Notes to The Human Genome Project

1. I am grateful for the help of three very capable student research assistants: Isabel Casimiro at California State University, Chico and Andrew Inkpen and Ashley Pringle at Saint Mary’s University. Preparation of this entry was also assisted by a California State University Faculty Development Grant during spring semester 2003.

2. See, for example, Davis and colleagues (1990). Watson later characterized the backlash as behavior more suited to postal workers’ unions than scientific groups (1992, p. 165).

3. This was followed by a combined $39 million in FY 1989, $88 million in FY 1990, and $135 million in FY1991. For ensuing years, see the Human Genome Project Budget.

4. Besides Wexler as chair, the initial members of the Joint Working Group were Victor McKusick, Jonathan R. Beckwith, Robert Murray, Patricia King, and Thomas H. Murray.

5. Combining the enzyme reverse transcriptase with messenger RNA (mRNA) isolated from the body’s cells yields complementary DNA (cDNA); these cDNAs are stored as bacterial inserts to provide researchers with a “library” of clones for genes known to be active in the brain, liver, etc. Just as Sydney Brenner had proposed in discussions leading up to the HGP, Venter saw mapping sequenced cDNAs to the genome as a cheaper, quicker, and more useful approach than mapping and sequencing the entire genome which includes so-called junk as well as transcribed regions.

6. In early 1992, after a second Venter publication (Adams et al. 1992) and NIH bundle of patent applications, the U.K.’s Medical Research Council applied to the U.S. Patent Office for patents on ESTs from Brenner’s unpublished work. Healy appealed the ensuing rejection received from the USPTO, but her successor Harold Varmus withdrew the applications in early 1994 (Davies 2002).

7. Wallace Steinberg financed two companies: Venter’s nonprofit research center, The Institute for Genome Research (TIGR), set out to produce as many ESTs as possible; Human Genome Services (HGS) was set up to market TIGR’s discoveries—CEO William Haseltine began by selling seven percent of HGS and exclusive commercial rights to TIGR’s genes to SmithKline-Beecham for $125 million in May 1993 (Davies 2002, pp. 64-66).

8. In 1991, funds of about 2000 yen ($14 million) were divided between three agencies: the Science and Technology Agency funded the development of automated sequencing and mapping and sequencing of chromosome 21 at its Institute of Physical and Chemical Research (RIKEN); the Ministry of Education, Science, and Culture funded a grants-based program and a new genome center at Tokyo University; and the Ministry of Health and Welfare funded the sequencing of disease genes (Swinbanks 1991). In 1994, Kazusa DNA Research Institute opened with support from industry and the local government of the Chiba region (Swinbanks 1994), and in 1995, the Ministry of International Trade and Industry opened a sequencing center in Tokyo (Swinbanks 1995).

9. A full account of international efforts cannot be provided here. Italy’s genome project began as a pilot project in 1987 under the leadership of Dulbecco. Russia’s genome project began in 1988 in the old U.S.S.R. Canada began a four-year genome program in 1992 with funding by government agencies and the National Cancer Institute, but funding was not renewed (Kaiser 1997); in 2000, however, the federal government created Genome Canada, a nonprofit organization to support large-scale genomics and proteomics projects. The Human Genome Organization (HUGO) formed in 1988 with private funding (from Howard Hughes Medical Institute in the U.S. and the Wellcome Trust in the U.K.) to help coordinate these efforts, particularly regarding communication and data exchange across international boundaries.

10. WGS approaches to the human genome were proposed (Weber and Myers 1997; Venter et al. 1997), but rejected as flawed (Green 1997).

11. Hamilton Smith, who had joined TIGR’s scientific advisory board at Venter’s invitation, proposed at a staff meeting in late 1993 that TIGR sequence the complete genome of a bacterium using the WGS method. This took 13 months at a cost of $.48 per base and a total cost of $1 million (Davies 2002, pp. 104-108).

12. In 2002, this controversy was aired in the pages of PNAS (see Waterston et al. 2002, Green 2002, and Myers et al. 2002).

13. However, the completion of the HGP and the production of the “finished” sequence do not mean that the complete human genome has been sequenced. The heterochromatic gene-poor regions that make up about 10 percent of the genome (0.2 of 3.1 billion base pairs) are too difficult to sequence with present-day technologies because of the highly repetitive stretches of DNA they contain. These regions are located especially at the tips and centromeres of the chromosomes. The euchromatic gene-rich regions of the genome (2.9 of 3.1 billion base pairs) are 99 percent completed. About 400 gaps remain with average fragment sizes of more than 27 million bases; these gaps are due to difficulties with their amplification for sequencing, perhaps because of unusual shape or toxicity to the bacteria used. An accuracy rate of 99.99 percent has been achieved. While it might take another 10 to 20 years to have every base in place, the “finished” sequence is a vast improvement over the “working draft” version that contained some 150,000 gaps, average fragment sizes of 81,900 bases, and an accuracy rate of 99.9 percent (Anonymous 2003; Wade 2003).

14. Several decades ago, attempts to reduce classical to molecular genetics foundered on difficulties finding bridge principles to define classical genes in terms of molecular genes (Hull 1974); more recently, it is argued that, since evolutionary genes are implicated in any heritable phenotypic difference, unlike molecular genes, these need not be restricted to specific stretches of DNA (Griffiths and Neumann-Held 1999).

15. An interesting empirical investigation of scientists’ use of gene concepts found that, in their work, molecular and evolutionary biologists favored Gene-P and developmental biologists favored Gene-D, but when asked explicitly, all biologists preferred a molecular definition of the gene (Stotz, Griffiths, and Knight 2004).

16. This recalls Kitcher (1992): “A gene is anything a competent biologist chooses to call a gene” (p. 131).

17. These claims by evolutionist critics of the HGP are examined at length in Gannett (2003a).

18. More recently, Parens (2004), writing about behavioral genetics and noting that awareness of physical differences has always existed alongside beliefs in moral equality, acknowledges “the old and perhaps permanent danger that inquiries into the genetic differences among us will be appropriated to justify inequalities in the distribution of social power” (p. S31), but argues that behavioral genetics also has the potential to affirm the value of diversity insofar as it takes an individual-differences rather than a species-typicality perspective to genetic variation. This article is based on Parens’ experiences as part of an NHGRI ELSI-funded initiative undertaken by The Hastings Center and the American Association for the Advancement of Science called “Crafting Tools for Public Conversation about Behavioral Genetics”—see http://www.aaas.org/spp/bgenes/.

19. See http://www.hapmap.org/index.html.en.

20. Developmental biologist Lewis Wolpert (1994) makes a claim similar to Gilbert’s, a claim which has come in for philosophical debate, with support from Rosenberg (1997) and opposition from Keller (1999) and Robert (2004).

21. We are perhaps disinclined to embrace this, especially when it comes to the prospect of crossing species boundaries, which although not fixed in biological fact may exist nonetheless for us as “moral constructs” (Robert and Baylis 2003).

22. De Melo-Martín (2005, ch. 1) points out that, even if genetic determinism were true, we are not freed from our responsibility to reform social institutions and practices—and, by doing so, what makes a certain behavior a social problem in the first place may also change.

23. HGP proponents sought support for the project by emphasizing the importance of genes in determining behavioral as well as physical traits: Science editor Daniel Koshland (1989) submitted that genes are responsible not only for manic-depression and schizophrenia but also poverty and homelessness, and that sequencing the genome represented “a great new technology to aid the poor, the infirm, and the underprivileged” (p. 189).

24. See http://www.genome.gov/11006929/.

25. It is pointed out how removing phenylalanine from the diet compensates for the genetic defect associated with the disease so what may appear to be genetically determined is not. Kaplan goes on to provide an account of just how misleading this standard story of PKU is (2000, pp. 13-21); see also Paul (1995).

26. In contrast, other authors (Griffiths 2006; Lewontin 1993; Rosoff and Rosenberg 2006) take an approach that limits genetic determinism to being a thesis about the causation of socially important traits. Rosoff and Rosenberg (2006) distinguish genocentrism which they take to be true (the genes play a special role in development whereby they literally program the embryo and regulate cellular processes once development is complete) and genetic determinism which they take to be false.

27. Lewontin (2000 [1992]) notes an industrial-age counterpart: “the transfer onto biology of the belief in the superiority of mental labor over the merely physical, of the planner and designer over the unskilled operative on the assembly line” (pp. 143-144).

28. Also see Sarkar 1998, Sober 2001, and Wahlsten 1990 for discussions of heritability. These constraints on the legitimacy of drawing conclusions based on estimates of heritability—for example, for social policy—are often ignored (see discussion in Kaplan 2000, ch. 3).

29. While DSTers implicate scientists’ asymmetrical treatment of genetic versus nongenetic causes to explain the persistence of beliefs in genetic determinism, Keller (1992) argues that the nature-nurture controversy has cultural and political as well as scientific underpinnings. When beliefs in genetic determinism and support of eugenics declined after WWII, geneticists avoided being tarnished by Nazi crimes by distinguishing knowledge of genetics from its uses, and their study of nonhuman organisms from the study of human genetics. Outside of genetics, the postwar optimism of the 1950s-1960s shifted the weight for determining human behavior from nature to nurture. But by the late-1960s, the pendulum began to shift again: geneticists had never relinquished their beliefs in genetic determinism and their hopes for eventually gaining control over human evolution, and as the status of genetics increased within biology, and the status of science increased within society, these views came to predominate. Of course, with the genetic engineering toolkit that has been assembled over the past few decades, the nature-nurture controversy is not what it once was. Keller characterizes this capacity for technological intervention as the transfiguration of genetic determinism, a reversal of representations of nature as destiny and nurture as freedom now that nature is perceived to be easier to control.

30. For a debate over the merits of the geneticization thesis, and its comparison to the earlier medicalization thesis, see ten Have (2001) and Hedgecoe (2001).

31. See Proctor (1992) for discussion of cancer as a genetic disease.

32. On this basis, Gifford (1990) distinguishes two senses of “genetic”: (i) “A trait is genetic (with respect to population P) if it is genetic factors which ‘make the difference’ between those individuals with the trait and the rest of population P” (p. 333)—this is his “differentiating factor criterion”; and (ii) “For a trait to be genetic, the gene (or set of genes) must cause that trait as described. The trait must be individuated in such a way that it matches what some genetic factors cause specifically” (p. 343)—this is his “proper individuation criterion.”

33. Smith (2001) proposes an epidemiological definition of “genetic disease” which recognizes this population-based context-dependence: a genetic disease is one in which “those with the gene are more likely than not to develop the disease,” and “most cases of disease in the population are caused by the gene” (p. 23).

34. A pragmatic account of explanation in developmental biology that examines ways in which environmental causes are overlooked in favor of genetic ones is provided by van der Weele (1999).

35. For more on the history of the model organisms selected for the HGP and the research programs associated with these organisms, see de Chadarevian (2002, pp. 287-299) on Brenner and C. elegans; Allen (1975) and Kohler (1994) on Morgan and D. melanogaster; Rader (2004) on C.C. Little, the Jackson Laboratory, and M. musculus; and Weiner (1999) on Seymour Benzer’s behavioral studies in D. melanogaster. Davis (2003, 2004) provides a scientist’s account focusing on microbial models (including yeast, E. coli, and bacteriophage).

36. These were topics of discussion at the 1997 seminar “Making Choices: Organisms in the History of Biology” sponsored by the Dibner Institute for the History of Science and Technology and held at the Marine Biological Laboratory in Woods Hole, MA.

37. Wimsatt (1998) argues that generative entrenchment favors the ability of a simple system to model a more complex one insofar as features with significant downstream consequences in development are likely to be conserved in evolution.

38. The Harvard-Dupont oncomouse provided the basis for challenging patent laws outside the U.S. In 1997, the EU decided to allow the patenting of higher life forms, but imposed ethical restrictions (e.g. any modification causing suffering or physical handicap to animals without medical benefits could not be patented). This reflects the exclusion clause (Art 53[a]) in the European Patent Convention for inventions contrary to morality. In 2002, a 5-4 decision by Canada’s Supreme Court in Harvard College v Canada (Commissioner of Patents) upheld existing law which permitted the patenting of genetically altered cells (including human ones) and simple organisms like bacteria and yeast but prohibited the patenting of higher life forms, including plants, seeds, and animals.

39. The EC Directive on the Legal Protection of Biotechnological Inventions, though adopted by the European Parliament in July 1998, has not yet been ratified by all member states. Article 5 of the directive distinguishes gene sequences and partial sequences as an element of the human body from elements “isolated from the human body or otherwise produced by means of a technical process” with only the latter patentable (Reed 2006, pp. 58-59). For more on the Directive, and an international comparison of positions on gene patents, see Knoppers (1999).

40. Eisenberg (2002) argues that, though the chemical analogy worked well for 1980s-era genetically engineered proteins given a patent system designed “to serve the needs of a bricks-and-mortar world” (p. 10), it is not equipped to handle today’s applications which seek patent protection for DNA sequence information and not the molecules themselves. Sagoff (2002) challenges Eisenberg’s analysis; according to Sagoff, when an invention is patented, the patentee gains rights to the knowledge embodied in the object, whether that object is a Gillette safety razor or a gene, and hence, molecules and information cannot be separated in the way Eisenberg suggests.

41. See the HUGO Statement on Patenting of DNA Sequences.

42. Article 5 of the EC Directive requires patent applications to disclose the “industrial application” of gene sequences or partial sequences (in Reed, p. 59).

43. Reed (2006) uses philosopher Hugo Grotius as a “dialogue partner” to explore taking an approach to gene patenting that bears in mind the “common good”; she finds Grotius helpful in this regard as a figure transitional in the historical movement to liberal conceptions of individual rights and private property associated with Hobbes and Locke.

44. The combined use of prenatal testing and selective abortion precedes the HGP by several decades. In the mid-1950s, some research hospitals used amniocentesis to detect fetal sex through the presence/absence of the Barr body for couples with a family history of sex-linked conditions like hemophilia. Uses for amniocentesis expanded: by the late-1960s, fetal karyotyping could be carried out to detect chromosomal abnormalities associated with conditions like Down syndrome; by the early-1970s, neural tube defects like spina bifida could be diagnosed. The legalization of abortion (by a 1967 Act of Parliament in the U.K. and the 1973 Supreme Court decision in Roe v Wade in the U.S.) permitted amniocentesis to become widely available in the 1970s.

45. More than 1000 tests are now available on a clinical or research basis. See http://www.bcm.edu/geneticlabs/tests.cfm, for a list of prenatal tests that can be requisitioned at Baylor College of Medicine. For a list of conditions for which Genesis Genetics Institute has performed PGD, see http://www.genesisgenetics.org/pages/services.html.

46. In 1997, based on the results of pilot screening programs, a NIH Consensus Statement recommended that testing be offered to families with a positive disease history and couples currently planning a pregnancy or seeking prenatal testing, but not to the general adult population or newborns. See http://consensus.nih.gov/1997/1997GeneticTestCysticFibrosis106PDF.pdf.

47. It is worth quoting Callahan at length: “The right to procreate, as a claimed human right, is primarily of post-World War II vintage. It took hold first in the United States with the acceptance of artificial insemination (AID) and was strengthened by a series of court decisions upholding contraception and abortion. The emergence of in vitro fertilization in 1978, widespread surrogate motherhood in the 1980s, and a continuous stream of other technological developments over the past three decades have provided a wide range of techniques to pursue reproductive choice. It is not clear what, if any, limits remain any longer to an exercise of those rights. Consider the progression of a claimed right: from a right to have or not have children as one chooses, to a right to have them any way one can, and then to have the kind of child one wants” (1998, p. 142).

48. Historians differ in the extent to which they emphasize continuities and discontinuities in drawing lessons for today from past eugenics. See Allen (1994), Kevles (1994), Paul (1994a), and Proctor (1992).

49. See Gannett (1997), Paul (2000), and Radick (2001) for criticisms.

50. Kahn and Mastroianni (2004) note, however, that the argument that a child born as a result of prenatal testing must have been benefited in virtue of being born at all can be used to justify the ethical permissibility of selecting for or against any trait. Gavaghan (2000) provides a similar argument in defense of Nozick’s idea of a “genetic supermarket.”

51. Based on their study of women tested/not tested for the BRCA1 gene, Zick et al. (2000) argue that these fears may be exaggerated in the case of life insurance.

52. A copy of the report can be found at www.genome.gov/Pages/ELSI/TaskForceReportGeneticInfo1993.pdf.

53. GINA strengthens already-existing legislation at the state and federal levels (K. Hudson et al. 1995; Rothenberg et al. 1997). Most states have genetic nondiscrimination and privacy laws which prevent the use of genetic information for medical underwriting. The Health Insurance Portability and Accountability Act (HIPAA) of 1996 prohibited the use of genetic information for determining eligibility for group health plans, including the self-funded insurance plans of employers which the Employment Retirement and Income Security Act (ERISA) had exempted from state laws. The Equal Employment Opportunity Commission (EEOC) ruled in 1995 that a positive test for a disease-linked gene counts as a disability protected by the Americans with Disabilities Act (ADA) of 1990; however, the act did not prevent employers from limiting health care coverage or eliminating benefits altogether, and the onus for enforcement rested on the employee’s willingness to sue.

54. Watson and Venter are now promoting the idea that there is nothing to fear by making one’s sequence public rather than protecting it as private. As mentioned in section 2.1.2, 71 percent of the Celera sequence was Venter’s. Venter’s genome was subsequently fully sequenced and the findings published in the October 2007 issue of PLoS Biology (Levy et al. 2007); this was followed by the publication of Watson’s genome in the 17 April 2008 issue of Nature (Wheeler et al. 2008). Relevant to the privacy question, Watson did not bare all: at Watson’s request, the APOE gene which is linked to Alzheimer’s disease was omitted from his sequence. Along similar lines, Harvard medical geneticist George M. Church is spearheading the Personal Genome Project (PGP) (see http://www.personalgenomes.org/). Ten volunteers have already agreed to release their genomes and health and physical information publicly, and a total of 100,000 volunteers are being sought. Says Church: “Ideally, everybody on the planet would share their medical and genomic information” (in Dizikes 2007).

55. Such debates unfolded differently in the U.K. where genetic risk was seen as similar to other forms of risk underwritten by insurers with the need to balance the right of the individual to privacy against the right of insurers to adequate information. In 1999, the British government created the Genetics and Insurance Committee (GAIC) as an advisory board to decide whether genetic tests, reviewed on an individual basis, should be incorporated in insurance underwriting (Parthasarathy 2004).

56. See also O’Neill’s (2001) case against genetic exceptionalism.

57. See http://www.opsi.gov.uk/acts/acts2003/ukpga_20030044_en_1.htm, Part 1, Section 10.

58. Scully (2001) questions why the technical distinction between somatic cell and germ-line GM and the intentional distinction between therapy and enhancement should be expected to coincide with moral boundaries. She criticizes the tendency of bioethicists to draw lines between morally permissible and impermissible acts in this way, and recommends instead a “reverse ethics” approach which focuses on the contextual factors that lead specific groups to place boundaries where they do.

59. Buchanan et al. (2000, pp. 150-151) downplay the metaphysical importance of the species adaptive norm as an objective basis for distinguishing between health and disease (hence, therapy and enhancement, and enhancement for health vs. social purposes), but argue that any valuations present are likely to be widely shared, and in this sense objective.

60. It bears pointing out, however, that ooplasmic transfer with IVF has resulted in children being born with three biological parents insofar as mtDNA from the donor cytoplasm is inherited (Rasko et al. 2006).

61. Loftis (2005) challenges this relative complacency toward nonhumans and its contrast to the caution exhibited toward humans.

62. Buchanan et al. (2000) proceed to redefine the no-longer-static boundary between the social and natural in terms of “what is subject to human control and what is not” (p. 83), the former properly regarded as a matter of justice/injustice and the latter as a matter of fortune/misfortune.

63. Wenz (2005) argues that Buchanan et al. confuse just societies and real societies, and that insofar as the U.S. departs from the “just and humane society” envisioned by Rawls (in its educational spending, lack of universal health care, etc.), genetic interventions are not likely to be instituted in a just way, whether these involve “health-related” or “desire-related” enhancements.

64. Lindsay (2005) points out, however, that what justice forbids as a competitive advantage (e.g. intellectual or musical abilities) could be undertaken for wholly intrinsic reasons of self-improvement.

65. Lindsay (2005) argues that, because genetic technologies will transform us, society, and basic ideas about justice (e.g. on Rawls’ account, who counts as “least advantaged” and what counts as “sufficient resources” and “equal opportunity”), we are ill-equipped at present to decide on the permissibility of specific genetic interventions on the basis of justice.

Copyright © 2008 by
Lisa Gannett <lisa.gannett@smu.ca>