# Liar Paradox

*First published Thu Jan 20, 2011*

The first sentence in this essay is a lie. There is something odd about saying so, as has been known since ancient times. To see why, remember that all lies are untrue. Is the first sentence true? If it is, then it is a lie, and so it is not true. Conversely, suppose that it is not true. As we (viz., the authors) have said it, presumably with the intention of you believing it when it is not true, it is a lie. But then it is true!

That there is some sort of puzzle to be found with sentences like the
first one of this essay has been noted frequently throughout the
history of philosophy. It was discussed in classical times, notably
by the Megarians, but it was also mentioned by Aristotle and by
Cicero. As one of the insolubilia, it was the subject of extensive
investigation by medieval logicians such as Buridan. More recently,
work on this problem has been an integral part of the development of
modern mathematical logic, and it has become a subject of extensive
research in its own right. The paradox is sometimes called the
‘Epimenides paradox’ as the tradition attributes a
sentence like the first one in this essay to Epimenides of Crete, who
is reputed to have said that all Cretans are always liars. That some
Cretan has said so winds up in no less a source than New
Testament!^{[1]}

Lying is a complicated matter, but what's puzzling about sentences like the first one of this essay isn't essentially tied to intentions, social norms, or anything like that. Rather, it seems to have something to do with truth, or at least, some semantic notion related to truth. The puzzle is usually named ‘the Liar paradox’, though this really names a family of paradoxes that are associated with our type of puzzling sentence. The family is aptly named one of paradoxes, as they seem to lead to incoherent conclusions, such as: “everything is true”. Indeed, the Liar seems to allow us to reach such conclusions on the basis of logic, plus some very obvious principles that have sometimes been counted as principles of logic. Thus, we have the rather surprising situation of something near or like logic alone leading us to incoherence. This is perhaps the most virulent strain of paradox, and dealing with it has been an important task in logic for about as long as there has been logic.

In this essay, we will review the important members of the family of Liar paradoxes, and some of the important ideas about how these paradoxes might be resolved. The past few thousand years have yielded a great number of proposals, and we will not be able to examine all of them; instead, we will focus on a few that have, in recent discussions, proved to be important.

## 1. The Paradox and the Broader Phenomenon

### 1.1 Simple-falsity Liar

Consider a sentence named ‘FLiar’, which says of itself (i.e., says of FLiar) that it is false.

FLiar:FLiar is false.

This seems to lead to contradiction as follows. If the sentence ‘FLiar is false’ is true, then FLiar is false. But if FLiar is false, then the sentence ‘FLiar is false’ is true. Since FLiar just is the sentence ‘FLiar is false’, we have it that FLiar is false if and only if FLiar is true. But, now, if every sentence is true or false, FLiar itself is either true or false, in which case—given our reasoning above—it is both true and false. This is a contradiction. Contradictions, according to many logical theories (e.g., classical logic, intuitionistic logic, and much more) imply absurdity—triviality, that is, that every sentence is true.

An obvious response is to deny that every sentence is true or false, i.e. to deny the principle of bivalence. As we will discuss in §4, some descendants of this idea remain important in current work on the Liar. Even so, a simple variant Liar sentence shows that this immediate answer is not all there is to the story.

### 1.2 Simple-untruth Liar

Rather than work with falsehood, we can construct a Liar sentence
with the complex predicate ‘not
true’.^{[2]}
Consider a sentence named
‘ULiar’ (for ‘un-true’), which says of itself
that it is not true.

ULiar:ULiar is not true.

The argument towards contradiction is similar to the FLiar case. In short: if ULiar is true, then it is not true; and if not true, then true. But, now, if every sentence is true or not true, ULiar itself is true or not true, in which case it is both true and not true. This is a contradiction. According to many logical theories, a contradiction implies absurdity—triviality.

The two forms of the Liar paradox we have so far reviewed rely on some explicit self-reference—sentences talking directly about themselves. Such explicit self-reference can be avoided, as is shown by our next family of Liar paradoxes.

### 1.3 Liar cycles

Consider a very concise (viz., one-sentence-each) dialog between siblings Max and Agnes.

Max:Agnes' claim is true. Agnes:Max's claim is not true.

What Max said is true if and only if what Agnes said is true. But what Agnes said (viz., ‘Max's claim is not true’) is true if and only if what Max said is not true. Hence, what Max said is true if and only if what Max said is not true. But, now, if what Max said is true or not true, then it is both true and not true. And this, as in the FLiar and ULiar cases, is a contradiction, implying, according to many logical theories, absurdity.

Liar paradoxes can also be formed using more complex sentence structure, rather than complex modes of reference. One that has been important involves Boolean compounds.

### 1.4 Boolean compounds

Boolean compounds can enter into Liar sentences in many ways. One relatively simple one is as follows. Consider the following sentence named ‘DLiar’ (for ‘Disjunctive’).

DLiar:Either DLiar is not true or 1=0.

Since 1≠0, we conclude (via disjunctive syllogism, which sanctions
inferring sentence *B* from the sentences *A*
∨ *B* and ¬*A*) that DLiar is not true. But a
disjunction is true if and only if at least one disjunct is
true. Hence, since ‘DLiar is not true’ is true, at least
one of DLiar's disjuncts is true (viz., the left one). Hence, DLiar is
true. Hence, DLiar, like its cousins (FLiar, ULiar, etc), is true if
and only if DLiar is not true. So, if DLiar is true or not true, it is
both true and not true. This is a contradiction, which, according to
many logical theories, implies absurdity.

We pause to mention DLiar as it is connected with another important
paradox: Curry's paradox, which involves conditionals that say of
themselves only that if they (the conditional itself) are true, so too
is some absurdity (e.g., ‘if this sentence is true, then
1=0’ or ‘if this sentence is true, everything is
true’ or so on). At least in languages where the conditional is
the material conditional, and so *A* ⊃ *B* is
equivalent to ¬*A* ∨ *B*, DLiar is equivalent to
the Curry sentence ‘DLiar is true ⊃ 1 = 0’. Though
this may set up some relations between the Liar and Curry's paradox,
we pause to note an important difference. For the Curry paradox is
most important where the conditional is more than the material
conditional (or some modalized variant of it). In such settings, the
Curry paradox does not wear negation on its sleeve, as DLiar does.
For more information, consult the entry on
Curry's paradox.

### 1.5 Infinite sequences

The question of whether the Liar paradox really requires some sort of circularity has been the subject of extensive debate. Liar cycles (e.g., the Max–Agnes dialog) show that explicit self-reference is not necessary, but it is clear that such cycles themselves involve circular reference. Yablo (1993b) has argued that a more complicated kind of multi-sentence paradox produces a Liar without circularity.

Yablo's paradox relies on an infinite sequence of claims
*A*_{0},*A*_{1},*A*_{2},…,
where each *A*_{i} says that all of the
‘greater’ *A*_{k} (i.e., the
*A*_{k} such that *k* > *i*) are untrue. (In other
words, each claim says of the rest that they're all untrue.)
Since we have an infinite sequence, this version of the Liar paradox
appears to avoid the sort of circularity apparent in the previous
examples; however, contradiction still seems to emerge. If
*A*_{0} is true, then all of the ‘greater’
*A*_{k} are untrue, and a fortiori
*A*_{1} is untrue. But, then, there is at least one true
*A*_{k} greater than *A*_{1} (i.e.,
some *A*_{k} such that *k* > 1), which
contradicts *A*_{0}. Conversely, if *A*_{0}
is untrue, then there's at least one true
*A*_{k} greater than *A*_{0}.
Letting *A*_{m} be such a one (i.e., a truth
greater than *A*_{0}), we have it that
*A*_{m+1} is untrue, in which case there's some
truth greater than *A*_{m+1}. But this contradicts
*A*_{m}. What we have, then, is that if
*A*_{0} (the first claim in the infinite sequence) is
true or untrue, then it is both. And this, as in the other cases, is
a contradiction.

Whether Yablo's paradox really avoids self-reference is much-debated. See, for instance, Beall (2001), Priest (1997), Sorensen (1998), and also Cook (2006) and references therein.

## 2. Basic Ingredients

We have already seen a kind of characteristic reasoning that goes
with the Liar. We have also seen some common structure across all our
example Liar paradoxes, such as the presence of truth predicates, and
something like negation. We pause here to discuss these ingredients
of the paradox, focusing on the *basic* Liars. Just what
creates the Liar paradox, and just which of the puzzles we just
surveyed is ‘basic’, is a contentious matter; different
approaches to solving the Liar view these matters differently. Hence,
our goal is merely to illuminate some common themes across different
Liars, not to offer a full diagnosis of the source of the paradox.

We highlight three aspects of the Liar: the role of truth predicates, the kinds of principles for reasoning about truth that are needed, and the way that a paradox can be derived given these resources.

### 2.1 Truth predicate

The first ingredient in building a Liar is a truth predicate, which we
write here as *Tr*. We follow the usual custom in logic of
treating this as a predicate of sentences. However, especially as we
come to consider some ways of resolving the Liar, it should be
remembered that this treatment can be seen as more for convenience in
exposition than a serious commitment to what truth bearers are.

We assume that we have, along with the truth predicate, appropriate
names of sentences. For a given sentence *A*, suppose that
^{⌜}*A*^{⌝} is a name for it. A predication of truth to
*A* then looks like *Tr*(^{⌜}*A*^{⌝}).

We shall say that a predicate *Tr*(*x*) is a *truth predicate for
language*
L if
*Tr*(^{⌜}*A*^{⌝}) is
well-formed for every sentence *A* of
L. We
typically expect *Tr* to obey some principles governing its
behavior on sentences of a given language. It is to those we now
turn.^{[3]}

### 2.2 Principles of truth

The tradition, going back to Tarski (1935), is that the behavior of
the truth predicate *Tr* is described by the following
biconditional.

Tr(^{⌜}A^{⌝}) ↔A.

Indeed, Tarski took the biconditional here to be the material
biconditional of classical logic. This is usually called the
*T-schema*. For more on the T-schema, and Tarski's views of
truth, see the entries on
Alfred Tarski
and
Tarski's truth definitions.

The Liar paradox has been a locus of thinking about non-classical
logics (as we already saw a taste of, for instance, in the idea that
bivalence might be rejected as part of a solution to the Liar). Thus,
we should stop to consider what principles should govern the truth
predicate *Tr* if classical logic is not to hold.

The leading idea for what might replace the T-schema points to two
sorts of ‘rules’ (e.g., two sorts of ‘inference
rules’ in some sense) or principles that are characteristic of
the truth predicate. If you have a sentence *A*, you can infer
*Tr*(^{⌜}*A*^{⌝}), that
is, you can ‘capture’
*A* with the truth predicate. Conversely, if you have
*Tr*(^{⌜}*A*^{⌝}), you can
infer *A*, that is, you can ‘release’ *A*
from the truth predicate. In some logics, capture and release wind up
being equivalent to the T-schema, but it is often helpful to break
these up:

CaptureAimpliesTr(^{⌜}A^{⌝}). (We also write this asA⊢Tr(^{⌜}A^{⌝}).)ReleaseTr(^{⌜}A^{⌝}) impliesA. (We also write this asTr(^{⌜}A^{⌝}) ⊢A.)

*Implies* here is a logical notion, though just which one, and
what the options are, depends on what background logic is assumed.
For our discussion, we think of it in so-called rule form: that the
argument from *A* to *B* is valid, which we record (as
above) via the turnstile. In some logical settings (e.g., classical
logic, in which a certain so-called deduction theorem holds), this is
equivalent to the provability of a conditional, but in some settings,
it is not. Either way, capture and release jointly make *A* and
*Tr*(^{⌜}*A*^{⌝})
logically equivalent in the sense of being inter-derivable. Thus,
⊢ is being used here as a schematic placeholder for a range of
different logical notions, each of which will provide some notion of
valid inference in some logical theory.

(There are a
number of logical subtleties here that we will not pursue, especially
about how to formulate rules, and which rules are consistent.
Different formulations of rules vary significantly in logical
strength as
well.^{[4]} See
the entry on
axiomatic theories of truth
for more on how consistent forms of capture and release can be
formulated in classical logic. In the terminology of Friedman and
Sheard (1987), the rule forms of capture and release are called
‘T-Intro’ and ‘T-Elim’, and the conditional
forms ‘T-In’ and ‘T-Out’. We prefer the
broader terminology, since it highlights a general form of behavior
common to a great variety of predicates and operators,
e.g., *knowledge* releases but doesn't
capture; *possibility* captures but doesn't release; and so on;
and truth is special in doing both.)

### 2.3 The Liar in short

The Liar paradox begins with a language containing a truth predicate, which obeys some form of capture and release. We now explore more carefully how a paradox results from these assumptions.

#### 2.3.1 Existence of Liar-like sentences

Putting aside Yablo-type paradoxes, the Liar relies on some form of self-reference, either direct, as in in the simple Liars above, or indirect, as in Liar cycles. Most natural languages have little trouble generating self-reference. The first sentence of this essay is one example. Self-reference can be accidental, as in the case where someone writes ‘The only sentence on the blackboard in room 101 is not true’, by chance writing this in room 101 itself (as C. Parsons (1974) noted).

In formal languages, self-reference is also very easy to come by. Any
language capable of expressing some basic syntax can generate
self-referential sentences via so-called diagonalization (or more
properly, any language together with an appropriate theory of syntax
or arithmetic).^{[5]} A language
containing a truth predicate and this basic syntax will thus have a
sentence *L* such that *L* implies
¬*Tr*(^{⌜}*L*^{⌝}) and vice versa:

L⊣⊢¬Tr(^{⌜}L^{⌝}).

This is a ‘fixed point’ of (the compound predicate) ¬Tr, and is, in effect, our simple-untruth Liar.

(It may help some
readers, here and throughout, to think of such a Liar sentence
*L* arising from a *name* *c* that denotes the
sentence ¬*Tr*(*c*). In this way, we can think of the existence of
the Liar as being reflected in the identity *c* =
^{⌜}¬*Tr*(*c*)^{⌝}.)

#### 2.3.2 Other logical ‘laws’

Other conspicuous ingredients in common Liar paradoxes concern logical behavior of basic connectives or features of implication. A few of the relevant principles are:

- Excluded middle (LEM): ⊢
*A*∨¬*A*. - Explosion
(EFQ):
^{[6]}*A*,¬*A*⊢*B*. - Disjunction principle (DP):
^{[7]}If*A*⊢*C*and*B*⊢*C*then*A*∨*B*⊢*C*. - Adjunction: If
*A*⊢*B*and*A*⊢*C*then*A*⊢*B*∧*C*.

(This is not to suggest that these are the *only* logical
features involved in common Liar paradoxes, but they're
arguably the most important of the salient ones.)

#### 2.3.3 The Liar in abstract

Given the foregoing ingredients, we can now give a slightly more
abstract form of the paradox. (Our hope is to use this abstract form
to highlight different responses to the paradox.) We suppose that we
have a language L with a truth predicate
*Tr*, and that L allows enough syntax to
construct a sentence *L* such that *L*
⊣⊢¬*Tr*(^{⌜}*L*^{⌝}).
We also suppose that
the logic of L enjoys LEM and EFQ and satisfies
DP and adjunction.

The argument that our Liar sentence *L* implies a contradiction
runs as follows.

*Tr*(^{⌜}*L*^{⌝}) ∨¬*Tr*(^{⌜}*L*^{⌝}) [LEM]- Case One:
*Tr*(^{⌜}*L*^{⌝})*L*[2a: release]- ¬
*Tr*(^{⌜}*L*^{⌝}) [2b: definition of*L*] - ¬
*Tr*(^{⌜}*L*^{⌝}) ∧*Tr*(^{⌜}*L*^{⌝}) [2a, 2c: adjunction]

- Case Two:
- ¬
*Tr*(^{⌜}*L*^{⌝}) *L*[3a: definition of*L*]*Tr*(^{⌜}*L*)^{⌝}) [3b: capture]- ¬
*Tr*(^{⌜}*L*^{⌝}) ∧*Tr*(^{⌜}*L*^{⌝}) [3a, 3c: adjunction]

- ¬
- ¬
*Tr*(^{⌜}*L*^{⌝}) ∧*Tr*(^{⌜}*L*^{⌝}) [1–3: DP]

This version of the Liar is one of many. With a little more
complexity, for instance, either capture or release can be avoided in
favor of some other background assumptions. Intuitionistic variants
of the Liar are also available, though we shall not explore
intuitionistic logic here.^{[8]}

We have so far shown that with the given ingredients our Liar
sentence *L* implies a contradiction (thus formalizing the
reasoning in ULiar). From here, it is one short step to all-out
absurdity—if the lone contradiction weren't already
absurd enough. We invoke EFQ to finish the proof. (Well, we also
assume that *A* ∧ *B* implies *A* and *B*, i.e., that
simplification is valid in L.)

*B*[4: EFQ]

*B*, here, may be any—every—sentence that you like
(or don't like, as the case may be)! EFQ is the principle that
every sentence follows from a contradiction; it sanctions the step
from a single contradiction to outright triviality of logic.

In the face of such absurdity (triviality), we conclude that something is wrong in the foregoing Liar reasoning. The question is: what? This, in the end, is the question that the Liar paradox raises.

## 3. Significance

We have now seen that with some elementary assumptions about truth and logic, a logical disaster ensues. What is the wider significance of such a result?

From time to time, the Liar has been argued to show us something far-reaching about philosophy. For instance, Grim (1991) has argued that it shows the world to be essentially ‘incomplete’ in some sense, and that there can be no omniscient being. McGee (1991) and others suggest that the Liar shows the notion of truth to be a vague notion. Glanzberg (2001) holds that the Liar shows us something important about the nature of context dependence in language, while Eklund (2002) holds that it shows us something important about the nature of semantic competence and the languages we speak. Gupta and Belnap (1993) claim that it reveals important properties of the general notion of definition. And there are other lessons, and variations on such lessons, that have been drawn.

Of more immediate concern, at least for our purposes here, is what the Liar shows us about the basic principles governing truth, and about logic. In a skeptical vein, Tarski himself (1935, 1944) seems to have thought the Liar shows the ordinary notion of truth to be incoherent, and in need of replacement with a more scientifically respectable one. (For more on Tarski, see the entries on Tarski and Tarski's truth definitions. For more on Tarski's aims and purposes, see Heck (1997).) More common, and perhaps the dominant thread in the solutions to the Liar, is the idea that the basic principles governing truth are more subtle than the T-schema reflects.

The Liar has also formed the core of arguments against classical logic, as it is some key features of classical logic that allow capture and release to result in absurdity. Most notable are the arguments for logics that are paracomplete (e.g., Kripke (1975), Field (2008), and others) and paraconsistent (e.g., Asenjo (1966), Priest (1984, 2006), and others).

In many cases inspired by wider views of the significance of the paradox, there have been a number of attempts to one way or another resolve the paradox. It is to these proposed solutions that we now turn.

## 4. Some Families of Solutions

In this section, we briefly survey some approaches to resolving the Liar paradox. We group proposed solutions into families, and try to explain the basic ideas behind them. In many cases, a full exposition would involve a great deal of technical material, that we will not go into here. Interested readers are encouraged to follow the references we provide for each basic idea.

### 4.1 Non-classical logics

One of the leading ideas for how to resolve the Liar paradox is that it shows us something about logic, in fact, something far-reaching about logic. The main idea is that the principles of capture and release are the fundamental conceptual principles governing truth, and cannot be modified. Instead, basic logic must be non-classical, to avoid a logical disaster of the kind we reviewed in §2.

One important way to motivate non-classical solutions is to appeal to
a form of *deflationism* about truth. Such views take something
akin to the T-schema to be the defining characteristic of truth, and
as such, not open to modification. (See, e.g., Horwich (1990).) Most
strictly, so-called transparency or ‘see-through’ or
‘pure disquotational’ conceptions of truth (e.g., Field
(1994, 2008) and Beall (2005, 2009)) take the defining property of
truth to be
*intersubstitutability* of *A*
and *Tr*(^{⌜}*A*^{⌝}) in
all non-opaque contexts. This makes capture and release, in
unrestricted form applying to all sentences of a language, a
requirement for truth (at least where we have *A*
⊢ *A* or, more strongly, ⊢ *A*
→ *A*).^{[9]}

Holding capture and release fixed, and applying it to all sentences
without restriction, yields triviality unless the logic is
non-classical. There are two main sub-families of non-classical
(transparency) truth theories: *paracomplete* and
*paraconsistent*. We sketch the main ideas of each.

#### 4.1.1 Paracomplete

According to paracomplete approaches to the Liar, the main lesson of the Liar is that LEM ‘fails’ in some sense. In other words: the Liar teaches us that some sentences (notably, Liars!) ‘neither hold nor do not hold’ (in some sense), and so are neither true nor false. As a result, the logic of truth is non-classical.

This idea is perhaps most natural in response to the simple-falsity
Liar. There, it is tempting to say that there is some status other
than truth and falsity, and the Liar sentence *L* has it. But
this will not suffice, for instance, for the simple-untruth Liar.
This says nothing about falsity. Rather, in some way the basic
reasoning reviewed in §2.3 must fail, and the culprit, in the
paracomplete view, is LEM. Liar-instances of LEM ‘fail’
(in some sense) according to the paracomplete approach; such
sentences fall into the ‘gap’ between truth and falsity
(to use a common metaphor).

There have been many proposals for using such non-classical logics to address the Liar. An early example is van Fraassen (1968, 1970). But Kripke's work has been the most influential in recent times, not only to approaches to the Liar based on non-classical logic, but a range of other approaches we will survey in §4.2 as well. Thus, we pause to describe at least a little of Kripke's framework.

##### Kripke's theory

Logics where LEM fails are not
themselves hard to come by. Among many such logics are a number of
three-valued logics that allow sentences to take a third value over
and above true and false. Sentences like Liar sentences take the
third value. One of the most commonly applied logics is the Strong
Kleene logic *K*_{3}. We do not go into the details of
*K*_{3} here, but only note the properties of
*K*_{3} we need. (For more details, see the entry on
many-valued logic,
or Beall and van Fraassen (2003), or Priest
(2008).) First and foremost, we have:

⊬_{K3}A ∨¬A.

LEM fails. In fact, there are no logical truths (or valid sentences)
according to *K*_{3}. (We return to this on the topic of
a ‘suitable conditional’ below.)

The challenge to using *K*_{3} to flesh out a
paracomplete theory is to explain how anything like (even rule-form)
capture and release hold, and if you follow the deflationist line,
how full unrestricted capture and release hold. One way of
understanding the important work of Kripke (1975) (and related work
of Martin and Woodruff (1975) ) is as a way of achieving just that.

Kripke begins with a fully classical language
L_{0} containing no truth predicate
(or more generally, no semantic terms). (Recall, we are assuming a
language comes equipped with a valuation scheme. For
L_{0} it is classical.) He then
considers extending it to a language
L+0
which contains a
truth predicate *Tr*. The predicate *Tr* is taken to apply
to every sentence of the expanded language
L+0,
including those of the original
L_{0}. Thus, it is a self-applicative
truth predicate (as the deflationist-inspired picture we mentioned
must require), even though we begin with a language without a truth
predicate.

We can think of L_{0} as interpreted
by a classical model M_{0}. Kripke shows
us how to build an interpretation
M+0
for the expanded language. The main
innovation is to see the truth predicate as *partial*. Rather
than simply having an extension, it has an extension (set of things
of which it is true), and an anti-extension (set of things of which
it is false). The extension and anti-extension are mutually
exclusive, but they need not jointly exhaust the domain of
M_{0}. Pathological sentences like *L* fall in
neither in the extension or the anti-extension of *Tr*.

Falling into neither the extension or the anti-extension of *Tr*
acts like having a third value, and we can interpret
L+0
as acting like a language with a
*K*_{3} valuation scheme. Treating the language this
way, Kripke shows up to build up a very plausible extension and
anti-extension for *Tr*, typically written E and
A. The important property of the new extended model
⟨M_{0},⟨E,A⟩⟩ is that the
truth value of any sentence *A*
and *Tr*(^{⌜}*A*^{⌝}) are exactly the
same. *A* is true, false, or neither, just in case
*Tr*(^{⌜}*A*^{⌝}) is. Furthermore,
interpreting the expanded
language L+0
as a *K*_{3} language, we
have for *K*_{3} consequence *A* ⊣⊢
*Tr*(^{⌜}*A*^{⌝}), just as we desired.

Kripke shows how to build up E and
A by an inductive
process. One starts with an ‘approximation’ of the
extension and anti-extension of *Tr*, and successively improves
it until the improvement process ceases to be productive (it reaches
a ‘fixed point’). In fact, for the
*K*_{3}-based solution, the natural thing to do is start
with an empty extension and anti-extension, and throw in sentences
that are true at successive stages of the process.

Kripke's construction can be applied to a number of different logics, including other many-valued logics such as the ‘Weak Kleene’ logic, and supervaluation logics. See, for instance, Burgess (1986) and McGee (1991) for discussion. Kripke-style constructions engage a fair bit of mathematical subtlety. For an accessible overview of more of the details, see Soames (1999). For a more mathematically rich exposition, see McGee (1991).

##### Suitable conditionals

Logics like
*K*_{3} suffer from the lack of a natural or
‘suitable’ conditional (in particular, one that satisfies
*A*,*A* → *B* ⊢ *B* and
⊢ *A* → *A*). This reveals a
limitation of the Kripkean approach to the Liar. The language
L+0
cannot report the capture and release
properties of truth itself in conditional form (i.e.,
T-biconditionals): *Tr* is transparent on this picture, and so
*Tr*(^{⌜}*A*^{⌝})
and *A* are fully intersubstitutable. We don't have
¬*A* ∨ *A* true for all sentences *A* in
this theory, and hence don't have
¬*Tr*(^{⌜}*A*^{⌝})
∨ A for all *A*. But
¬*Tr*(^{⌜}*A*^{⌝})
∨ *A* is equivalent
to *Tr*(^{⌜}*A*^{⌝})
→ *A* in the theory, since (in the theory) → is just
the material conditional. The Kripke construction at hand, then, thus
fails to enjoy all T-biconditionals—the natural candidates for
expressing in the theory the basic capture and release features of
truth.

A recent, major step towards supplementing Kripke's framework with a suitable conditional is that of Field (2008). Field's theory is a major advance, but complex enough to be beyond the scope of this (very basic) introduction. Readers should consult Field's own discussion for a taste of how such a modification might proceed. See Field (2008), and further discussion in Beall (2009).

#### 4.1.2 Paraconsistent

Here, the basic idea is to allow the contradiction (e.g., up to and including step 4 of the derivation in §2.3.3), but alter the logic by rejecting EFQ—and, hence, avoid the absurdity involved in step 5.

Like the paracomplete approach we just surveyed, paraconsistent
approaches to the Liar find easy, natural motivation in transparency
or otherwise suitably ‘minimalist’ views of truth that
require full intersubstitutability of *A* and
*Tr*(^{⌜}*A*^{⌝}), and
thus cannot restrict capture and release. But paraconsistent
approaches have also found motivation in a Dummett-inspired
anti-deflationist view, which takes the role of truth as the aim of
assertion seriously (cf. Dummett (1959)). Indeed, Priest (2006)
argues that this (non-transparency) view of truth motivates both the
T-schema and LEM, and that this implies that the Liar
sentence *L* is both true and not true. Hence, according to any
such dialetheic line (according to which at least one sentence is both
true and not true), the only option is to reject EFQ.

##### Dialetheism

Priest (1984, 2006) has been one of
the leading voices in advocating a paraconsistent approach to solving
the Liar paradox. He has proposed a paraconsistent (and
non-paracomplete) logic now known as *LP* (for *L*ogic of
*P*aradox), which retains LEM, but not
EFQ.^{[10]}
It has the distinctive feature of
allowing true contradictions. This is what Priest calls the
dialetheic approach to truth. (See the entry on
dialetheism for a more
extensive discussion.)

Formally, *LP* can be seen as a three-valued logic; but where
*K*_{3} has truth-value gaps, *LP* has truth-value
*gluts*. Thus, sentences in *LP* can be both true and
false.

Likewise, Kripke-style techniques can be applied to produce an
interpretation for a truth predicate, starting with a classical
language L_{0} not containing a truth
predicate. Again, an extension and anti-extension are assigned to
*Tr*. Whereas Kripke's original construction had the extension
and anti-extension disjoint but not exhausting the domain, in this
case we allow the extension and anti-extension to overlap, but suppose
that the two together exhaust the domain of the model. Related
techniques to Kripke's can then be used to build an extension and
anti-extension for *Tr*. The result is again an interpretation
where *A*
and *Tr*(^{⌜}*A*^{⌝}) get
the same truth value in the model.

This construction was not given by Kripke himself, but variants have been pursued by a number of authors, including Dowden (1984), Priest (1984, 2006), Visser (1984), and Woodruff (1984). A recent discussion of direct relevance is in Beall (2009).

##### Combining paracompleteness and paraconsistency

Though we have identified paracomplete and paraconsistent approaches
to the Liar as two distinct options, they are not incompatible.
Indeed, seen as theories of negation (if one wants), one might think
that negation is neither exhaustive nor ‘explosive’
– i.e., satisfies neither LEM nor EFQ. An approach like this is
the *FDE*-based (transparent) truth theory discussed in Dunn
(1969, see Other Internet Resources), Gupta and Belnap (1993), Visser
(1984), Woodruff (1984), Yablo (1993a), and—in
effect—Brady (1989).

(The *LP*-based theories and *K*_{3}-based
theories are—at least on one (standard-first-order)
level—simply strengthened logics of the broader *FDE*
logic. For general discussion of such frameworks, see, e.g., Beall and
van Fraassen (2003) and Priest (2008).)

#### 4.1.3 Expressive power and ‘revenge’

Working in classical logic, Tarski (1935) famously concluded from the Liar paradox that a language cannot define its own truth predicate. More generally, he took the lesson of the Liar to be that languages cannot express the full range of semantic concepts that describe their own workings. One of the main goals of the non-classical approaches to the Liar we have surveyed here is to avoid this conclusion, which many have seen as far too drastic. However, how successful these approaches have been in this regard remains a highly contentious issue.

In one sense, both the paracomplete and paraconsistent approaches
achieve the desired result: they present languages which contain truth
predicates which apply to sentences of that very language, and have
the feature that *A*
and *Tr*(^{⌜}*A*^{⌝}) have
the same truth value. In this respect, they both present languages
which contain their own truth predicate.

In the paracomplete case, the issue of whether this suffices has been
much debated. The paracomplete view holds that the Liar sentence
*L* is neither true nor false, and this is key to retaining
consistency. But note, the paracomplete approach we discussed above
cannot state this fact, as it cannot come out true that
¬*Tr*(^{⌜}*L*^{⌝}).

Just what to make of this has been debated. It is certainly the case
that the set of true sentences in the kind of model Kripke constructs
does not include ¬*Tr*(^{⌜}L^{⌝}). Because of this, some
authors, such as McGee (1991), T. Parsons (1984), and Soames
(1999) have in effect maintained that this is a further fact that is
goes beyond what the truth predicate needs to express, and so is
immaterial to the success of the solution to the Liar. (Actually,
McGee's view has another aspect, which we discuss in
§4.2.3.)

But nonetheless, it does appear that there is an important semantic fact about truth in the paracomplete language, closely related to if not identical to a fact about truth per se, which the language cannot express. It thus has been argued to fail to achieve a fully adequate theory of truth. Kripke himself notes that there are some semantic concepts that cannot be expressed, and the argument has been pressed by Glanzberg (2004c) and C. Parsons (1974).

One way of spelling out what is missing in the paracomplete language
is to introduce a new notion of *determinateness*, so that the
status of the Liar is that of not being determinately true. If so,
then the Kripke paracomplete language cannot express this concept of
determinateness. Some approaches taking paracomplete ideas on board
have sought to supplement the Kripke approach by adding notions of
determinate truth. McGee (1991) does so in a basically classical
setting. In a non-classical, paracomplete setting, Field (2008)
supplements the basic paracomplete approach with infinitely many
different ‘determinately’ operators, each defined in
terms of Field's ‘suitable conditional’, and each
giving a different (stronger) notion of ‘truth’. (See
also some of the papers in Beall (2008).)

It is often argued in favor of paraconsistent approaches that they
have no trouble ‘characterizing’ the status of Liars:
they're true and false (i.e., true and have true negation).
*LP* theories can state this. On the other hand, some such as
Littmann and Simmons (2004) and S. Shapiro (2004), have thought that
there is a dual problem: namely, ‘characterizing normal
sentences’. (Some put this alleged problem as the problem of
characterizing being *just true*.) Whether this is a problem
is something we leave open. (For some discussion, see Beall (2009),
Field (2008), and Priest (2006).)

One other issue that arises here is that of so-called ‘revenge
paradoxes’. We can illustrate this with the simple-falsity
Liar. Suppose one starts with this as the bench-mark Liar paradox,
and proposes a simple solution that rejects bivalence. In response
one is shown the simple-untruth Liar, which undercuts the simple
solution. This is the pattern of ‘revenge’, where a
solution to the paradox is rejected on the basis of what might be
taken to be a slightly modified form of the paradox. Revenge
paradoxes for paracomplete solutions are often proposed: many points
where the paracomplete language fails to express some semantic
concept offer ways to construct a revenge problems. For instance, if
the *determinateness* avenue is taken, then one can construct
a revenge problem via a sentence which says of itself that it is not
determinately true.

We have seen at least some approaches (e.g. McGee (1991) in some respects, T. Parsons (1984), and Soames (1999)) reject the revenge problem, while some seek to solve it by additional apparatus (e.g. Field (2008)). As we discuss further in §4.3, contextualist views such as those of Burge (1979), Glanzberg (2001, 2004a), and C. Parsons (1974) tend to see revenge not as a separate problem, but as the core Liar phenomenon. For more discussion about revenge and its nature, see the papers in Beall (2008), and L. Shapiro (2006).

### 4.2 Classical logic

We have now seen a range of options for responding to the Liar paradox by reconsidering basic logic. There are also a number of approaches that leave classical logic fixed, and try to find other ways of defusing the paradox.

One hallmark of most of these approaches is a willingness to somehow
*restrict* the range of application of capture and release, to
block the paradoxical reasoning. This is antithetical to the kind of
deflationist view of truth we discussed in §4.1, but it is
consistent with another view of truth. This other view takes the main
feature of truth to be that it reports a non-trivial semantic
property of sentences (e.g. corresponding with a fact in the world,
or having a value in a model). Many approaches within classical logic
embody the idea that a proper understanding of this feature allows
for restricted forms of capture and release, and this in turn allows
the paradox to be blocked, without any departure from classical
logic.

We will consider a number of important approaches to the paradox within classical logic, most of which embody this idea in some form or another.

#### 4.2.1 Tarski's hierarchy of languages

Traditionally, the main avenue for resolving the paradox within classical logic is Tarski's hierarchy of languages and metalanguages. Tarski concluded from the paradox that no language could contain its own truth predicate (in his terminology, no language can be ‘semantically closed’).

Instead, Tarski proposed that the truth predicate for a language is
to be found only in an expanded metalanguage. For instance, one
starts with an interpreted language
L_{0} that contains no truth
predicate. One then ‘steps up’ to an expanded language
L_{1}, which contains a truth
predicate, but one that only applies to sentences of
L_{0}. With this restriction, it is
easy enough to define a truth predicate which completely accurately
states the truth values of every sentence in
L_{0}, obeys capture and release, and
yields no paradox. Of course, this process does not stop. If we want
to describe truth in L_{1}, we need to
step up to L_{2} to get a truth
predicate for L_{1}. And so on. The
process goes on indefinitely. At each stage, a new classical
interpreted language is produced, which expresses truth for languages
below it. (For more on the mathematics of this sort of hierarchy of
languages, see Halbach (1997).)

Why is there no Liar paradox in this sort of hierarchy of languages?
Because the restriction that no truth predicate can apply to sentences
of its own language is enforced as a syntactic one. Any
sentence *L* equivalent to
¬*Tr*(^{⌜}*L*^{⌝}) is
not syntactically well-formed. There is no Liar paradox because there
is no Liar sentence. See the entries on
Tarski
and
Tarski's truth definitions
for more on Tarski's views of truth.

Tarski's hierarchical approach has been subject to a number of
criticisms. One is that in light of naturally occurring cases of
self-reference, his ruling Liar sentences syntactically not
well-formed seems overly drastic. Though Tarski himself was more
concerned to resolve the Liar for formal languages, his solution
seems implausible as applied to many naturally occurring uses of
‘true’. Another important problem was highlighted by
Kripke (1975). As Kripke notes, any syntactically fixed set of
levels will make it extremely hard, if not impossible, to place
various non-paradoxical claims within the hierarchy. For instance, if
Jc says *that everything Michael says is true*, the claim has
to be made from a level of the hierarchy higher than everything
Michael says. But if among the things Micheal says is *that
everything Jc says is true*, Michael's claims must be at a
higher level than all of Jc's claims. Thus, some of
Michael's claims must be higher than some of Jc's, and
vice-versa. This is impossible.

In light of these sorts of problems, many have concluded that Tarski's hierarchy of languages and metalanguages buys a solution to the Liar paradox at the cost of implausible restrictiveness.

#### 4.2.2 The closed-off Kripke construction

In light of these sorts of criticisms of Tarski's theory, a number of approaches to the Liar have sought to retain classical logic, but have some degree of self-applicability for the truth predicate. We know from the reasoning in §2.3 that some restrictions on capture and release will then be required. One goal has been to work out which ones are well-motivated, and how to implement them.

One way to do this was suggested by Kripke himself. Rather than see
the Kripke apparatus we reviewed briefly in §4.1.1 as part of a
non-classical logical approach, one can see it as an intermediate
step towards building a classical interpretation of a
self-applicative *Tr*.

Recall that the Kripke construction starts with a classical language
L_{0} with no truth predicate. It
passes to an expanded language
L+0,
but unlike a
Tarskian metalanguage, this language contains a truth predicate
*Tr* that applies to all of
L+0.
Kripke shows how
to build a partial interpretation of *Tr*, providing an
extension E and an anti-extension
A. But one can then
simply consider the *classical* model
⟨M_{0},E⟩,
using only the extension. This
it the ‘closed-off’ construction, as the gap between
extension and anti-extension is closed off by throwing everything in
the gap into the false category of a classical model.

We know this interpretation cannot make true all of capture and release. But it does make a restricted form true. The following holds in the closed-off model:

[Tr(^{⌜}A^{⌝}) ∨Tr(^{⌜}¬A^{⌝})] → [Tr(^{⌜}A^{⌝}) ↔A].

This tells us that capture and release (in the form of the T-schema)
holds for sentences that are well-behaved, in the sense of satisfying
*Tr*(^{⌜}*A*^{⌝})
∨ *Tr*(^{⌜}¬*A*^{⌝}).

What happens to the Liar sentence on this approach? As in the
three-valued case, the Liar is interpreted as falling within the gap.
*L* is neither in E nor
A. *L* thus falls
outside of the domain where *Tr* is interpreted as well-behaved.
Because the situation is classical, and
^{⌜}*L*^{⌝}∉E, we know that
¬*Tr*(^{⌜}*L*^{⌝}) is true in the closed-off model;
likewise, so is ¬*Tr*(^{⌜}¬*L*^{⌝}).

On well-behaved sentences, we have the fixed point property that
*A* and *Tr*(^{⌜}*A*^{⌝})
have the same truth value, and so
the semantics of
L+0
and the semantics it assigns to
*Tr* correspond exactly. On pathological sentences like
*L*, they do not, and indeed, cannot, on pain of triviality.

In a point related to the closed-off construction, it was observed by Feferman (1984) that if we are careful about negation, we can dispense with A altogether in the Kripke construction. Thus, the construction can be done without any implicit appeal to many-valued logic. Related ways of thinking about Kripke's construction are discussed McGee (1991), and are applied in Glanzberg (2004a).

#### 4.2.3 Determinateness revisited

In §4.1.3 we noted that paracomplete approaches to the paradox can be vulnerable to ‘revenge paradoxes’ based on some idea of indeterminate truth or lacking a truth value. Related issue bear in the classical case. We will discuss a few in turn.

##### Grounding

The closed-off Kripke construction can help fill in the idea of
a *determinately* operator discussed in §4.1.3. Instead of
an operator, it allows us to define a
predicate *D*(^{⌜}*A*^{⌝})
by *Tr*(^{⌜}*A*^{⌝}) ∨
*Tr*(^{⌜}¬*A*^{⌝}). *D* represents
‘determinately’ in the sense of applying to sentences
that have a truth value according to *Tr*, as it were,
‘determined’ by the model produced by the Kripke
construction. It also, as we observed, applies to all the sentences
which are well-behaved in the sense of obeying the T-schema (or
capture and release).

Formally, the sentences to which *D* applies in the model
generated by the Kripke construction are those which fall in
E
or have their negations fall in E
(equivalently fall in
A). Kripke labeled this being
*grounded*.^{[11]}

It has often been noted that there is also a more informal notion of
determinateness or grounding, to which the formal notion expressed by
*D* at least roughly corresponds (cf. Herzberger (1970)). The
idea is that the determinate sentences are the ones with well-defined
semantic properties. Where we have no such well-defined semantic
properties, we should not expect the truth predicate to report
anything well-behaved, nor should we expect properties like capture
and release to hold. Kripke's construction builds up
E
in stages, starting with sentence with no semantic terms, and adding
semantic complexity at each stage. One reaches
E at the limit
of this process, which allows us to think of
E as indicating
the limit of where semantic values are assigned by a well-defined
process. Thus, the formal notion of grounding provided by *D* is
sometimes suggested to reflect the extent to which sentences have
well-defined semantic properties.

##### McGee on truth and definite truth

Another view which makes use of a form of determinateness is advocated by McGee (1991). McGee's theory, like many we have surveyed, here, is rich in complexity to which we cannot do justice. The theory has many components, including a mathematically sophisticated approaches to truth related to the Kripkean ideas we have been discussing, in a setting which holds to classical logic.

McGee relies on two notions: truth and definite truth. Definite truth
is a form of the idea we glossed as determinateness. Formally, for
McGee, definite truth is identified with provability in a partially
interpreted language, using an extension of classical logic which
takes in facts about the partial interpretation known as
A-logic. It is thus different from the grounding notion we
just discussed. McGee treats definitely as a *predicate*, on
par with the truth predicate, and not as an operator on sentences as
some developments do. With the right notion of definite truth, McGee
shows that a partially interpreted language containing its own truth
predicate can meet restricted forms of capture and release put in
terms of definite truth. Where *Def* is the definiteness
predicate, McGee show how to link truth and definite truth, by
showing how to validate:

Def(^{⌜}A^{⌝})iff Def(^{⌜}Tr(^{⌜}A^{⌝})^{⌝})Def(^{⌜}¬A^{⌝})iff Def(^{⌜}¬Tr(^{⌜}A^{⌝})^{⌝})

Indeed, McGee shows that these conditions can be met within a theory of both truth and definite truth, where truth meets appropriate forms of capture and release, and also where a formal statement of bivalence for truth comes out definitely true. McGee thus provides a theory which has strongly self-applicative truth and definite truth, within a classical setting.

Though truth may satisfy the formal property of bivalence, it is
crucial to McGee's approach that definite truth is an open-ended
notion, which may be strengthened (formally, by strengthening a
partially interpreted language). Thus, definite truth meets weaker
forms of capture and release than truth itself. (Some instances of
Def(^{⌜}*A*^{⌝})
→ *A* fail to be definitely true, according to McGee.)
Furthermore, McGee suggests that this behavior of truth and definite
truth makes truth a *vague* predicate. It remains disputed
whether McGee's theory avoids the kind of revenge problems that plague
other Kripkean approaches. An argument that it is vulnerable to forms
of revenge is given in Glanzberg (2004c).

#### 4.2.4 Other classical approaches

We have now surveyed some important representatives of approaches to resolving the Liar within classical logic. There are a number of others, may of them involving some complex mathematics. We will pause to mention a few of the more important of these, though given the mathematical complexity, we will only gesture towards them.

##### Axiomatic theories of truth

There is an important strand of work in proof theory, which has sought to develop axiomatic theories of self-applicative truth in classical logic, including work of Feferman (1984, 1991), Cantini (1996), and Friedman and Sheard (1987). The idea is to find ways of expressing rules like capture and release that retain consistency. Options include more care about how proof-theoretic rules of inference are formulated, and more care about formulating restricted rules. The main ideas are discussed in the entry on axiomatic theories of truth, to which we will leave the details.

##### Truth and inductive definitions

Kripke's work on truth was developed in conjunction with some important ideas about inductive definitions (as we see, for instance, in the later parts of Kripke (1975)). These connections are explored further in work of Burgess (1986) and McGee (1991). We also pause to mention work of Aczel (1980) combining ideas about inductive definitions and the lambda calculus.

### 4.3 Contextualist approaches

Another family of proposed solutions to the Liar are
*contextualist solutions*. These also make use of classical
logic, but base their solutions primarily on some ideas from the
philosophy of language. They take the basic lesson of the Liar to be
that truth predicates show some form of *context dependence*,
even in otherwise non-context-dependent fragments of a language. They
seek to explain how this can be so, and rely on it to resolve the
problems faced by the Liar.

Contextualist theories share with a number of approaches we have
already seen the idea that there is something indeterminate or
semantically not well-formed about our Liar sentence *L*. But,
contextualist views give a special role to issues of
‘revenge’ and lack of expressive power.

#### 4.3.1 Instability and revenge

One way of thinking about why the truth predicate is not well-behaved
on the Liar sentence is that there is not really a well-defined truth
bearer provided by the Liar sentence. To make this vivid (as
discussed by C. Parsons (1974) and subsequently Glanzberg (2001)),
suppose that truth bearers are propositions expressed by sentences in
contexts, and that the Liar sentence fails to express a proposition.
This is the beginnings of an account of how the Liar winds up
ungrounded or in some sense indeterminate. At least, we should not
expect *Tr* to be well-behaved where sentences fail to express
propositions.

But, it is an unstable proposal. We can reason that if the Liar sentence fails to express a proposition, it fails to express a true proposition. In the manner of a revenge paradox, if our Liar sentence had originally said ‘this sentence does not express a true proposition’, then we would have our Liar sentence back. And, we have shown that this sentence says something true, and so expresses a true proposition. Thus, from the assumption that the Liar sentence is indeterminate or lacks semantic status, we reason that it must have proper semantic status, and indeed say something true. We are hence back in paradox.

Contextualists do not see this as a new ‘revenge’ paradox, but the basic problem posed by the Liar. First of all, in a setting where sentences are context dependent, the natural formulation of a truth claim is always in terms of expressing a true proposition, or some related semantically careful application of the truth predicate. But more importantly, to the contextualist, the main issue behind the Liar is embodied in the reasoning on display here. It involves two key steps. First, assigning the Liar semantically defective status—failing to express a proposition or being somehow indeterminate. Second, concluding from the first step that the Liar must be true—and so not indeterminate or failing to express a proposition—after all. Both steps appear to be the result of sound reasoning, and so both must be true. The main problem of the Liar, according to a contextualist, is to explain how this can be, and how the second step can be non-paradoxical. (Such reasoning is explored by Glanzberg (2001, 2004c) and C. Parsons (1974). For a critical discussion, see Gauker (2006).)

Thus, contextualists seek to explain how the Liar sentence can have
unstable semantic status, switching from defective to non-defective
in the course of this sort of inference. They do so by appealing to
the role of *context* in fixing the semantic status of
sentences. Sentences can have different semantic status in different
contexts. Thus, to contextualists, there must be some non-trivial
effect of context involved in the Liar sentence, and more generally,
in predication of truth.

#### 4.3.2 Contextual parameters on truth predicates

One prominent contextualist approach, advocated by Burge (1979) and
developed by Koons (1992) and Simmons (1993), starts with the idea
that the Tarskian hierarchy itself offers a way to see the truth
predicate as context dependent. Tarski's hierarchy postulates a
hierarchy of truth predicates *Tr*_{i}. What if
*i* is not merely a marker of level in a hierarchy, but a
genuine contextual parameter? If so, then the Liar sentence is in
fact context-dependent: it has the form
¬*Tr*_{i}(^{⌜}*L*^{⌝}), where
*i* is set by context. Context then sets the level of the truth
predicate.

This idea can be seen as an improvement on the original Tarskian
approach in several respects. First, once we have a contextual
parameter, the need to insist that Liar sentences are never
well-formed disappears. Hence, we can think of each
*Tr*_{i} as including some limited range of
applicability to sentences of its own language. Using the Kripkean
techniques likes the closed-off construction we reviewed above,
predicates like *Tr*_{i} can be constructed which
have as much self-applicability as Kripke's own. (Burge (1979)
and the postscript to C. Parsons (1974) consider briefly how Kripke
techniques could be applied in this setting. Though he works in a
very different setting, ideas of Gaifman (1988, 1992) can be
construed as showing how even more subtle ways of interpreting a
context-dependent truth predicate can be developed.)

With suitable care, other problems for the Tarskian hierarchy can be
avoided as well. Burge proposes that the parameter *i* in
*Tr*_{i} is set by a Gricean pragmatic process.
In effect, speakers implicate that *i* is to be set to a level
for which the discourse they are in can be coherently interpreted
(with a maximal coherent extension for *Tr*_{i}).
Thus, truth does indeed find its own level, and so Kripke's
objection about how to fix levels for non-paradoxical sentences may
be countered.

This approach gives substance to the idea that the Liar sentence is
context dependent. Any sentence containing
*Tr*_{i} will be context dependent, inheriting a
contextual parameter along the way. This offers a way to make sense
of the arguments for the instability of the semantic status of
*L* that motivated contextualism. In an initial context, we fix
some level *i*. This is the level at which *L* is
interpreted. Call this interpretation *L*_{i}.
*L*_{i} says
¬*Tr*_{i}(^{⌜}*L*_{i}^{⌝}).
By the usual Liar reasoning, we show that *L*_{i}
must lack determinate semantic status—or fail to express a
proposition. As we discussed, we then reason that *L* must come
out true. According to the contextualist view at hand, this is the
claim that *L*_{i} is true according to some
other context, where a wider truth predicate is in play. This amounts
to being true at some higher level of the hierarchy. We can conclude,
for instance, that the Liar sentence as it was used at level *i*
is true according to a wider level *k* > *i*. Hence,
*Tr*_{k}(^{⌜}*L*_{i}^{⌝}),
where *k* > *i*.

This form of contextualism thus maintains that once we see the
context-dependent behavior of *Tr*_{i}, we can
make good sense of the instability of *L*. This can be seen as
an improvement on both the Tarskian view, and embodying some of the
techniques of classical logic we reviewed in §4.2. Depending how
the Burge view is spelled out technically, it will either have full
capture and release at each level, or capture and release with the
same restrictions as the closed-off Kripke construction.

The view that posits contextual parameters on the truth predicate does face a number of questions. For instance, it is fair to ask why we think the truth predicate really has a contextual parameter, especially if we mean a truth predicate like the one we use in natural language. Merely noting that such a parameter would avoid paradox does not show that it is present in natural language. Furthermore, whether it is acceptable to see truth as coming in levels at all, context-based or not, remains disputed. (Not all those who advocate contextual parameters on the truth predicate agree about the role of hierarchy. In particular, Simmons (1993) advocates a view he labels the ‘singularity theory’ which he proposes avoids outright hierarchical structures.) Finally, the Burgean appeal to Gricean mechanisms to set levels of truth has been challenged. (For instance, Gaifman (1992) asks if the Gricean process does any substantial work in Burge's account.)

Contextualist approaches come in many varieties, each of which makes use of slightly different apparatus. With contextualist theories the choice often turns on issues in philosophy of language as well as logic. We already noted a different way of developing contextualist ideas from Gaifman (1988, 1992). We will now briefly review a few more alternatives.

#### 4.3.3 Contextual effects on quantifier domains

Another contextualist approach, stemming from work of C. Parsons (1974) and developed by Glanzberg (2001, 2004a), seeks to build up the context dependence of the Liar sentence, and ultimately the context dependence of the truth predicate, from more basic components. The key is to see the context dependence of the Liar sentence as derived from the context dependence of quantifier domains.

Quantification enters the picture when we think about how to account
for predication of truth when sentences display context dependence.
In such an environment, it does not make good sense to predicate
truth of sentences directly. Not all sentences will have the right
kind of determinate semantic properties to be truth bearers; or, as
we have been putting it, not all sentences will express propositions.
But then, to say that a sentence *S* is true in context *c*
is to say that *there is* a proposition *p*
expressed by *S* in *c*, and that proposition *p* is
true.

The current contextualist proposal starts with the observation that
quantifiers in natural language typically have context-dependent
domains of quantification. When we say ‘Everyone is
here’, we do not mean everyone in the world, but everyone in
some contextually provided subdomain. Context dependence enters the
Liar, according to this contextualist view, in the contextual effects
on the domain of the propositional quantifier ∃*p*.

In particular, this domain must *expand* in the course of the
reasoning about the semantic status of the Liar. In the initial
context, ∃*p* must range over a small enough domain that there is
no proposition for *L* to express. In the subsequent context,
the domain expands to allow *L* to express some true
proposition. Proposals for how this expansion happens, and how to
model the truth predicate and the relation of expressing a
proposition in the presence of the Liar, have been explored by
Glanzberg (2001, 2004a), building on work of C. Parsons (1974).
Defenders of this approach argue that it does better in locating the
locus of context dependence than the parameters on truth predicates
view.

#### 4.3.4 Situation theory

Another variant on the contextualist strategy for resolving the Liar,
developed by Barwise and Etchemendy (1987) and Groeneveld (1994),
relies on *situation theory* rather than quantifier
domains to provide the locus of context dependence. Situation theory
is a highly developed part of philosophy of language, so we shall
again give only the roughest sketch of how their view works.

A situation is a partial state the world might be in: something like
*a* being *F*. Situations are classified by what are called
situation types. A proposition involves classifying a situation as
being of a situation type. Thus, a proposition {*s*; [σ]} tell us
that situation *s* is of type σ. The situation *s*
here plays a number of roles, including that of providing a context.

When it comes to the Liar, Barwise and Etchemendy construe Liar
propositions as having the form *f*_{s} = {*s*;
[*Tr*,*f*_{s}; 0]}, relative to an initial
situation *s*. This is a proposition *f*_{s}
which says of itself that its falsity is a fact that holds in
*s*. There is a sense in which this proposition cannot be
expressed. In particular, the state of affairs
⟨*Tr*,*f*_{s}; 0⟩ cannot be
in *s*. (Actually, Barwise and Etchemendy say that the
proposition is expressible, but give up on what they call
the *F*-closure of
*s*. But there is a core observation in common between these
two points, and the details do not matter for our purposes here.)
There is then a distinct situation *s*′ = *s*
∪ {⟨*Tr*,*f*_{s}; 0⟩},
and the proposition {*s*′;
[*Tr*,*f*_{s}; 0]} relative to this new
situation—this new ‘context’—is true.

This idea clearly has a lot in common with the restriction on quantifier domains view. In particular, both approaches seek to show how the domain of contents expressible in contexts can expand, to account for the instability of the Liar sentence. For discussion of relations between the situation-theoretic and quantifier domain approaches, see Glanzberg (2004a). Barwise and Etchemendy discuss relations between their situation-based and a more traditional approach in (1987, Ch. 11). For a detailed match-up between the Barwise and Etchemendy framework and a Burgean framework of indexed truth predicates, see Koons (1992).

#### 4.3.5 Issues for contextualism

It is a key challenge to contextualists to provide a full and well-motivated account of the source and nature of the shift in context involved in the Liar, though of course, many contextualists believe they have met this challenge. In favor of the contextualist approach is that it takes the revenge phenomenon to be the basic problem, and so is largely immune to the kinds of revenge issues that affect other approaches we have considered. But, it may be that there is another form of revenge which might be applied. To retain consistency, contextualists must apply restrictions on quantifiers to such quantifiers as ‘all contexts’. To achieve this, it must presumably be denied that there are any absolutely unrestricted quantifiers. Glanzberg (2004b, 2006) argues this is the correct conclusion, but it is highly controversial. For a survey of thinking about this, see the papers in Rayo and Uzquiano (2006).

### 4.4 The revision theory

Another approach to the Liar, advocated by Gupta (1982), Herzberger
(1982), Gupta and Belnap (1993), and a number of others, is the
*revision theory of truth*. This approach shares some
features with the views we surveyed in §4.2, in that it takes
classical logic for granted. We also believe it has an affinity with
the views discussed in §4.3, as it rethinks some basic aspects
of semantics. But it is a distinctive approach. We will sketch some
of the fundamentals of this view. For a discussion of the foundations
of the revision theory, and its relations to contextualism, see L.
Shapiro (2006). More details, and more references, may be found in
the entry on
the revision theory of truth.

The revision theory of truth starts with the idea that we may take the T-schema at face value. Indeed, Gupta and Belnap (1993) take up a suggestion from Tarski (1944), that the instances of the T-schema can be seen as partial definitions of truth; presumably with all the instances together, for the right language or family of languages constituting a complete definition. At the same time, the revision theory holds fast to classical logic. Thus, we already know, we have the Liar paradox for any language with enough expressive resources to produce Liar sentences.

In response, the revision theory proposes a different way of
approaching the semantic properties of the truth predicate. In keeping
with our practices here, we may begin with a classical model
M_{0} for a language
L_{0} without a truth predicate, and
consider what happens when we add a truth predicate *Tr* to
form the extended language
L+0.
This language has a
full self-applicative truth predicate, and so can generate the Liar
sentence *L*.

To build a classical model for
L+0, we need an
extension for *Tr*. Let us pick a set: call it *H* for a
*hypothesis* about what the extension of *Tr* might be.
*H* may be ∅, it may be the entire domain of
M_{0}, or it may be anything else. It need not be a
particularly good approximation of the semantic properties of
*Tr*.

Even if it is not, ⟨M_{0},*H*⟩
still provides
a classical model, in which we can interpret
L+0.
With that, we can in effect apply the T-schema, relative to our
hypothesis *H*, and see what we get. More precisely, we can
let τ(*H*) =
{^{⌜}*A*^{⌝} | *A* is true
in
⟨M_{0},*H*⟩}. τ(*H*)
is generally a better hypothesis about what is true in our language
than *H* might have been. At least, clearly, if *H* made
foolish guesses about the truth of sentence of the truth-free fragment
L_{0}, they are corrected in τ(*H*),
which contains everything from L_{0}
true in M_{0}. Thus,
⟨M_{0},τ(*H*)⟩
is generally a better model of
L+0
then ⟨M_{0},*H*⟩.

Better in many respects. But when it comes to paradoxical sentences
like *L*, we see something different. As a starting hypothesis,
let us consider *H* = ∅. Consider what happens to the truth of
*L* as we apply τ:

ntruth value of Lin ⟨M_{0},τ^{n}(∅)⟩0 true 1 false 2 true 3 false 4 true ⋮ ⋮

The Liar sentence never stabilizes under this process. We reach an alternation of truth values which will go on for ever.

In the terminology of the revision theory, τ is a *revision
rule*. It takes us from one hypothesis about the interpretation
of *Tr* to another. Sequences of values we generate by such
revision rules, starting with a given initial hypothesis, are
*revision sequences*. We leave to a more full presentation the
important issue of the right way to define *transfinite* revision sequences. (See
the entry on
revision theories of truth.)

The characteristic property of paradoxical sentences like the Liar sentence is that they are unstable in revision sequences: there is no point in the sequence at which they reach a stable truth value. This classifies sentences as stably true, stably false, and unstable. The revision theory develops notions of consequence based on these, and related notions. See the entry on revision theories of truth for further exposition of this rich theory.

### 4.5 Inconsistency views

In §2.3.3 we saw that the Liar paradox, in the presence of
unrestricted capture and release and classical logic, leads to
contradiction. So long as we have EFQ (as classical logic does), this
results in triviality. Most of the proposed solutions we have
considered (with the exception of the revision theory) try to avoid
this result somehow, either by restricting capture and release or
departing from classical logic. But there is another idea that has
occasionally been argued, that the Liar paradox simply shows that the
kinds of languages we speak, which contain their own truth
predicates, are *inconsistent*.

This is not an easy view to formulate. Though Tarski himself seemed to suggest something along these lines (for natural languages, specifically), it was argued by Herzberger (1967) that it is impossible to have an inconsistent language.

In contrast, Eklund (1902) takes seriously the idea that our semantic intuitions, expressed, for instance, by unrestricted capture and release, really are inconsistent. Eklund grants that this does not make sense if these intuitions have their source simply in our grasp of the truth conditions of sentences. But he suggests an alternative picture of semantic competence which does make sense of it (closely related to conceptual role views of meaning). He suggests that we think of semantic competence in terms of a range of principles speakers are disposed to accept in virtue of knowing a language. Those principles may be inconsistent. But even so, they determine semantic values. Semantic values will be whatever comes closest to satisfying the principles—whatever makes them maximally correct—even if nothing can satisfy all of them due to an underlying inconsistency.

Eklund thus supports an idea suggested by Chihara (1979). Chihara's
main aim is to provide what he calls a *diagnosis* of the
paradox, which should explain why the paradox arises and why it
appears compelling. But along the way, he suggests that the source of
the paradox is our acceptance of the T-schema (by convention, he
suggests), in spite of its inconsistency.

A related, though distinct, view is defended by Patterson (2007, 2009). Patterson argues that competence with a language puts one in a cognitive state relating to an inconsistent theory—one including the unrestricted T-schema and governed by classical logic. He goes on to explore how such a cognitive state could allow us to successfully communicate, in spite of relating us to a false theory.

## 5. Concluding Remarks

There is much more to say about the Liar paradox than we have covered here: there are more approaches to the Liar variants we have mentioned, and more related paradoxes like those of denotation, properties, etc. There are also more important technical results, and more important philosophical implications and applications. Our goal here has been to be more suggestive than exhaustive, and we hope to have given the reader an indication of what the Liar paradox is, and what its consequences might be.

## Bibliography

- Aczel, Peter, 1980, “Frege structures and the notions of
proposition, truth and set”, in
*The Kleene Symposium*, J. Barwise, H. J. Keisler, and K. Kunen, eds., Amsterdam: North-Holland, 31–59. - Anderson, Alan Ross, 1970, “St. Paul’s epistle to
Titus”, in
*The Paradox**of the Liar*, Robert L. Martin, ed., Atascadero: Ridgeview, 1–11. - Asenjo, F. G., 1966, “A calculus of
antinomies”,
*Notre Dame Journal of**Formal Logic*, 16: 103–105. - Barwise, Jon and Etchemendy, John, 1987,
*The Liar*, Oxford: Oxford University Press. - Beall, Jc, 2001, “Is Yablo’s paradox
non-circular?”,
*Analysis*, 61: 176–187. - Beall, Jc, 2005, “Transparent disquotationalism”,
in
*Deflationism and**Paradox*, Jc Beall and B. Armour-Garb, eds., Oxford: Oxford University Press, 7–22. - Beall, Jc (ed.), 2008,
*Revenge of the Liar*, Oxford: Oxford University Press. - Beall, Jc, 2009,
*Spandrels of Truth*, Oxford: Oxford University Press. - Beall, Jc and Glanzberg, Michael, 2008, “Where the paths
meet: Remarks on truth and paradox”, in
*Midwest Studies in Philosophy Volume XXXII:**Truth and its Deformities*, P. A. French and H. K. Wettstein, eds., Boston: Wiley-Blackwell. - Beall, Jc and van Fraassen, Bas C., 2003,
*Possibilities and Paradox*, Oxford: Oxford University Press. - Brady, Ross T., 1989, “The non-triviality of dialectical set
theory”, in
*Paraconsistent Logic: Essays on the Inconsistent*, G. Priest, R. Routley, and J. Norman, eds., Munich: Philosophia Verlag, 437–470. - Burge, Tyler, 1979, “Semantical paradox”,
*Journal of Philosophy*, 76: 169–198. Reprinted in Martin (1984). - Burgess, John P., 1986, “The truth is never
simple”,
*Journal of Symbolic**Logic*, 51: 663–681. - Cantini, Andrea, 1996,
*Logical Frameworks for Truth and Abstraction:**An Axiomatic Study*, Amsterdam: Elsevier. - Chihara, Charles, 1979, “The semantic paradoxes: A
diagnostic investigation”,
*Philosophical Review*, 88: 590–618. - Cook, Roy, 2006, “There are non-circular paradoxes (but
Yablo’s isn’t one of them)”,
*The Monist*, 89: 118–149. - Dowden, Bradley H., 1984, “Accepting inconsistencies from
the paradoxes”,
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 13: 125–130. - Dummett, Michael, 1959, “Truth”,
*Proceedings of the Aristotelian**Society*, 59: 141–162. Reprinted in Dummett (1978). - Dummett, Michael, 1978,
*Truth and Other Enigmas*, Cambridge: Harvard University Press. - Eklund, Matti, 2002, “Inconsistent
languages”,
*Philosophy and**Phenomenological Research*, 64: 251–275. - Feferman, Solomon, 1984, “Toward useful type-free theories,
I”,
*Journal**of Symbolic Logic*, 49: 75–111. Reprinted in Martin (1984). - Feferman, Solomon, 1991, “Reflecting on
incompleteness”,
*Journal of**Symbolic Logic*, 56: 1–49. - Field, Hartry, 1994, “Deflationist views of meaning and
content”,
*Mind*, 103: 249–285. - Field, Hartry, 2008,
*Saving Truth from Paradox*, Oxford: Oxford University Press. - Friedman, Harvey and Sheard, Michael, 1987, “An axiomatic
approach to self-referential truth”,
*Annals of Pure and Applied Logic*, 33: 1–21. - Gaifman, Haim, 1988, “Operational pointer semantics:
Solution to self-referential puzzles I”, in
*Proceedings of the Second Conference on**Theoretical Aspects of Reasoning about Knowledge*, M. Y. Vardi, ed., Los Altos: Morgan Kaufmann, 43–59. - Gaifman, Haim, 1992, “Pointers to truth”,
*Journal of Philosophy*, 89: 223–261. - Gauker, Christopher, 2006, “Against stepping back: A
critique of contextualist approaches to the semantic
paradoxes”,
*Journal of**Philosophical Logic*, 35: 393–422. - Glanzberg, Michael, 2001, “The Liar in
context”,
*Philosophical Studies*, 103: 217–251. - Glanzberg, Michael, 2004a, “A contextual-hierarchical
approach to truth and the Liar paradox”,
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 33: 27–88. - Glanzberg, Michael, 2004b, “Quantification and
realism”,
*Philosophy and**Phenomenological Research*, 69: 541–572. - Glanzberg, Michael, 2004c, “Truth, reflection, and
hierarchies”,
*Synthese*, 142: 289–315. - Glanzberg, Michael, 2006, “Context and unrestricted
quantification”, in
*Absolute Generality*, A. Rayo and G. Uzquiano, eds., Oxford: Oxford University Press, 45–74. - Grim, Patrick, 1991,
*The Incomplete Universe*, Cambridge: MIT Press. - Groeneveld, Willem, 1994, “Dynamic semantics and circular
propositions”,
*Journal of**Philosophical Logic*, 23: 267–306. - Gupta, Anil, 1982, “Truth and paradox”,
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 11: 1–60. Reprinted in Martin (1984). - Gupta, Anil and Belnap, Nuel, 1993,
*The Revision Theory of Truth*, Cambridge: MIT Press. - Halbach, Volker, 1997, “Tarskian and Kripean
truth”,
*Journal of**Philosophical Logic*, 26: 69–80. - Heck, Richard, 1997, “Tarski, truth, and
semantics”,
*Philosophical**Review*, 106: 533–554. - Herzberger, Hans G., 1967, “The truth-conditional
consistency of natural language”,
*Journal of Philosophy*, 64: 29–35. - Herzberger, Hans G., 1970, “Paradoxes of grounding in
semantics”,
*Journal of Philosophy*, 67: 146–167. - Herzberger, Hans G., 1982, “Notes on naive
semantics”,
*Journal of**Philosophical Logic*, 11: 61–102. Reprinted in Martin (1984). - Horwich, Paul, 1990,
*Truth*, Oxford: Basil Blackwell. - Koons, Robert C., 1992,
*Paradoxes of Belief and Strategic Rationality*, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. - Kripke, Saul, 1975, “Outline of a theory of
truth”,
*Journal of Philosophy*, 72: 690–716. Reprinted in Martin (1984). - Littmann, Greg and Simmons, Keith, 2004, “A critique of
dialetheism”, in
*The Law of Non-Contradiction*, G. Priest, Jc Beall, and B. Armour-Garb, eds., Oxford: Oxford University Press, 314–335. - Martin, Robert L. (ed.), 1984,
*Recent Essays on Truth and the Liar**Paradox*, Oxford: Oxford University Press. - Martin, Robert L. and Woodruff, Peter W., 1975, “On
representing ‘true-in-L’ in
L”,
*Philosophica*, 5: 217–221. Reprinted in Martin (1984). - McGee, Vann, 1991,
*Truth, Vagueness, and Paradox*, Indianapolis: Hackett. - Parsons, Charles, 1974, “The Liar
paradox”,
*Journal of Philosophical**Logic*, 3: 381–412. Reprinted in Parsons (1983). - Parsons, Charles, 1983,
*Mathematics in Philosophy*, Ithaca: Cornell University Press. - Parsons, Terence, 1984, “Assertion, denial, and the Liar
paradox”,
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 13: 137–152. - Patterson, Douglas, 2007, “Understanding the Liar”,
in
*The Revenge of**the Liar*, Jc Beall, ed., Oxford: Oxford University Press, 197–224. - Patterson, Douglas, 2009, “Inconsistency theories of
semantic paradox”,
*Philosophy and Phenomenological Research*, 79: 387–422. - Priest, Graham, 1984, “Logic of paradox
revisited”,
*Journal of**Philosophical Logic*, 13: 153–179. - Priest, Graham, 1997, “Yablo’s
paradox”,
*Analysis*, 57: 236–242. - Priest, Graham, 2006,
*In Contradiction*, Oxford: Oxford University Press, second ed. - Priest, Graham, 2008,
*An Introduction to Non-Classical Logic*, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, second ed. - Rahman, Shahid, Tulenheimo, Tero, and Genot, Emmanuel (eds.),
2008,
*Unity, Truth and the Liar: The Modern Relevance of Medieval Solutions**to the Liar Paradox*, Berlin: Springer Verlag. - Rayo, Agustín and Uzquiano, Gabriel (eds.),
2006,
*Absolute Generality*, Oxford: Oxford University Press. - Read, Stephen, 2002, “The Liar paradox from John Buridan
back to Thomas Bradwardine”,
*Vivarium*, 40: 189–218. - Read, Stephen, 2006, “Symmetry and
paradox”,
*History and Philosophy**of Logic*, 27: 307–318. - Restall, Greg, 2008, “Modal models for Bradwardine’s
theory of truth”,
*Review of Symbolic Logic*, 1: 225–240. - Shapiro, Lionel, 2006, “The rationale behind the revision
theory”,
*Philosophical Studies*, 129: 477–515. - Shapiro, Lionel, forthcoming, “Expressibility and the
Liar’s revenge”,
*Australasian Journal of Philosophy*. - Shapiro, Stewart, 2004, “Simple truth, contradiction, and
consistency”, in
*The Law of Non-Contradiction*, G. Priest, Jc Beall, and B. Armour-Garb, eds., Oxford: Oxford University Press, 336–354. - Simmons, Keith, 1993,
*Universality and the Liar*, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. - Soames, Scott, 1999,
*Understanding Truth*, Oxford: Oxford University Press. - Sorensen, Roy, 1998, “Yablo’s paradox and kindred
infinite Liars”,
*Mind*, 107: 137–155. - Sorensen, Roy, 2003,
*A Brief History of Paradox*, Oxford: Oxford University Press. - Tarski, Alfred, 1935, “Der Wahrheitsbegriff in den
formalizierten Sprachen”,
*Studia Philosophica*, 1: 261–405. References are to the translation by J. H. Woodger as “The concept of truth in formalized languages” in Tarski (1983). - Tarski, Alfred, 1944, “The semantic conception of
truth”,
*Philosophy and**Phenomenological Research*, 4: 341–375. - Tarski, Alfred, 1983,
*Logic, Semantics, Metamathematics*, Indianapolis: Hackett, second ed. Edited by J. Corcoran with translations by J. H. Woodger. - van Fraassen, Bas C., 1968, “Presupposition, implication,
and self-reference”,
*Journal of Philosophy*, 65: 136–152. - van Fraassen, Bas C., 1970, “Truth and paradoxical
consequence”, in
*Paradox of the Liar*, R. L. Martin, ed., Atascadero: Ridgeview, 13–23. - Visser, Albert, 1984, “Four valued semantics and the
Liar”,
*Journal of**Philosophical Logic*, 13: 181–212. - Woodruff, Peter W., 1984, “Paradox, truth, and logic part 1:
Paradox and truth”,
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 13: 213–232. - Yablo, Stephen, 1993a, “Hop, skip, and jump: The agnostic
conception of truth”,
*Philosophical Perspectives*, 7: 371–396. - Yablo, Stephen, 1993b, “Paradox without
self-reference”,
*Analysis*, 53: 251–252.

## Academic Tools

How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.

## Other Internet Resources

- Dunn, J. Michael, 1969, “Natural language versus formal language,” (PDF of unpublished manuscript), presented at the joint APA–ASL Symposium, New York, NY, December 27, 1969.

[Please contact the authors with other suggestions.]

## Related Entries

Curry's paradox | dialetheism | Gödel, Kurt | Gödel, Kurt: incompleteness theorems | logic: many-valued | logic: provability | self-reference | Tarski, Alfred | Tarski, Alfred: truth definitions | truth | truth: axiomatic theories of | truth: revision theory of | vagueness