Notes to Temporal Consciousness

1. Though for an alternative reading see Scharp (2008).

2. See Rosenberg (2005: ch.5), Blattner 1999: 190–210) for more on this.

3. So far as E.R. Clay is concerned, Andersen and Grush (2009, §7) rightly observe that commentators invariably recycle the quote from Clay's The Alternative supplied by James (as, indeed, has just been done here). They have performed the valuable service of tracking down both Clay and The Alternative. It turns out that ‘E.R. Clay’ is a pseudonym of Robert Kelly, an Irish immigrant to the U.S. who built up a successful cigar company, and took up an interest in philosophy after taking an early retirement. In the same article Andersen and Grush provide a very useful survey of other (non-Germanic) influences on James, e.g., Reid, Dugald Steward, Thomas Brown, William Hamilton and Shadworth Hodgson.

4. Gallagher (1998: 205) relates that in his well-annotated copy of James' Principles Husserl jotted down a German translation of the term, but his handwriting is indecipherable at this point.

5. Heidegger took these ingredients from Husserl's approach and fashioned something quite different from them. The Heideggerian conception of ‘originary time’ is intriguing, but also difficult; here is one attempt to summarize it: ‘Originary temporality is a manifold of nonsuccessive phenomena that explain ordinary time. The elements of the manifold go by the names “future” (Zukunft), “beenness” (Gewsenheit), and “Present” (Gegenwart). They are non-successive in the precise sense that the future does not follow, succeed, or come after beenness.’ (Blattner 1999: 26–7). Also see Barrett (1968) and Guignon (1983).

6. See Strawson (2009: 5.6) for a more detailed exposition of his views on continuity; for critical discussion of Strawson's position see Natsoulas (2006), Dainton (2000/2006: §5.2).

7. Bergson's complained that conceiving of the continuity of experience in mathematical terms reduces experience to a ‘dust of instants’(‘poussière des instants’). Poincaré is in sympathy with this, and points out that the orthodox mathematical continuum ‘is only a collection of individuals ranged in a certain order, infinite in number, true, but exterior to one another. This is not the ordinary conception, wherein is supposed between the elements of the continuum a sort of intimate bond which makes of them a whole where the point does not exist before the line, but the line before the point. Of the celebrated formula, ‘the continuum is unity in multiplicity’, only the multiplicity remains, the unity has disappeared.’ (1952: 42). For more on this theme see Capek (1971), Part II.

8. Here are online interactive illustrations of the effect, at The Motion After-Effect; Motion Aftereffect (Waterfall Illusion).

9. There is evidence of motion aftereffects occurring in the tactile (see Hayashi et al, 2006) and auditory domains (see Dong, C-J. et al, 2000), but it is not clear that analogues of the paradoxical features of the visual case are present in these cases.

10. ‘If we have a single experience of two items as being present, then, surely, we experience them as simultaneous. Suppose we are aware of A as preceding B, and of B as present. Can we be aware of A as anything other than past? Of course we can have successive experience of items, each of which in turn we see as present. But no single experience presents all these items as present.’ (2007: 87) ; also see (2004: 111).

11. Can we pick out a briefer span – or even an instant – within the duration of the specious present as the present? There is nothing to prevent our doing so, but given its the brief span, dividing the specious present in this way would serve little practical purpose. Clay seemingly took the leading edge to be present in the strict sense; James was evidently situating his vantage point in the middle region when he referred to ‘backward’ and ‘forward looking parts.

12. There are further options: see Tye (2003: chapter 4) for an attempt to combine something akin to an Extensional view with ‘representationalist’ account of perceptual experience; note, however, that Tye's account of the specious present is in some respects idiosyncratic.

13. Sprigge (1983: ch.1) defends a view along these lines; Whitehead believed that reality was composed of ‘drops of experience’ (1929: 25); see Sprigge (1993: 276ff) for an introduction to Bradley's ‘finite centres of experience’ – which Bradley himself regarded as inherently problematic.

14. For further discussion of these see Mabbot (1951, 1955), Mundle (1954), Foster (1979) and Dainton (2000: §6.2).

15. Tye argues that there is no problem here, on the grounds that it is a mistake to conclude that a sound is heard as occurring several times simply because there are several times at which it is heard (2003: 93–94). But while it is logically possible for there be experiences which go unnoticed by their subject, it remains the case that Broad's theory is profligate to an extraordinary degree, requiring as it does a vast censorship mechanism to conceal the innumerable surplus-to-requirements experiences it generates. And as Phillips (2010: §4.1) notes, Tye's proposal is incompatible with plausible doctrines concerning the sort of epistemic access we have to our own experience.

16. ‘If A, B, and C succeed each other rapidly, A and B may be parts of one sensation, and likewise B and C, while A and C are not parts of one sensation, but A is remembered when C is present in sensation. In such a case, A and B belong to the same present, and likewise B and C, but not A and C; thus the relation “belong to the same present” is not transitive … two presents may overlap without coinciding.’ (1913: 77–78)

17. It is possible (in principle) for specious presents to be separated by very little indeed: ‘it may be that the whole series of experiences is literally continuous (or at least dense)’, or so Foster suggests (1991: 248).

18. Strawson has recently elaborated a Retentional model which eschews strictly momentary episodes of experiencing: ‘What is the duration of the living moment of experience? I take it to be very short indeed. … One thing I take for granted is that experience takes time: it can't exist or occur at an instant, where an instant is defined as something with no temporal duration at all. So I take ‘moment’ as it features in the expression ‘living moment of experience’ to refer essentially to a temporal interval, however short.’ (Strawson 2009: 256).

19. This diagram resembles the one provided by Broad himself (1938: 285), but he adopted a different (and perhaps less perspicuous) convention for representing specious presents. Broad chooses to represent individual specious by triangles, such as A-D-A***. He took the height of the vertical lines to represent degrees of presentedness, so C has presentedness C-A** in the specious present A-D-A***, and presentedness C-B* in the specious present B-E-B** – the higher the vertical, the greater the presentedness.

20. See Dodd (2005) for more on Husserl's various ‘diagrams of time’.

21. Section 36 of the 1905 Lectures is headed The Time-Constituting Flow as Absolute Subjectivity and concludes thus: ‘This flow is something we can speak of in conformity with what is constituted, but it is not “something in objective time”. It is absolute subjectivity and has the absolute properties of something to be designated metaphorically as “flow”; of something that originates in a point of actuality, in a primal source-point, “the now”, and so on. In the actuality-experience we have the primal source-point and a continuity of moments of reverberation. For all this we lack names.’ (1991: 79)

22. Tye's definition of phenomenal unity as ‘a relation that connects qualities instantiated in adjacent specious presents’ (2003: 101) is puzzling, since it seems to leave the qualities within specious presents in the awkward position of not being directly phenomenally unified, even though the specious present is where we experience succession and persistence, as Tye himself seems to accept (2003: 86–7). See Bayne (2005) and Kobes (2005) for further discussion of Tye's position.

23. See Roache (1999) for an argument to the effect that the apparently very different standpoints of Dennett and Mellor are in fact reconcilable.

24. Prominent defenders of this conception are not hard to find, e.g. Minkowski (1908), Williams (1951), Smart (1980), Mellor (1981, 1998)

25. Broad introduced the ‘spotlight’ metaphor (1923: 59), though at the time he subscribed to the Growing Block view; the Moving Spotlight conception is perhaps best known for being the primary target of McTaggart's assault on the reality of time. For a more recent defence of the Growing Block see Tooley (1997); for a defence of Presentism see Bourne (2006).

26. The issue is not quite so straightforward. McKinnon (2003) argues that Presentism poses problems for Retentionalists too, on the grounds that there is good reason to believe the neural correlates of consciousness are extended over time, and that attempts by Presentists to accommodate this fact (e.g., by appealing to tensed properties possessed by momentary brain-phases) are unsatisfactory.

27. Peter Forrest advocates a form of the Growing Block model in which consciousness only exists in the present; consciousness, he believes, is a by-product of the ‘frisson’ generated at the interface between being and non-being. (Braddon-Mitchell 2002; Forrest 2004, 2006). Since it is not clear whether on this model consciousness is momentary or not, it is difficult to know what its implications for the current issue are. It is also worth adding that this model is rather speculative.

28. For further discussion of Dennett see the commentaries in Brain and Behavioural Sciences following Dennett and Kinsbourne (1992); the special issue of Inquiry (March 1993, 36(1–2), with essays by Clark, Fellows & O'Hear, Foster, Lockwood, Seager, Siewert, Sprigge); Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 1993, 53(4), with essays by Tye, Shoemaker, Jackson; also Phillips (2009: chapter 5).

29. Drawing these distinctions gives rise to a range of underexplored and difficult to answer, questions. For example, can the apparent variations in the ‘speed’ of the objective world be explained in variations in the extent of the specious present? Noting the work of Saillant and Simons (1998) which suggests bats possess the ability to alter the temporal span of their echolocation systems' ‘sensory window’, Lockwood has proposed that the apparent slowing of the surrounding world (in times of emergency or absorption) is due to a ‘diminution in the temporal span of the specious present’ (2005: 373); this shrinkage results in our apprehending a smaller than usual number of changes within a typical specious present; since we are not directly aware of latter's change in size, we attribute the alteration to a slow-down in our surroundings. Implicit in the story Lockwood tells is the assumption that the phenomenal duration of the specious present remains constant – and Strawson (2009: 253) agrees: ‘One may expressly intellectually register the fact that one is experiencing a great deal in a short time (a short time that feels for all that particularly calm and leisurely), in moments of great crisis, but this does not mean that the basic, subjective experienced temporal extent or “roominess” of the lived present experience is not the same as it is in ordinary life’. These are intriguing proposals, but are they correct?

30. For a survey of relevant work on the neural bases of temporal processing, see Mauk & Buonomano (2004). Kelly argues that the vast bulk of empirical work is focused on just two questions: How do we come to represent events as occurring at a particular time? Which events to we experience as simultaneous? He draws this conclusion: ‘The puzzle of temporal experience will not be resolved by empirical research of the type now being done … [the relevant neuroscientific accounts] do not have any bearing at all, in other words, on the question of how we are to conceptualize perceptual experience from the point of view of the subject so as to allow for the possibility of experiences as of continuous, dynamic, temporally structured, unified events.’ (2005b, §7–7.1) Kelly also believes that an alternative to the standard Retentional and Extensional approaches will be needed.

31. Benussi preferred the term ‘psychic present’, construing the latter as the ‘time required to apprehend the maximum number of elements of a change in one single perceptual act’ Albertazzi (1994: 161); see also Albertazzi (1996).

32. As Debru (2001: 478) notes, it may be that James' figure of 12 seconds was also influenced by Helmholtz's discovery that after-images typically have a maximal duration of 12 seconds or so.

33. And when describing Wundt's attempt to measure the interval which is remembered most accurately: ‘[this interval] of about three-fourths of a second, which is estimated with the minimum of error, points to a connection between the time-feeling and the succession of distinctly apperceived objects before the mind. The association time is also equal to about three-fourths of a second. This association time he regards as a sort of internal standard of duration to which we involuntarily assimilate all intervals which we try to reproduce, bringing shorter ones up to it and longer ones down.’ (1890: 596–7)

34. Reprinted in many collections, including McDermott (1967: 194ff; the extracts quoted are from 195–8).

35. Myers (1971: 355) notes that Boring claimed James' commitment to this approach stemmed from a general doctrine concerning the temporal character of introspection: ‘introspection was not believed to be a process that takes time … But how then can a duration that takes time be immediately known, since the duration, not being instantaneous, is itself not all immediate?’ (1942: 576). Myers has his doubts: ‘I cannot connect Boring's remarks with what James wrote in “The Perception of Time” in The Principles of Psychology, because he never said that introspection is instantaneous or that the duration of the specious present is specious’ (ibid.). Mabbot (1951: 165) usefully summarizes Boring's changes of view on these matters.

36. If he were committed to full-blooded duration-blocks and the Retentional approach, the upshot is the Non-Modal form of Retentionalism, which as we have seen, arguably generates too much experience. See Sprigge (1993: 198–225) for an interesting discussion of how James' views on time, experience and continuity evolved through his career.

37. There is another strand to Varela's argument: he suggests that neural cell assemblies will flip between their favoured states given the slightest of pushes, and that this ‘self-powered’ behaviour may be the physical correlate of experienced alterations in phenomenal contents, e.g., the perceived changes in aspect of a Necker cube. However, the idea that experience is naturally packaged into discrete chunks is not in the least Husserlian, and so this proposal is peripheral to our current concerns.

38. While Lloyd is certainly aware that further work linking the levels is needed, and that his discoveries merely reveal suggestive analogies which may prove useful as guides for future research, he is perhaps guilty of not giving this point sufficient emphasis.

39. Clark (1998) also takes dynamists such as van Gelder to task for giving insufficient attention to the brain and its information processing capabilities.

40. Grush notes that his interpretation of such cases is similar in some respects to the multiple drafts model of Dennett (1991: ch. 5–6), but the trajectory estimation model is not committed to a plurality of competing simultaneous representations. In some respects it is also similar to the ‘fixed-lag smoother’ model that Rao, Eagleman and Sejnewski (2001) employ to explain related temporal illusions (e.g. the flash-lag), but has the advantage of not postulating a delay of around 100–200 msec between sensory stimuli and their subsequent representations (Grush 2005b: 214–216).

41. For an online variant of the flash-lag illusion see Flash-Lag Effect. For a connection with debatable off-side decisions in football matches see Baldo, M. Ranvaud, R. & Morya, E. (2002). For more on how successful athletes deal with fast-moving balls, see Abernethy (1981), Bahill and LaRitz (1984), McLeod (1987), McCrone (1993).

42. See Dainton (2009) for this interpretation; see Butterfield (1984) and Callender (2008) for further discussion of perceptual time-lags.

43. Of the two most general visual pathways in primates ‘we find that it is the older tectopulvinar pathway (evolutionarily speaking) that is more involved in motion perception than the newer geniculostriate pathway. There are some suggestions that the tectopulvinar pathway may be entirely specialized for the perception of movement, along with the control of responses that involve moving stimuli, such as some kinds of eye movements’ (Coren, Ward, Enns: 360).

44. See Weichselgartner & Sperling (1985), Long & O'Saban (1989) and Nisly-Nagele & Wasserman (2001) for further discussion and references on visual persistence.

45. There are complications. Although 20–30 fps is sufficient to generate smooth apparent motion, higher rates are needed to eliminate variations in brightness (flicker); accordingly, in cinema and TV the same image is shown two or three times in succession. Three factors are most relevant to the quality of apparent motion: interstimulus interval (the time between the end of one frame and the start of the next), frame duration, and the time between the start of one frame and the start of the next – the latter is the most important single factor. For further detail on a complex topic, ‘flicker studies’, see Anderson & Anderson (1993), Galifret (2006).

46. E.g., See Color Phi Phenomneon. For a presentation discussing two varieties of the phenomenon, together with online examples, see Phi is Not Beta.

47. See BioMotionLab and Introduction to Motion Perception.

48. Intriguingly, Allport also distinguishes two forms of the perceptual moment theory: the ‘Discrete Moment Hypothesis’ and the ‘Travelling Moment Hypothesis’. According to the former, perceptual moments are entirely discrete, whereas according to the latter, they overlap (e.g., if one moment takes in A-B-C-D, the next will take in B-C-D-E, etc. ). The details are not clear, but there are certainly some similarities between Travelling Moment Hypothesis and the overlap version of Extensionalism. Allport illustrates the travelling model thus: ‘A simple spatial analogy may help to make this distinction clear. To a man standing on the platform, the occupants of a passing train are revealed compartment by compartment as each window draws by. His glimpses of the interior of the train are essentially discontinuous in time. To an observer in one of the compartments, on the other hand, the field of view is always bounded by his own carriage window. New elements of the passing scene enter his view continuously from one side of the window, while others drop out of it at the other. Given a temporal rather than a spatial extension, the moving window analogy corresponds with the idea of a continuous “travelling moment” ’(1968: 396). Efron and Lee (1973) argue that the experimental evidence which leads Allport to prefer the Travelling Moment Hypothesis over its Discrete counterpart can also be explained in terms of visible persistence.

Copyright © 2010 by
Barry Dainton <bdainton@liverpool.ac.uk>