sarkar and Pultyinski 2008) which both consist of essays on key topics by leading authors.

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  • ––– (1994). “Genes made molecular.” Philosophy of Science, 61: 163–185.
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  • ––– (1980). Reductionistic Research Strategies and Their Biases in the Units of Selection Controversy. In Nickles, T. (ed.): Scientific Discovery: Case Studies, 213–259. Dordrecht: D. Reidel.
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adaptationism | altruism: biological | biocomplexity | biology: notion of individual | biology: philosophy of | character/trait | conservation biology | creationism | Darwinism | developmental biology | developmental biology: epigenesis and preformationism | developmental biology: evolution and development | ecology | ecology: biodiversity | evolution | evolution: cultural | fitness | gene | genetics: and genomics | genetics: evolutionary | genetics: genotype/phenotype distinction | genetics: molecular | genetics: population | heritability | human genome project | information: biological | innate/acquired distinction | life | molecular biology | natural selection | natural selection: units and levels of | neuroscience, philosophy of | psychology: evolutionary | reduction, scientific: in biology | replication and reproduction | self: the biological notion of | sociobiology | species | teleology: teleological notions in biology

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