Identity Politics

First published Tue Jul 16, 2002; substantive revision Tue Feb 7, 2012

The laden phrase “identity politics” has come to signify a wide range of political activity and theorizing founded in the shared experiences of injustice of members of certain social groups. Rather than organizing solely around belief systems, programmatic manifestos, or party affiliation, identity political formations typically aim to secure the political freedom of a specific constituency marginalized within its larger context. Members of that constituency assert or reclaim ways of understanding their distinctiveness that challenge dominant oppressive characterizations, with the goal of greater self-determination.


1. History and Scope

The second half of the twentieth century saw the emergence of large-scale political movements—second wave feminism, Black Civil Rights in the U.S., gay and lesbian liberation, and the American Indian movements, for example—based in claims about the injustices done to particular social groups. These social movements are undergirded by and foster a philosophical body of literature that takes up questions about the nature, origin and futures of the identities being defended. Identity politics as a mode of organizing is intimately connected to the idea that some social groups are oppressed; that is, that one's identity as a woman or as a Native American, for example, makes one peculiarly vulnerable to cultural imperialism (including stereotyping, erasure, or appropriation of one's group identity), violence, exploitation, marginalization, or powerlessness (Young 1990). Identity politics starts from analyses of oppression to recommend, variously, the reclaiming, redescription, or transformation of previously stigmatized accounts of group membership. Rather than accepting the negative scripts offered by a dominant culture about one's own inferiority, one transforms one's own sense of self and community, often through consciousness-raising. For example, in their germinal statement of Black feminist identity politics, the Combahee River Collective argued that “as children we realized that we were different from boys and that we were treated different—for example, when we were told in the same breath to be quiet both for the sake of being ‘ladylike’ and to make us less objectionable in the eyes of white people. In the process of consciousness-raising, actually life-sharing, we began to recognize the commonality of our experiences and, from the sharing and growing consciousness, to build a politics that will change our lives and inevitably end our oppression” (Combahee River Collective 1982, 14–15).

The scope of political movements that may be described as identity politics is broad: the examples used in the philosophical literature are predominantly of struggles within western capitalist democracies, but indigenous rights movements worldwide, nationalist projects, or demands for regional self-determination use similar arguments. Predictably, there is no straightforward criterion that makes a political struggle into an example of “identity politics;” rather, the term signifies a loose collection of political projects, each undertaken by representatives of a collective with a distinctively different social location that has hitherto been neglected, erased, or suppressed. It is beyond the scope of this essay to offer historical or sociological surveys of the many different social movements that might be described as identity politics, although some references to this literature are provided in the bibliography; instead the focus here is to provide an overview of the philosophical issues in the expansive literature in political theory.

The phrase “identity politics” is also something of a philosophical punching-bag for a variety of critics. Often challenges fail to make sufficiently clear their object of critique, using “identity politics” as a blanket description that invokes a range of tacit political failings (as discussed in Bickford 1997). From a contemporary perspective, some early identity claims by political activists certainly seem naive, totalizing, or unnuanced. However, the public rhetoric of identity politics served useful and empowering purposes for some, even while it sometimes belied the philosophical complexity of any claim to a shared experience or common group characteristics. Since the twentieth century heyday of the well known political movements that made identity politics so visible, a vast academic literature has sprung up; although “identity politics” can draw on intellectual precursors from Mary Wollstonecraft to Frantz Fanon, writing that actually uses this specific phrase, with all its contemporary baggage, is limited almost exclusively to the last twenty years. Thus it was barely as intellectuals started to systematically outline and defend the philosophical underpinnings of identity politics that we simultaneously began to challenge them. At this historical juncture, then, asking whether one is for or against identity politics is to ask an impossible question. Wherever they line up in the debates, thinkers agree that the notion of identity has become indispensable to contemporary political discourse, at the same time as they concur that it has troubling implications for models of the self, political inclusiveness, and our possibilities for solidarity and resistance.

2. Philosophy and Identity

From this brief examination of how identity politics fits into the political landscape it is already clear that the use of the controversial term “identity” raises a host of philosophical questions. Logical uses aside, it is likely familiar to philosophers from the literature in metaphysics on personal identity—one's sense of self and its persistence. Indeed, underlying many of the more overtly pragmatic debates about the merits of identity politics are philosophical questions about the nature of subjectivity and the self (Taylor 1989). Charles Taylor argues that the modern identity is characterized by an emphasis on its inner voice and capacity for authenticity—that is, the ability to find a way of being that is somehow true to oneself (Taylor in Gutmann, ed. 1994). While doctrines of equality press the notion that each human being is capable of deploying his or her practical reason or moral sense to live an authentic live qua individual, the politics of difference has appropriated the language of authenticity to describe ways of living that are true to the identities of marginalized social groups. As Sonia Kruks puts it:

What makes identity politics a significant departure from earlier, pre-identarian forms of the politics of recognition is its demand for recognition on the basis of the very grounds on which recognition has previously been denied: it is qua women, qua blacks, qua lesbians that groups demand recognition. The demand is not for inclusion within the fold of “universal humankind” on the basis of shared human attributes; nor is it for respect “in spite of” one's differences. Rather, what is demanded is respect for oneself as different (2001, 85).

For many proponents of identity politics this demand for authenticity includes appeals to a time before oppression, or a culture or way of life damaged by colonialism, imperialism, or even genocide. Thus for example Taiaiake Alfred, in his defense of a return to traditional indigenous values, argues that:

Indigenous governance systems embody distinctive political values, radically different from those of the mainstream. Western notions of domination (human and natural) are noticeably absent; in their place we find harmony, autonomy, and respect. We have a responsibility to recover, understand, and preserve these values, not only because they represent a unique contribution to the history of ideas, but because renewal of respect for traditional values is the only lasting solution to the political, economic, and social problems that beset our people. (Alfred 1999, 5)

What is crucial about the “identity” of identity politics appears to be the experience of the subject, especially his or her experience of oppression and the possibility of a shared and more authentic or self-determined alternative. Thus identity politics rests on unifying claims about the meaning of politically laden experiences to diverse individuals. Sometimes the meaning attributed to a particular experience will diverge from that of its subject: thus, for example, the woman who struggles desperately to be attractive may think that she is simply trying to be a better person, rather than understanding her experience as part of the disciplining of female bodies in a patriarchal culture. Making sense of such disjunctions relies on notions such as false consciousness—the systematic mystification of the experience of the oppressed by the perspective of the dominant. Thus despite the disagreements of many defenders of identity political claims with Marxism and other radical political models, they share the view that individuals' perceptions of their own interests may be systematically distorted and must be somehow freed of their misperceptions by group-based transformation.

Concern about this aspect of identity politics has crystallized around the transparency of experience to the oppressed, and the univocality of its interpretation. Experience is never, critics argue, simply epistemically available prior to interpretation (Scott 1992); rather it requires a theoretical framework—implicit or explicit—to give it meaning. Moreover, if experience is the origin of politics, then some critics worry that what Kruks (2001) calls “an epistemology of provenance” will become the norm: on this view, political perspectives gain legitimacy by virtue of their articulation by subjects of particular experiences. This, critics charge, closes off the possibility of critique of these perspectives by those who don't share the experience, which in turn inhibits political dialogue and coalition-building. Nonetheless, poststructuralist skepticism about the possibility of experience outside a hermeneutic frame has been countered with phenomenological attempts to articulate a ground for experience in the lived body (Alcoff 2000; see also Oksala 2004 and 2011; Stoller 2009).

From these understandings of subjectivity, it is easy to see how critics of identity politics, and even some cautious supporters, have feared that it is prone to essentialism. This expression is another philosophical term of abuse, intended to capture a multitude of sins. In its original contexts in metaphysics, the term implies the belief that an object has a certain quality by virtue of which it is what it is; for Locke, famously, the essence of a triangle is that it is a three-sided shape. In the contemporary humanities the term is used more loosely to imply, most commonly, an illegitimate generalization about identity (Heyes 2000). In the case of identity politics, two claims stand out as plausibly “essentialist:” the first is the understanding of the subject that characterizes a single axis of identity as discrete and taking priority in representing the self—as if being Asian-American, for example, were entirely separable from being a woman. To the extent that identity politics urges mobilization around a single axis, it will put pressure on participants to identify that axis as their defining feature, when in fact they may well understand themselves as integrated selves who cannot be represented so selectively or even reductively (Spelman 1988). The second form of essentialism is closely related to the first: generalizations made about particular social groups in the context of identity politics may come to have a disciplinary function within the group, not just describing but also dictating the self-understanding that its members should have. Thus, the supposedly liberatory new identity may inhibit autonomy, as Anthony Appiah puts it, replacing “one kind of tyranny with another” (Appiah in Gutmann ed. 1994, 163). Just as dominant groups in the culture at large insist that the marginalized integrate by assimilating to dominant norms, so within some practices of identity politics dominant sub-groups may, in theory and practice, impose their vision of the group's identity onto all its members. For example, in his films Black Is, Black Ain't and Tongues Untied Marlon Riggs eloquently portrays the exclusion of Black women and gay Black men from heterosexist and masculinist understandings of African-American identity politics.

Or, theorizing the experience of hybridity for those whose identities are especially far from norms of univocality, Gloria Anzaldúa, for example, famously writes of her mestiza identity as a Chicana, American, raised poor, a lesbian and a feminist, living in the metaphoric and literal Borderlands of the American Southwest (Anzaldúa 1999 [1987]). Some suggest the deployment of “strategic essentialism:” we should act as ifan identity were uniform only to achieve interim political goals, without implying any deeper authenticity (Spivak 1990, 1–16). Others argue that a relational social ontology, which makes clear the fluidity and interdependence of social groups, should be developed as an alternative to the reification of other approaches to identity politics (Young 2000; Nelson 2001). These accounts of subjectivity, ontologies, and ways of understanding solidarity and relationships are at the forefront of contemporary philosophical scholarship in identity politics.

3. Liberalism and Identity Politics

A key condition of possibility for contemporary identity politics was institutionalized liberal democracy (Brown 1995). The citizen mobilizations that made democracy real also shaped and unified groups previously marginal to the polity, while extensions of formal rights invited expectations of material and symbolic equality. The perceived paucity of rewards offered by liberal capitalism, however, spurred forms of radical critique that sought to explain the persistence of oppression. At the most basic philosophical level, critics of liberalism suggested that liberal social ontology—the model of the nature of and relationship between subjects and collectives—was misguided. The social ontology of most liberal political theories consists of citizens conceptualized as essentially similar individuals, as for example in John Rawls' famous thought experiment using the “original position,” in which representatives of the citizenry are conceptually divested of all specific identities or affiliations in order to make rational decisions about the social contract (Rawls 1970). To the extent that group interests are represented in liberal polities, they tend to be understood as associational, forms of interest group pluralism whereby those sharing particular interests voluntarily join together to create a political lobby. Citizens are free to register their individual preferences (through voting, for example), or to aggregate themselves for the opportunity to lobby more systematically (e.g. by forming an association such as a neighborhood community league). These lobbies, however, are not defined by the identity of their members so much as by specific shared interests and goals, and when pressing their case the marginalized subjectivity of the group members is not itself called into question. Finally, political parties, the other primary organs of liberal democratic government, critics suggest, have few moments of inclusivity, being organized around party discipline, responsiveness to lobby groups, and broad-based electoral popularity. Ultimately conventional liberal democracy, diverse radical critics claim, cannot effectively address the ongoing structural marginalization that persists in late capitalist liberal states, and may even be complicit with it (Young 1990; P. Williams 1991; Brown 1995; M. Williams 1998).

On a philosophical level, these understandings of the political subject and its relationship to collectivity came to seem inadequate to ensuring representation for women, gays and lesbians, or racial-ethnic groups (M. Williams 1998). Critics charged that the neutral citizen of liberal theory was in fact the bearer of an identity coded white, male, bourgeois, able-bodied, and heterosexual (Pateman 1988; Young 1990; Di Stefano 1991; Mills 1997; Pateman and Mills 2007). This implicit ontology in part explained the persistent historical failure of liberal democracies to achieve anything more than token inclusion in power structures for members of marginalized groups. A richer understanding of political subjects as constituted through and by their social location was required. In particular, the history and experience of oppression brought with it certain perspectives and needs that could not be assimilated through existing liberal structures. Individuals are oppressed by virtue of their membership in a particular social group—that is, a collective whose members have relatively little mobility into or out of the collective, who usually experience their membership as involuntary, who are generally identified as members by others, and whose opportunities are deeply shaped by the relation of their group to corollary groups through privilege and oppression (Cudd 2006). Oppression, then, is the systematic limiting of opportunity or constraints on self-determination because of such membership: for example, Frantz Fanon eloquently describes the experience of being always constrained by the white gaze as a Black man: “I already knew that there were legends, stories, history, and above all historicity… I was responsible at the same time for my body, my race, for my ancestors” (Fanon 1968, 112). Conversely, members of dominant groups are privileged—systematically advantaged by the deprivations imposed on the oppressed. For example, in a widely cited article Peggy McIntosh identifies whiteness as a dominant identity, and lists 47 ways in which she is advantaged by being white compared with her colleagues of color. These range from being able to buy “flesh-colored” Band-Aids that will match her skin tone, to knowing that she can be rude without provoking negative judgments of her racial group, to being able to buy a house in a middle-class community without risking neighbors' disapproval (1993).

Critics have also charged that assimilation (or, less provocatively, integration) is a guiding principle of liberalism. If the liberal subject is coded in the way Young (1990) suggests, then attempts to apply liberal norms of equality will risk demanding that the marginalized conform to the identities of their oppressors. For example, many gays and lesbians have objected to campaigns to institute “gay marriage” on the grounds that these legal developments assimilate same-sex relationships to a heterosexual model, rather than challenging its historical, material, and symbolic terms (e.g. Card 2007). If this is equality, they claim, then it looks suspiciously like the erasure of socially subordinate identities rather than their genuine incorporation into the polity. This suspicion helps to explain the affiliation of identity politics with separatism. This latter is a set of positions that share the view that attempts at integration of dominant and marginalized groups so consistently compromise the identity or potential of the less powerful that a distinct social and political space is the only structure that will adequately protect them. In Canada, for example, Québec separatists claim that the French language and francophone culture are persistently erased within an overwhelmingly dominant Anglo-American continent, despite the efforts of the Canadian state to maintain its official bilingualism and to integrate Québec into the nation. Given their long history of conflict and marginalization, a separate and sovereign Québec, they argue, is the only plausible solution (e.g. Laforest in Beiner and Norman 2001). Analogous arguments have been made on behalf of Native American and other indigenous peoples and African Americans (e.g. Alfred 1999, Asante 2000). Lesbian feminist separatists have claimed that the central mechanism for the oppression of women under patriarchy is heterosexuality. Understanding heterosexuality as a forced contract or compulsory institution, they argue that women's relationships with men are persistently characterized by domination and subordination. Only divorce (literal and figurative) and the creation of new geographic and political communities of woman-identified women will end patriarchal exploitation, and forge a liberatory female identity (Rich 1980; Frye 1983; Radicalesbians 1988; Wittig 1992).

One of the central charges against identity politics by liberals, among others, has been its alleged reliance on notions of sameness to justify political mobilization. Looking for people who are like you rather than who share your political values as allies runs the risk of sidelining critical political analysis of complex social locations and ghettoizing members of social groups as the only persons capable of making or understanding claims to justice. After an initial wave of relatively uncompromising identity politics, proponents have taken these criticisms to heart and moved to more philosophically nuanced accounts that appeal to coalitions as better organizing structures. On this view, separatism around a single identity formation must be muted by recognition of the internally heterogeneous and overlapping nature of social group memberships. The idea of a dominant identity from which the oppressed may need to dissociate themselves remains, but the alternative becomes a more fluid and diverse grouping, less intent on guarantees of internal homogeneity and more concerned with identifying “family resemblances” than literal identity (Heyes 2000).

This trajectory—from formal inclusion in liberal polities, to assertions of difference and new demands under the rubric of identity politics, to internal and external critique of identity political movements—has taken different forms in relation to different identities. Increasingly it is difficult to see what divides contemporary positions, and some commentators have suggested possible rapprochements between liberalism and identity politics (e.g. Laden 2001). A problem in sorting through such claims is the vagueness of philosophical discussions of identity politics, which are often content to list their rubric under the mantra of “gender, race, class, etc.” although these three are not obviously analogous, nor is it clear which identities are gestured toward by the predictable “etc.” (or why they do not merit naming). Class in particular has a distinctively different political history, and contemporary critics of identity politics, as I'll discuss below, often take themselves to be defending class analysis against identity politics' depoliticizing effects. Of those many forms of identity politics to which large academic literatures attach, however, I'll briefly highlight key issues concerning gender, sexuality, and a complex cluster of race, ethnicity and multiculturalism.

4. Gender and Feminism

Twentieth century feminism has consistently opposed biological determinism: the view that shared biological features among a certain group lead inevitably to certain social roles or functions. For example, one early opponent of women's suffrage suggested that women and men had different metabolic systems—katabolic (or “energy-expending”) in men, and anabolic (or “energy-conserving”) in women—that precluded women's effective or informed participation in politics (see Moi 2000, 3–21 for discussion). Feminist identity politics, then, takes up the task of articulating women's understandings of themselves (and of men) without reducing femininity (or masculine dominance) to biology. Whatever experiences women share will be experiences of femininity not necessarily resulting from an immutable sexual difference but rather from social injustice. Put less usefully, perhaps, although sex (the features of bodies we typically aggregate as male and female) may be biological, gender (the social roles we call femininity and masculinity) is “socially constructed.” Claims about the “social construction” of the identities of identity politics permeate the field as a logical extension of its mandate, although with tremendous philosophical vagueness attaching to the content of the phrase, which serves primarily to emphasize the contingency of (the content of) any particular category or concept (see Haslanger 1995, 2005; Hacking 1999). The fear of biological determinism has led to tremendous caution in feminist theorizing: any invocation of features of female bodies as a basis for identity political claims risks being seen as (inadvertently) complicit with sexist views. Furthermore, the very idea of reclaiming women's identities from patriarchy has been criticized as merely an affirmation of a slave morality—a Nietzschean term describing the attachments of the oppressed as they rationalize and valorize their condition. Attempts from various quarters to capture and revalue the distinctively feminine (by theorizing, for example, “maternal thinking,” [Ruddick 1989], or écriture féminine [Cixous 1976]) risk, critics claim, endorsing existing power relations. Thus the heated debates surrounding the “ethic of care” in moral psychology, for example, line up around two constellations of positions: on the one hand, advocates of the ethic of care as a distinctively feminine contribution to moral reasoning point to its benefits for negotiating a human social world characterized by webs of relationship, and to the pathologies of the dissociation that is culturally linked to masculinities. Carol Gilligan is the best known proponent of this position (although the details of her complex paradigm are often glossed over or misrepresented) (Gilligan 1993 [1982]). Her critics charge that she reifies femininity—were women not oppressed, they would not speak in the voice of care, thus casting doubt on the desirability of attempts to reclaim it as part of a liberatory framework. In other words, the current construction of femininity is so deeply imbricated with the oppression of women that such attempts will always end up reinforcing the very discourse they seek to undermine (Butler 1999 [1990]); this critique has strong affiliations with poststructuralism (which are discussed below).

The narrative of feminist interpretation of gender relations most commonly offered points to universalizing claims made on behalf of women during the so-called “second wave” of the feminist movement in the late 1960's and 1970's in Western countries. The most often discussed (and criticized) second wave feminist icons—women such as Betty Friedan or Gloria Steinem—are white, middle-class, and heterosexual, although this historical picture too often neglects the contributions of lesbian feminists, feminists of color, and working-class feminists, which were less visible in popular culture, perhaps, but arguably equally influential in the lives of women. For some early radical feminists, women's oppression as women was the core of identity politics, and should not be diluted with other identity issues. For example, Shulamith Firestone, in her classic book The Dialectic of Sex, argued that “racism is sexism extended,” and that the Black Power movement represented only sexist cooptation of Black women into a new kind of subservience to Black men. Thus for Black women to fight racism (especially among white women) was to divide the feminist movement, which properly focused on challenging patriarchy, understood as struggle between men and women, the foundational dynamic of all oppressions (Firestone 1970, esp. 103–120).

Claims about the universality of gender made during the second wave have been extensively criticized in feminist theory for failing to recognize the specificity of their own constituencies. For example, Friedan's famous proposition that women needed to get out of the household and into the professional workplace was, bell hooks pointed out, predicated on the experience of a post-war generation of white, middle-class married women confined to housekeeping and child-rearing by their professional husbands (Friedan 1963; hooks 1981). Many women of color and working-class women had worked outside their homes (sometimes in other women's homes) for decades; some lesbians had a history of working in traditionally male occupations or living alternative domestic lives without a man's “family wage.” Similarly, some women from the less developed world have been critical of Northern feminist theory for globalizing its claims. Such moves construct “Third World” women, they argue, as less developed or enlightened versions of their “First World” counterparts, rather than understanding their distinctively different situation (Mohanty 1988); or, they characterize liberation for Northern women in ways that exacerbate the exploitation of the global poor: by supporting economic conditions in which increasing numbers of western women can abuse immigrant domestic workers, for example (Anderson 2000). The question of what a global feminism should make of identity political claims, or how it should conceive solidarity among women from massively different locations within the global economic system remains open (Weir 2008).

Thus feminist claims made about the oppression of women founded in a notion of shared experience and identity are now invariably greeted with philosophical suspicion. Some critics have charged that this suspicion itself has become excessive, undercutting the very possibility of generalizations about women that gives feminist theory its force (Martin 1994), or that it marks the distancing of feminist philosophy from its roots in political organizing. Others suggest alternative methods for feminist theory that will minimize the emphasis on shared criteria of membership in a social group and stress instead the possibilities for alliances founded on non-identical connections (Young 1997; Heyes 2000; Cornell 2000). It is commonplace to hear that “identity” is a term in serious crisis in feminist thought, and that feminist praxis must move beyond identity politics (Dean 1996). Nonetheless, sex-gender as a set of analytical categories continues to guide feminist thought, albeit in troubled and troubling ways.

5. From Gay and Lesbian to Queer

Nowhere have conceptual struggles over identity been more pronounced than in the lesbian and gay liberation movement. The notion that sexual object choice can define who a person is has been profoundly challenged by the advent of queer politics. Visible early lesbian and gay activists emphasized the immutable and essential natures of their sexual identities. For some, they were a distinctively different natural kind of person, with the same rights as heterosexuals (another natural kind) to find fulfillment in marriage, property ownership, and so on. This strand of gay organizing (perhaps associated more closely with white, middle-class gay men, at least until the radicalizing effects of the AIDS pandemic) with its complex simultaneous appeals to difference and to sameness has a genealogy going back to pre-Stonewall homophilic activism (see discussion in Terry, esp. 353–7). While early lesbian feminists had a very different politics, oriented around liberation from patriarchy and the creation of separate spaces for woman-identified women, many still appealed to a more authentic, distinctively feminist self. Heterosexual feminine identities were products of oppression, yet the literature imagines a utopian alternative where woman-identification will liberate the lesbian within every woman (e.g. Radicalesbians 1988).

The paradigm shift that the term “queer” signals, then, is a shift to a model in which identities are more self-consciously historicized, seen as contingent products of particular genealogies rather than enduring or essential natural kinds (Phelan 1989 and 1994; Blasius 2001). Michel Foucault's work, especially his History of Sexuality, is the most widely cited progenitor of this view: Foucault famously argues that “homosexuality appeared as one of the forms of sexuality when it was transposed from the practice of sodomy onto a kind of interior androgyny, a hermaphrodism of the soul. The sodomite had been a temporary aberration; the homosexual was now a species” (Foucault 1980, 43). Although Foucault is the most often cited as the originator of such genealogical arguments about homosexuality, other often neglected writers contributed to the emergence of this new paradigm (e.g. M. McIntosh 1968). In western popular culture such theories co-exist uneasily with biologically essentialist accounts of sexual identity, which look for a particular gene, brain structure, or other biological feature that is noninteractive with environment and that will explain same-sex sexual desire. At stake are not only epistemological and metaphysical questions about how we can know what kind of thing “sexual orientation” might be, but also a host of moral and political questions. If sexual identity is biologically caused, then it is as hard to hold an individual morally responsible for being homosexual as it is to blame someone for being Black (which may not be as hard as some would like to think). Some gay activists thus see biological explanations of sexuality as offering a defense against homophobic commentators who believe that gays can voluntarily change their “immoral” desires. Indeed, much of the intuitive hostility to genealogical or social constructionist accounts of sexuality within gay and lesbian communities seems to come from the dual sense of many individuals that they could not have been other than gay, and that anything less than a radically essentialist view of sexuality will open the door to further attempts to “cure” them of their homosexuality (through “ex-gay ministries,” for example).

Whatever the truth of these fears, Eve Sedgwick is right, in my view, to say that no specific form of explanation for the origins of sexual preference will be proof against the infinitely varied strategies of homophobia (Sedgwick 1990, esp. 22–63). That sexual orientation takes on a metaphysical life of its own, for example, elides the fact that it is generally sexual behavior—not an abstract “identity”—that is the object of moral disapprobation. Queer politics, then, works to trouble the categories “gay” and “lesbian,” as well as “heterosexual” (or indeed other categories of social thought in general), and eschews a genetic quest for the origins of homosexuality. In addition to historicizing and contextualizing sexuality, including the very idea of sexual identity, the shift to queer is also characterized by deconstructive methods. Rather than understanding sexual identities as a set of discrete and independent social types, queer theorists adduce evidence and read to emphasize their mutual implication: for example, such thinkers love to point out that the word “homosexuality” first appears in English in 1897, but the term “heterosexuality” is back-formed, first used some years later (Garber 1995, 39–42). Heterosexuality comes into existence as a way of understanding the nature of individuals after the homosexual has been diagnosed; homosexuality requires heterosexuality as its opposite, despite its self-professed stand-alone essence. Queer theorists point out that the homo/hetero dichotomy, like many others in western intellectual history that it arguably draws on and reinforces, is not only mutually implicated, but also hierarchical (heterosexuality is superior, normal, and originary, while homosexuality is inferior, deviant, and derivative) and masquerades as natural or descriptive. The task of a more radical “identity politics,” on this vision, is to constantly denaturalize and deconstruct the identities in question, with a political goal of their subversion rather than their accommodation.

An exemplary conflict within the identity politics of sexuality focuses on the expansion of gay and lesbian organizing to those with other queer affiliations, especially bisexual and transgendered activists. Skepticism about inclusion of these groups in organizational mandates, community centers, parades, and festivals has origins in more traditional understandings of identity politics that see reclaiming lesbian and/or gay identity from its corruption in a homophobic society as a task compromised by those whose identities are read as diluted, treacherous, ambiguous, or peripheral. Some lesbian feminist critiques of transgender, for example, see male-to-female transsexuals in particular as male infiltrators of women's space, individuals so intent on denying their male privilege that they will modify their bodies and attempt to pass as women to do it; bisexual women dabble in lesbian life, but flee to straight privilege when occasion demands (see Heyes 2003 for references and discussion). These arguments have been challenged in turn by writers who see them as attempts to justify purity of identity that merely replace the old exclusions with new dictatorships (Stone 1991, Lugones 1994) and inhibit coalitional organizing against conservative foes.

6. Race, Ethnicity, and Multiculturalism

Similar debates in philosophy of race highlight the contingent and historical nature of “race” as a category of identity. Despite a complex history of biological essentialism in the presentation of racial typologies, the notion of a genetic basis to racial difference has been largely discredited; the criteria different societies (at different times) use to organize and hierarchize “racial formations” are political and contingent (Omi and Winant 1986). While skin color, appearance of facial features, or hair type are in some trivial sense genetically determined, the grouping of different persons into races does not pick out any patterned biological difference (although see the debate “Is Race Real?” in the internet resources. What it does pick out is a set of social meanings with political ramifications (Alcoff 1997, 2006). The most notorious example of an attempt to rationalize racial difference as biological is the) U.S. “one-drop rule,” under which an individual was characterized as Black if they had “one drop” or more of “Black blood.” Adrian Piper points out that not only does this belief persist into contemporary readings of racial identity, it also implies that given the prolonged history of racial mixing in the US—both coerced and voluntary—very significant numbers of nominally “white” people in the U.S. today should be re-classified as “Black” (Piper 1996). In those countries that have had official racial classifications, individuals' struggles to be re-classified (almost always as a member of a more privileged racial group) are often invoked to highlight the contingency of race, especially at the borders of its categories. And a number of histories of racial groups that have apparently changed their racial identification—Jews, Italians, or the Irish, for example—also illustrate social constructionist theses (Ignatiev 1995). The claim that race is “socially constructed,” however, does not in itself mark out a specific identity politics. Indeed, the very contingency of race and its lack of correlation with categories that have more meaning in everyday life (such as ethnicity or culture) may circumscribe its political usefulness: just as feminists have found the limits of appeals to “women's identity,” so Asian-Americans may find with ethnicities and cultures as diverse as Chinese, Indian, or Vietnamese that their racial designation itself provides little common ground. That a US citizen of both Norwegian and Ashkenazi Jewish heritage will check that they are “white” on a census form says relatively little (although nonetheless something) about their experience of their identity, or indeed of their very different relationship to anti-Semitism. Tropes of separatism and the search for forms of authentic self-expression are related to race via ethno-cultural understandings of identity: for example, the U.S. Afro-centric movement appeals to the cultural significance of African heritage for Black Americans (Asante 2000).

Racial categories are perhaps most politically significant in their contested relation to racism. Racism attempts to reduce members of social groups to their racial features, drawing on a complex history of racial stereotypes to do so. Racism is arguably analogous to other forms of oppression in being both overt and institutionalized, manifested both as deliberate acts by individuals and as unplanned systemic outcomes. The specific direction of US discussion of the categories of race has been around color-blind versus color-conscious public policy (Appiah and Gutmann 1996). Color-blindness—that is, the view that race should be ignored in public policy and everyday exchange—has hegemony in popular discourse. Drawing attention to race—whether in a personal description or in university admissions procedures—is unfair and racist. Advocates of color-consciousness, on the other hand, argue that racism will not disappear without proactive efforts, which require the invocation of race. Thus affirmative action, for example, requires statistics about the numbers of members of oppressed racial groups employed in certain contexts, which in turn requires racial identification and categorization. Thus those working against racism face a paradox familiar in identity politics: the very identity they aim to dispel must be invoked to make their case.

The literature on multiculturalism takes up questions of race, ethnicity, and cultural diversity in relation to the liberal state. Some multicultural states—notably Canada—allegedly aim to permit the various cultural identities of their residents to be preserved rather than assimilated, despite the concern that the over-arching liberal aims of such states may be at odds with the values of those they claim to protect. For example, Susan Moller Okin argues that multiculturalism is sometimes bad for women, especially when it works to preserve patriarchal values in minority cultures. If multiculturalism implies a form of cultural relativism that prevents judgment of or interference with the “private” practices of minorities, female genital mutilation, forced marriage, compulsory veiling, or being deprived of education may be the consequence. Okin's critics counter that she falsely portrays culture as static, internally homogeneous, and defined by men's values, allowing liberalism to represent a culturally unmarked medium for the defense of individual rights (Okin et al 1999). For many commentators on multiculturalism this is the nub of the issue: is there an inconsistency between defending the rights of minority cultures, while prohibiting those (allegedly) cultural practices that the state judges illiberal (Eisenberg and Spinner-Halev 2005; Phillips 2007)? Can liberalism sustain the cultural and value-neutrality that some commentators still ascribe to it, or to what extent should it embrace its own cultural specificity (Taylor, Habermas in Gutmann, ed. 1994; Lawrence and Herzog, eds. 1994; Kymlicka, ed. 1995; Deveaux 2000)? Defenders of the right to cultural expression of minorities in multicultural states thus practice forms of identity politics that are both made possible by liberalism and sometimes in tension with it (see Laden and Owen eds. 2007).

7. Contemporary philosophical engagement with identity politics

Since its 1970s vogue, identity politics as a mode of organizing and set of political philosophical positions has undergone numerous attacks by those motivated to point to its flaws, whether by its pragmatic exclusions or more programmatically. For many leftist commentators, in particular, identity politics is something of a bête noire, representing the capitulation to cultural criticism in place of analysis of the material roots of oppression. Marxists, both orthodox and revisionist, and socialists—especially those who came of age during the rise of the New Left in western countries—have often interpreted the perceived ascendancy of identity politics as representing the end of radical materialist critique (see discussions in Farred 2000 and McNay 2008, 126–161). Identity politics, for these critics, is both factionalizing and depoliticizing, drawing attention away from the ravages of late capitalism toward superstructural cultural accommodations that leave economic structures unchanged. For example, while allowing that both recognition and redistribution have a place in contemporary politics, Nancy Fraser laments the supremacy of perspectives that take injustice to inhere in “cultural” constructions of identity that the people to whom they are attributed want to reject. Such recognition models, she argues, require remedies that “valorize the group's ‘groupness’ by recognizing its specificity,” thus reifying identities that themselves are products of oppressive structures. By contrast, injustices of distribution require redistributive remedies that aim “to put the group out of business as a group” (Fraser 1997, 19).

The reasons given for the alleged turn away from economic oppression to themes of culture, language, and identity in contemporary politics differ. First, the institutionalization of North American radicalism in the middle-class bastion of academia creates incentives for intellectuals to minimize the political importance of their own class privilege, and focus instead on other identities (in turn divorced from their economic inflections). Second, as Wendy Brown suggests, capitalist suffering may have been displaced onto other identities, interpreted through the lens of class aspiration (Brown 1995, 59–60). Third, the turn away from economic analysis may be less dramatic than some critics believe. Global capitalism is widening the gap between the over- and less-developed countries, and working to further marginalize women, ethnic or indigenous minorities, and the disabled in the so-called Third and Fourth Worlds.[1] A now longstanding anti-global-capital movement has grappled with identity political issues for some time (see Lott 2000). How is twenty-first century anti-capitalist activism imbricated with identity politics (Upping the Anti 2005)? The enormous tangible consequences of the 2008 economic crisis, subsequent public outrage about economic inequalities, and the 2011 “Occupy” movement motivate a widespread and growing return to left economic critique that signals a new class politics. There is already discussion of the relationship between popular protest against inequalities of wealth and other political movements: What does Occupy owe to feminist and civil rights organizing and consciousness-raising tactics, and why should worsening economic disparities be understood as feminist and anti-racist struggles as well as struggles of class? Has Occupy in North America reckoned with its implication with the history of settler colonialism? More radically, does Occupy indicate a radical departure from old understandings of ideology versus identity, and refocus political attention on “meaning, action, and feeling” (Protevi 2011) or on the significance of embodied action in shared space (Butler 2011)?

More general debates about the philosophical adequacy of a politics of recognition continue: for example, in her 2008 book Against Recognition, Lois McNay argues that identity claims that are at the heart of many contemporary social movements are represented as demands for recognition in the context of an over-simplified account of power. Although theorists of recognition typically start from a Hegelian model of the subject as dialogically formed and necessarily situated, they too quickly abandon the radical consequences of such a view for subject formation, McNay argues. The subject of recognition becomes both personalized and hypostatized—divorced from the larger social systems of power that create conditions of possibility for particular “identities” (2008, esp. 1–23). In this way, the debates around subject-formation that are at the heart of philosophical discussions of identity politics parallel debates between Habermasians and Foucauldians about the possibility of a transcendental subject that can ground practices of critique (see Allen 2008).

The problems that motivated identity political movements are not gone in 2012: Aboriginal cultures are often ignored in mainstream educational systems, violence against women still permeates our lives, “equality” for queer people is still typically premised on sameness to privileged heterosexual subjectivity, and so on. Nonetheless, the very term “identity politics” seems in many ways hopelessly outmoded. Models premised on categorical identification seem increasingly inadequate to the complexities of our becomings, and intra-group sameness as the basis of political solidarity feels not only exclusionary but also too heavily predicated on negation and loss.

In particular, poststructuralist challengers charge that identity politics rests on a mistaken view of the subject that assumes a metaphysics of substance—that is, that a cohesive, self-identical subject is ontologically (if not actually) prior to any form of social injustice (Butler 1999). This subject has certain core essential attributes that define her or his identity, over which are imposed forms of socialization that cause her or him to internalize other nonessential attributes. This position, they suggest, misrepresents both the ontology of identity and its political significance. The alternative view offered by poststructuralists is that the subject is itself always already a product of discourse, which represents both the condition of possibility for a certain subject-position and a constraint on what forms of self-making individuals may engage. There is no real identity—individual or group-based—that is separable from its conditions of possibility, and any political appeal to identity formations must engage with the paradox of acting from the very subject-positions it must also oppose. Central to this position is the observation that any claim to identity must organize itself around a constitutive exclusion:

An identity is established in relation to a series of differences that have become socially recognized. These differences are essential to its being. If they did not coexist as differences, it would not exist in its distinctness and solidity. Entrenched in this indispensable relation is a second set of tendencies, themselves in need of exploration, to conceal established identities into fixed forms, thought and lived as if their structure expressed the true order of things. When these pressures prevail, the maintenance of one identity (or field of identities) involves the conversion of some differences into otherness, into evil, or one of its numerous surrogates. Identity requires differences in order to be, and it converts difference into otherness in order to secure its own self-certainty. (Connolly 2002, 64)

The dangers of identity politics, then, are that it casts as authentic to the self or group an identity that in fact is defined by its opposition to an Other. Reclaiming such an identity as one's own merely reinforces its dependence on this dominant Other, and further internalizes and reinforces an oppressive hierarchy. While the charge that identity politics promotes a victim mentality is often a facile pot-shot, Wendy Brown offers a more sophisticated caution against the dangers of ressentiment (the moralizing revenge of the powerless). She argues that identity politics has its own genealogy in liberal capitalism that relentlessly reinforces the “wounded attachments” it claims to sever: “Politicized identity thus enunciates itself, makes claims for itself, only by entrenching, restating, dramatizing, and inscribing its pain in politics; it can hold out no future—for itself or others—that triumphs over this pain” (Brown 1995, 74). This challenge has been met with more intense discussion of the temporality of identity politics: can an identification be premised on a forward-looking solidarity rather than a ressentiment-laden exclusion (see Zerilli 2005; Weir 2008; Bhambra and Margee 2010)? Further, what political alternatives does the poststructuralist model imply? Proponents of identity politics have suggested that poststructuralism is politically impotent, capable only of deconstruction and never of action (Hartsock 1998, 205–226). Yet there are political projects motivated by poststructuralist theses. For example, Judith Butler's famous articulation of performativity as a way of understanding subject-development suggests to her and others the possibility of disarticulating seamless performances to subvert the meanings with which they are invested (Butler 1999 [1990]). Drag can constitute such a disarticulation, although other critics have suggested other examples; Adrian Piper's conceptual art seeks to disrupt the presumed self-identity of race by showing how it is actively interpreted and reconstituted, never determinate and self-evident. Linda Zerilli discusses the “world-building” work of the Milan Women's Bookstore Collective—a feminist group that rejects a subject-centred view of women's injured status in favor of a protensive practice of freedom (2005, chapter 3).

The continuing intellectual crisis surrounding identity politics paradoxically marks its importance to contemporary political philosophy and practice. Both flexible and extensible, identity political tropes continue to influence new political claims: an extensive literature approaches disability, for example, as a diverse and dynamic set of experiences of social injustice that sediment self-understandings among the disabled and motivate a politics that insists dominant cultures change their exclusionary social practices (Wendell 1996; Davis 1997 [2006]; Silvers 1998, Siebers 2008). Perhaps most important for philosophers, any idea of identity itself appears to be in a period of rapid evolution. Changing technologies are having a profound impact on our philosophical understandings of who we are. Attempts to decode human genetics (Abu El-Haj 2007) and possibly shape the genetic make-up of future persons (Wald 2000), to clone human beings, or to xeno-transplant animal organs, and so on, all raise deep philosophical questions about the kind of thing a person is. We are capable of changing our bodies in ways that dramatically change our identities, including through sex change or cosmetic surgeries, with immediate consequences for the kinds of identities I have been discussing in this essay. As more and more people form political alliances using disembodied communications technologies, the kinds of identities that matter seem also to shift (Turkle 1995). Behaviors, beliefs, and self-understandings are increasingly pathologized as syndromes and disorders, including through the identification of new “types” of person (in turn generating possibilities for new forms of identity politics) (Elliott 2003a and 2003b; Rose 1997).

Increasingly, this long list of confounding variables for identity political thought is finding philosophical cohesion in anti-identarian models that take somatic life, affect, time, or space as organizing concepts. For example, both new materialisms and neo-vitalist philosophies, in their political contexts, share an emphasis on becoming over being, a “posthumanist” reluctance to award ontological priority to any shared characteristics of human beings (Wolfe 2010), a skepticism about discourses of authenticity and belonging, and a desire to focus on generative, forward-looking political solutions (Bhambra and Margee 2010; Coole and Frost 2010; Connolly 2011). The lines between humans and other animals (Haraway 2007), between the living and the non-living (Sharp 2011), and between objects and subjects (Bennett 2009) are radically challenged. To varying degrees these emphases are echoed in other process ontologies within contemporary “continental” thought—whether the ethics of self-transformation organized around Foucault's last work (Heyes 2007), the reintroduction of bodies as socially and biologically dynamic and intra-active forces in forming political subjectivities (Protevi 2009), or the ways indirect, technologically mediated experience shapes so much of our contemporary “identities” (Turkle 2011). This mass of shifts and contradictions might be thought to mark the end of the era of identity politics. Whatever limits are inherent to identity political formations, however, the unfashionableness of the phrase itself belies the deep implication of questions of power and legitimate government with demands for self-determination that are unlikely to fade away.

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Other important works

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