Medieval Political Philosophy

First published Fri Jul 14, 2006; substantive revision Wed Sep 15, 2010

Medieval philosophy is the philosophy produced in Western Europe between Boethius and Descartes, a period of over one thousand years. Medieval political philosophy is the part of medieval philosophy that is concerned with political matters. Philosophical writing about politics during the middle ages (as during the early modern period) was often an attempt to influence public events, and the history of the subject therefore involves reference to those events. It also involves reference to developments in medieval culture, e.g., the renaissances of the ninth and twelfth centuries, and to the development of institutions such as the legal system and the universities. The strong relationship during this period between philosophy and religion also complicates the story. These “extra-philosophical” connections are among the reasons why political philosophy underwent considerable development in the course of the middle ages, as religious and political thinking was modified by cultural developments and the stress of events. The general arrangement of this article is chronological.


1. The Scope of Medieval Political Philosophy

“Medieval” refers primarily to Europe (the term being applied to other cultures by analogy). Medieval philosophy includes the “pre-scholastic”, “scholastic” and “late scholastic” periods.

“Scholasticism” refers to the intellectual culture characteristic of the medieval schools. In the twelfth century schooling became a flourishing industry in Paris, Bologna and many other places. By the early thirteenth century the masters of the schools in some places had formed corporations generally called universities.[1] The working language of the schools was Latin, and teachers and students were clergy. The universities got a great boost from the translation into Latin of the works of Aristotle, commentaries on Aristotle and related works in Greek or Arabic. These translations were made and copied because there was a public whose interest in Aristotle had been formed by the schools of the twelfth century, in which some works of Aristotle that had been translated earlier (part of the logica vetus, the “old logic”) were already objects of close study. In the universities, philosophy was studied in the Arts faculties, but philosophy was developed and employed also in the faculties of Theology. The study of law was important in medieval universities and ideas derived from the law were influential in political thinking. Writers on political philosophy used a number of the literary genres characteristic of scholasticism, such as the commentary, the disputed question, the dialogue and the treatise (see the entry on literary forms of medieval philosophy).

“Late scholasticism” conventionally begins with the fourteenth century and overlaps with the early modern period. The people we think of as the early modern philosophers were trained in the universities (or, in Descartes' case, in a Jesuit school), but they wrote mostly outside the universities and mostly in vernacular languages. Philosophy of the scholastic kind continued, taught and written in Latin, throughout the seventeenth century in the universities, especially in Italy, Spain, and the Netherlands, in the Jesuit schools in many countries, and in some Protestant schools.

The “pre-scholastic” medieval period includes Abelard and Anselm and the writers of the Carolingian age, but it is difficult to say how far back this period should be traced. Perhaps it should include Boethius and Augustine, who were deeply influential in Europe from their own time until the end of the middle ages (and beyond), though they might also be regarded as belonging to late Antiquity. Boethius had written or translated from Greek into Latin some of the logical works studied in the twelfth century schools, Augustine was the dominant influence in medieval theology. Boethius wrote nothing directly relevant to political philosophy, but Augustine certainly did, so for the purposes of this article “medieval” begins with Augustine.

By medieval political philosophy we understand the medieval writings on politics that are recognizably akin to the modern writings we class as political philosophy. Their authors were usually academics writing to be read by university-educated readers, they drew upon ideas explored in the schools and they wrote in an academic way. Some wrote commentaries on Aristotle's Politics and academic “disputed questions” related to topics of political philosophy. However, political philosophy was not part of the university core curriculum. The authors of political writings generally did not write these works in the course of their teaching duties. Generally they wrote in response to some political event. Some wrote for the edification of a king or other ruler, others sought to influence conflicts between the Church and secular rulers, others were concerned with conflicts within the Church about the constitution of the Church and the powers of Popes and Councils. Often they were committed to one or other side in these conflicts—many clerics supported secular rulers in their conflicts with the Church.

In this article I will describe the most important sources of medieval political ideas and the work of some of the most interesting writers. The main sources were the Bible, the Fathers of the Church, the textbooks of Canon and Civil Law, and the works of Aristotle, especially the Politics. Sections 2 and 3 will outline what medieval political thought took from the Bible and the Fathers. Sections 4 and 5 will sketch the ideas of political thinkers of the pre-scholastic period, including Augustine. Sections 6 and 7 will sketch the sources that became influential during the twelfth and thirteenth centuries, namely Aristotle and the law textbooks. Section 8 will outline one of the main issues of medieval political thought from the thirteenth century onwards, namely the political power of the pope. Section 9 will outline the work of a major thirteenth century writer, Thomas Aquinas. Sections 10-14 will be concerned with writers on political philosophy during the 14th and 15th centuries, including Marsilius and Ockham. Section 15 will discuss the work of an interesting 16th century writer, Francisco de Vitoria, and section 16 will be about the 17th century writer Francisco Suárez.

2. The Bible

For Medieval Christians the Bible was what we call the Vulgate, a Latin translation of the Old Testament (as Christians called the Jewish scriptures) and the New Testament.[2] The Protestant reformers have persuaded many that the Bible was neglected during the middle ages—according to Luther the Bible “lay forgotten in the dust under the bench”.[3] However, the many copies of the Bible made during the middle ages, the many commentaries on books of the Bible made by medieval scholars and the constant references to the Bible in their writings show that the Bible was a very familiar book.

2.1. Obedience to the Powers That Be

Political ideas conveyed by the Bible include the following:

  • The human race is normally ruled by kings or emperors. There are very few traces of republican institutions in the Bible. (There is one exception: 1 Machabees 8:14–16 is an admiring description of Roman republican government.)
  • Kings are very often wicked tyrants and enemies of God. The peoples often share the vices of their rulers.
  • The kingship of King David is a model (though David also often sinned).
  • Subjects must obey rulers, even the wicked. It is wrong to rebel, and especially to make any attack on the person of the ruler—see 2 Samuel 1:14–16.
  • But obedience to rulers is always limited by obedience to the commands of God.

The New Testament writers teach that Christians must obey their rulers: “Let every soul be subject to higher powers: for there is no power but from God: and those that are, are ordained of God. Therefore he that resisteth the power, resisteth the ordinance of God. And they that resist, purchase to themselves damnation. …For he is God's minister to thee, for good. But if thou do that which is evil, fear: for he beareth not the sword in vain. For he is God's minister: an avenger to execute wrath upon him that doth evil. Wherefore be subject of necessity, not only for wrath, but also for conscience' sake” (Romans 13:1–5). “Be ye subject therefore to every human creature for God's sake: whether it be to the king as excelling; or to governors as sent by him …For so is the will of God” (1 Peter 2:13–15).

In the 17th century most Protestants and some Catholics inferred from these texts that subjects always have a religious duty to obey their rulers, reconciling this with the text “We ought to obey God, rather than men” (Acts 5:29) by means of a doctrine of “passive obedience”.[4] Some of the Fathers and the Carolingian writers held a similar position, but most scholastic authors, under the influence of ideas drawn partly from Aristotle and partly from the law texts, held that under some circumstances disobedience and rebellion may be justified.

2.2 Slavery

New Testament writers say that whether a Christian is slave or free is a matter indifferent: “Let every man abide in the same calling in which he was called. Wast thou called, being a bondman? care not for it…For he that is called in the Lord, being a bondman, is the freeman of the Lord. Likewise he that is called, being free, is the bondman of Christ” (1 Corinthians 7:20–22). “There is neither Jew nor Greek: there is neither bond nor free: there is neither male nor female. For you are all one in Christ Jesus” (Galatians 3:28). The ancient Cynics and Stoics also held that a slave may attain virtue and happiness, since the essential freedom of a human being is not incompatible with external constraint.

Since being a slave is a matter indifferent, Christianity did not condemn slavery. Several New Testament texts exhort slaves to obedience (the Vulgate servi, which is normally and properly translated “slaves”, is in the Douai version translated “servants”): “Servants, be subject to your masters with all fear, not only to the good and gentle, but also to the froward” (1 Peter 2:18). “Servants, be obedient to them that are your lords according to the flesh, with fear and trembling, in the simplicity of your heart, as to Christ” (Ephesians 6:5; cf. Colossians 3:22). Paul wrote a letter to the Christian slave owner, Philemon, exhorting him to treat well a fugitive slave “whom I have sent back to thee” (Philemon 12).

2.3 Property

“Thou shalt not steal” was one of the ten commandments (Exodus 20:15). Medieval writers assumed that the institution of private property was normal and right and that property should be respected. However, the New Testament encouraged voluntary poverty: “Jesus saith to him: If thou wilt be perfect, go sell what thou hast, and give to the poor…Then Jesus said to his disciples: Amen, I say to you, that a rich man shall hardly enter into the kingdom of heaven. And again I say to you: It is easier for a camel to pass through the eye of a needle, than for a rich man to enter into the kingdom of heaven” (Matthew 19:21–24; cf. Luke 18:22). The New Testament also seemed to recommend voluntary communism as an ideal. The early Christian community in Jerusalem “had but one heart and one soul: neither did any one say that aught of the things which he possessed, was his own; but all things were common unto them. …neither was there any one needy among them. For as many as were owners of lands or houses, sold them, and brought the price of the things they sold, and laid it down before the feet of the apostles. And distribution was made to every one, according as he had need” (Acts 4:32–35). The leading institutions of medieval Europe included monasticism and other forms of religious life based on a vow of poverty and communal living.

2.4 Pacifism

The New Testament included texts that seemed to forbid Christians to use force: “But I say to you not to resist evil: but if one strike thee on thy right cheek, turn to him also the other…Love your enemies: do good to them that hate you: and pray for them that persecute and calumniate you” (Matthew 5:39–44).

2.5 Christ's Kingdom

Medieval Christians held that Christ was in some sense a king.[5] However, Jesus said “My kingdom is not of this world” (John 18:36), and he seemed to recommend obedience to the Roman Emperor: “Render therefore to Caesar the things that are Caesar's; and to God, the things that are God's” (Matthew 22:21). None of Christ's followers would have power over the others: “You know that the princes of the Gentiles lord it over them; and they that are the greater, exercise power upon them. It shall not be so among you” (Matthew 20:25–6). “Be not you called rabbi. For one is your master, and all you are brethren. And call none your father upon earth: for one is your father, who is in heaven. Neither be ye called masters: for one is your master, Christ” (Matthew 23:8–10). Despite these texts the clergy accepted titles of honour and claimed authority and power: the Church saw itself as Christ's kingdom on earth, and claimed a share in Christ's power.

Paul's text, “For what have I to do to judge them that are without? Do not you judge them that are within? For them that are without, God will judge” (1 Corinthians 5:12–13), was usually taken to imply that the Church has no jurisdiction over non-Christians (“them that are without”, i.e., outside the Church).

3. The Fathers of the Church

The Christian theologians of late antiquity are referred to as the Fathers of the Church.[6] The most influential of them in medieval Europe was St Augustine; others included Cyprian, Ambrose and Gregory. The Greek Fathers (Origen, Chrysostom etc.) were not so influential at first, but during the scholastic period many of their writings were translated into Latin. The Fathers were influential partly through their originalia (i.e., their original writings in their complete text), but perhaps more through extracts included in “glosses” on the Bible and in anthologies and through extensive quotations made by later writers. Many of the Fathers were influenced by the Platonism and Stoicism that every educated person became acquainted with in the ancient world. Augustine was particularly influenced by Platonism, in the version modern scholars call “Neo-Platonism”, i.e., the philosophy of Plotinus.

The Fathers passed down to the middle ages the idea that certain key social institutions were not part of God's original plan for mankind, namely the institutions of coercive government, slavery and property. The idea found in Seneca and other ancient Stoics of a Golden Age had a parallel in Christian thinking, namely the age of innocence in the Garden of Eden, from which mankind were expelled because of the sin of Adam and Eve (the “Fall”).[7] Just as Seneca ([1917–25], Letter 90) held that originally there would have been no need for coercion, since human beings would voluntarily have accepted the guidance of the wise, and no need for property, since no one would have sought to control more resources than they needed to support a temperate way of life, and no slavery, since a slave is a human being treated as property, so, according to the Fathers, these institutions would not have existed if Adam had not sinned. But because of sin they do exist, both as a result of sinfulness (the power-hungry and greedy amass coercive power and property), and as a necessary and justified remedy for sin—ideally, governments should use coercion to repress wrongdoing, with slavery used only as a punishment, milder than execution, for wrongdoing, and property should be of moderate extent, its purpose being to protect possession of necessities from the greed of those who would otherwise try to control everything.

The common opinion on coercive government and slavery was expressed by Augustine. God “did not intend that …[man] should have lordship over any but irrational creatures: not man over man, but man over the beasts. Hence, the first just men were established as shepherds of flocks, rather than as kings of men” (City of God, XIX.15, p. 942).[8] He goes on to say that slavery is a just punishment for sin, and that servi are so called because “those who might [justly] have been slain under the laws of war were sometimes spared” [servabantur].

On property, Gratian's Decretum[9] included a passage from Ambrose: “But you say, ‘Where is the injustice if I diligently look after my own property without interfering with other people's?’ O impudent words! ... No one may call his own what is common; if more than enough is taken, it is possessed by violence.... Who is more unjust, more avaricious, more greedy than a man who takes the food of the multitude not for his use but for his abundance and luxuries?... The bread that you hold back belongs to the needy”.[10] Thus even now that property exists, things are in some sense “common”, and the amount of property individuals may legitimately keep for their own use is limited.

4. Augustine

4.1 The City of God

The work of Augustine's most likely to be known to modern students of political thought is The City of God. Although this work was often copied in the middle ages (382 manuscripts have survived),[11] a reading of the whole work was never part of the university curriculum. Extracts from it were included in influential anthologies, such as Gratian's Decretum and Peter Lombard's Sentences.[12]

Two cities, the city of God and the earthly city, are distinguished by two loves, love of God and (misdirected) love of self, and by two destinies, heaven and hell. Augustine's most famous contribution to theology was the doctrine of predestination. God has decreed from all eternity that to some he will give the grace (special help) needed to attain eternal salvation, while the rest of mankind (the majority) will go to eternal damnation. Salvation requires the grace of “final perseverance”, i.e. the grace of being in friendship with God at the moment of death. Some who live well for most of their lives may fall away at the very end. Thus we cannot tell for sure who is predestined to salvation. Since the city of God consists of those predestined to salvation, we cannot be sure of its membership. The city of God is not identical with the Church, since not all members of the Church will be saved. The earthly city is not identical with any particular state, since some members of a state may be predestined to salvation. A particular state may include citizens of both cities.

Although the members of the two cities have different ultimate values, they may have intermediate ends in common—for example, they all desire peace on earth. Insofar as any particular state serves such common ends it will have the cooperation of members of the city of God. See City of God, XIX.17 (pp. 945–7). As a Platonist Augustine thought in terms of a hierarchy of levels of reality, in which lower levels imitate or reflect the higher levels. Augustine's is not a philosophy of “black and white”, of stark opposition between the forces of light and the forces of darkness—this was the Manichean philosophy, to which Augustine at one time subscribed, until the reading of certain works of the Platonists had led him to reject it. According to Augustine there is no absolute evil.[13] Anything evil must be to some extent good, or it could not exist at all. Its evil consists in disorder or misdirection, in its failing to attain all the goodness appropriate to it. “The peace of all things lies in the tranquillity of order, and order is the disposition of equal and unequal things in such a way as to give to each its proper place” (City of God, XIX.13, p. 938). There are many orderings and sub-orderings, and there are therefore different kinds or levels of peace, and (for beings capable of moral choice) different kinds or levels of virtue, justice and happiness.[14]

True virtue presupposes obedience to the true God. But something like true virtue, namely love of honour, may lead to something like justice and peace, as it did in the Roman Republic (City of God, V.12). In City of God, II.21 Augustine offers to prove that by Cicero's definition, the Romans never had a republic. “I shall attempt to show that no such commonwealth ever existed, because true justice was never present in it” (p. 80), since the Romans did not obey the true God; cf. XIX.21. But this is only an argumentum ad hominem. As Augustine says, “There was, of course, according to a more practicable definition, a commonwealth of a sort” (ibid.). It is only by an unduly narrow definition that it can be said that non-Christians cannot form a commonwealth. Motivated by love of honour, the Romans were able to live together in an approximation to peace, justice and happiness, though not in “true” peace, justice and happiness. Justice in some measure is essential to anything that deserves to be called a commonwealth. “Justice removed, then, what are kingdoms but great bands of robbers?... It was a pertinent and true answer which was made to Alexander the Great by a pirate whom he had seized. When the king asked him what he meant by infesting the sea, the pirate defiantly replied: ‘The same as you do when you infest the whole world; but because I do it with a little ship I am called a robber, and because you do it with a great fleet, you are an emperor’” (City of God, IV.4, pp. 147–8).

Some medieval writers, whom some modern historians have called “Political Augustinians”,[15] inferred from Augustine's discussion of Cicero's definition of a republic that among non-Christians there can be no community. According to Giles of Rome (and a few others), non-Christians can have no property rights and no political rights, since such things presuppose membership of a community, and only Christians can form a true community. But the views of these so-called Political Augustinians were generally rejected by other medieval political thinkers.

In The City of God, Augustine does not suggest that only good Christians can be rulers. Nevertheless, he believes that Christian virtue makes for better government. For his characterisation of the ideal Christian ruler see City of God, V.24, p. 232.

Among medieval Christians there were at least three views of the goods and evils of government:

  • Government may be, and should be, rule by the ideal Christian ruler, whom the Protestants later called “the godly prince”; such a ruler would lead his people in obedience to God.
  • Government may be simply a wicked tyranny, an expression of the “earthly city”. Pope Gregory VII: “Who does not know that kings and dukes had their rulership from those who, not knowing God, by pride, rapine, perfidy, murder, and crimes of all sorts, urged on by the ruler of the world, i.e., the devil, by blind greed and intolerable presumption strove to dominate their equals, namely mankind?”[16]
  • Government exists to organise the cooperation of “men of good will” (to use a modern phrase), i.e., citizens of the two cities united by an interest in earthly peace and other earthly goods valued by both Christians and others. Such a limited view of the goals of government is found in Marsilius and Ockham.[17]

All three views could find support in The City of God.

4.2 Warfare

Augustine insists, against the Manichees, that the God of the Old Testament is the same God as the God of the New Testament. One of the most striking differences between the two testaments was in relation to warfare. In the Old Testament God permits, in fact requires, the Israelites to engage in massacres. In the land God has given to the Israelites, the inhabitants of a city that surrenders will be enslaved, but if the city resists, “you shall not leave a single soul alive” (Deuteronomy 20:11, 16). “You must utterly destroy them; you shall make no covenant with them, and show no mercy to them” (Deuteronomy 7:2). If in some Israelite city some inhabitants practice idolatry, “you shall surely put the inhabitants of that city to the sword, destroying it utterly, all who are in it and its cattle” (Deuteronomy 13:16). Moses himself carried out a massacre of Israelites who had practiced idolatry (Exodus 32:25–9). Moses was angry when the Israelites spared women and children, and ordered them to kill all the prisoners except the virgins, whom they could keep for themselves (Numbers 31:13–18). Samuel was angry with Saul when the army let some animals live; for that sin, God deprived Saul of the kingdom (1 Kings 15). Samuel himself hewed a prisoner to pieces (1 Kings 15:32–3). In the New Testament, in contrast, Christ says: “if one strike thee on thy right cheek, turn to him also the other”. Can the New Testament be reconciled with the Old Testament? On Augustine's view, the two Testaments must be reconcilable, since everything in the Bible is true.

According to Augustine, God may treat his creatures as he pleases, and the Israelites accordingly did no wrong in carrying out God's commands. (As medieval authors often put it, God is “lord of life and death”.) On the other hand, the New Testament's apparently pacifist injunctions relate to inner attitude, rather than to outward act. “These precepts pertain rather to the inward disposition of the heart than to the actions which are done in the sight of men, requiring us, in the inmost heart, to cherish patience along with benevolence, but in outward action to do what seems most likely to benefit those whose good we ought to seek” (Letter 138 ii.13).[18] Those whose good we ought to seek include ourselves, and also our enemies, and coercion and punishment may benefit them, so we may war against them for their own good, as well as for our own. Private individuals may not make war, but rulers, including Christians, may do so, and Christian soldiers may serve in such wars in obedience to a ruler, even a pagan. Augustine emphasises that both rulers and those who do military service in obedience to rulers must avoid hatred, greed and other dispositions incompatible with love. Thus Augustine is able to construct a Christianised version of the Roman theory of the just war.[19]

On warfare see Contra Faustum XXII.74–80, letters to Boniface (Letter 189.4), Marcellinus (Letter 138, chapter II), and Augustine [2001].

4.3 Coercion of Heretics

In accordance with Augustine's view of warfare, Christians were entitled to ask the Roman authorities, including those among them who were Christian, for military protection against the violence of heretics and anti-Christians. But it was a further step to ask the authorities to coerce heretics to convert them to orthodox Christianity.[20] At first Augustine disapproved of such coercion: “A man cannot believe unless he is willing”.[21] But after a while he was persuaded and became an advocate of the use of force to “compel them to come in” (Luke 14:16–24).[22] He was persuaded by converted Donatists who expressed gratitude to those who had compelled them to convert. (Letter to Vincentius, Letter 93 V.17–19).

According to Augustine, the property of heretical sects may rightly be confiscated: see Tractates on the Gospel of John, VI.25, in which Augustine justifies government seizure of Donatist property. He does not argue that only orthodox Christians can rightly possess property. Rather, his point is that whoever possesses property possesses it only by virtue of human laws made by kings and emperors. Therefore, if the ruler decides to confiscate the property of heretics, he has the right to do so. This passage, quoted by Gratian, Decretum, dist. 8, c. 1, was often used in the middle ages to support the doctrine that property exists only by human law.

On the coercion of heretics, see the letters to Boniface (Letter 185), Vincentius (Letter 93) and Donatus (Letter 173), and Augustine [2001].

5. Carolingian Political Thought

The period in the history of Latin Europe after that of the “Fathers of the Church” has traditionally been called the “dark age”, because very few writings were produced then. It was followed by what has sometimes been called “The Carolingian Renaissance”, associated with the court of Charlemagne, toward the end of the eighth century. The political writers of the ninth century—Hincmar of Rheims, Rabanus Maurus, Jonas of Orleans etc.—are not household names, yet they gave expression to ideas that were important throughout the rest of the middle ages, in particular ideas about the role of a king and the difference between king and tyrant.[23]

According to these writers, the king is in some sense a religious figure. This meant that the king could involve himself in religious matters much more than would later be acceptable to the medieval church, but it also meant that the king was to be instructed in his duties by the clergy. Some of the writings of this period belong to what modern scholars call the “mirror of princes” genre (for an example see Jonas of Orleans [1983]). Writers taught the king that he had a duty to do justice. This was often construed as meaning that the king had a duty to enforce and also to obey the law, and the law was thought of as partly custom, partly royal decree, but also as something based on the consent of the people.[24] It was suggested that a king might be deposed as a tyrant if he failed to obey the laws and lost the consent of the people.[25]

6. Civil and Canon Law

Historians point to another “renaissance” (i.e., another stage in the re-appropriation of the culture of antiquity) during the 12th century. This “renaissance of the twelfth century” included a revival in the study of civil law, i.e., the Roman law as codified and digested by Justinian and his officials (the Corpus iuris civilis),[26] and this stimulated and influenced the study of the rules or “canons” of the Church (the Corpus iuris canonici), as collected in Gratian's Decretum.[27]

Ideas that medieval political thinkers took from the law texts included the following:

  • A distinction among kinds of laws, namely natural law (ius naturale), law of nations (ius gentium), and civil law (i.e., the law of a particular community). The law textbooks were perhaps the main source of the idea of natural law, so important to later medieval political thought. This idea can be traced back to Cicero, to the Stoics, and to Aristotle, but most medieval political philosophers encountered it in Gratian's Decretum.[28]
  • A notion of rights, including natural rights (“human rights” as we would say), attributable to individuals. It is noteworthy that the language of rights, without which many people these days would not know how to talk about politics, did not come into political philosophy until the 14th century as a borrowing from the law.[29]
  • A belief in “the one liberty of all men,” that is, the idea that human beings are basically equal and that slavery is contrary to natural law, though in accordance with the law of nations.[30]
  • An account, or rather two accounts, of the origin of property: according to some Roman law texts, property originated by natural law; according to others by the law of nations.[31] According to the canon law, property exists by human law (which includes the law of nations and the civil law); compare Augustine's statement that property exists by the laws of the Emperors (§4.3 above).
  • A canon law doctrine that human law cannot altogether abolish the original commonness of things under natural law. Property owners must help the poor (see Ambrose, end of §3 above), and in cases of necessity, a person may assert the natural right to use anything needed to sustain life.[32]
  • The doctrine that the source of political authority is the people, who have, however, entrusted their power to the emperor or other ruler.[33]
  • The doctrine that natural law permits an individual to resist force by force (providing a premise for arguments for the right to resist a tyrannical government, used later by Locke).[34]
  • A distinction between Church and State—more exactly, between the priesthood and the power of the emperor, each independent in its own sphere, though the priesthood has the higher function. The classic place for this doctrine is the canon Duo sunt.[35] Another canon, Cum ad verum, gave reasons for the separation: mutual limitation of their powers would restrain the pride of priest and emperor, and those on God's service (the clergy) should be kept free of worldly entanglements.[36] This was also the force of the canons Sicut enim and Te quidem.[37]
  • Various legal ideas relating to corporations[38] and representation (including the distinction between a head's capacity as head and his private capacity), the need for meetings to deal with common concerns (“what touches everyone must be discussed and approved by everyone”),[39] and majority decision (or some qualified version thereof) when there is no unanimity (decision by “the greater and sounder part”).[40]

Of these points, what was probably most important for medieval political philosophy was the idea of natural law.

6.1 Natural Law and Natural Rights

Complex reflections on natural law were prompted by a text of Isidore of Seville, quoted in Gratian, Decretum, dist. 1, c. 7, Ius naturale. According to Isidore, natural law includes “the common possession of all things, the one liberty of all, and the acquisition of what is taken from air, land and sea; also, the restitution of a thing or money left for safekeeping”.[41] The common possession of all things seems inconsistent with the acquisition and restitution of property.

One of the early commentators on Gratian, Rufinus, distinguished within natural law between commands or prohibitions, to which there can be no exceptions, and “demonstrations” or “indications” pointing out what is better but not always obligatory. Thus natural law not only lays down rules but also recommends ideals. The “one liberty of all men” and “common possession of all things” belong to the “demonstrations”. Since the demonstrations do not impose strict obligations, human laws can for good reasons set them aside. To do so may even serve the recommended ideals, under some circumstances. “For example... it was established that those who pertinaciously rebelled against those who have authority over them would be perpetually slaves when defeated and captured in war... that [they]... should thereafter become gentle...”, a purpose recommended by natural law.[42]

One of the founders of Franciscan theology, Alexander of Hales, reported Rufinus's distinction and a similar distinction by Hugh of St Victor,[43] but also suggested another way of resolving the inconsistency in Isidore's list, based on Augustine's explanation of how the same God can be the author of the Old Law and of the New: namely, that the same principles may require different particular rules for different circumstances.[44] According to Alexander, Isidore's list is not inconsistent after all, since natural law prescribes community for the state of innocence and respect for property for the fallen state.[45] The leading Franciscan theologian of the next generation, Bonaventure, adopted a similar position.[46]

Building on these ideas, Ockham developed a distinction between three kinds of natural law, according to which some principles of natural law apply everywhere and always, some applied only in the state of innocence, and some apply only “on supposition”, viz. on the supposition of some voluntary act (e.g., an agreement or an act of legislation), unless those concerned agree on something else. Thus “the common possession of all things, the one liberty of all” belonged to the natural law in the state of innocence, but “the acquisition of what is taken from air, land and sea; also, the restitution of a thing or money left for safekeeping” belonged to natural law “on supposition”—supposing Adam's sin, and supposing that human law has since made a division of property, it is a requirement of natural law to respect others' property. [47] Many things that belong to the law of nations are also natural laws of the third kind.

Besides natural law, scholastic thinkers developed a notion of natural rights, borrowing the notion of a right from the canon lawyers. A natural right may be simply something that natural law requires or permits. But according to some, natural rights to certain freedoms belong to natural law “positively”, in the sense that there is a presumption in their favour, so that they cannot be abolished, at least not for all circumstances, or cannot be abolished except for good reasons. Medieval natural rights foreshadow modern “human rights”.[48]

7. Aristotle's Politics

Another aspect of the “renaissance of the twelfth century” was the translation into Latin of many Greek and Arabic philosophical and scientific writings (see the section on New Translations in the entry on medieval philosophy). The market for these translations included the teachers, students and alumni of the urban schools, which in the early thirteenth century began to form universities. The universities set the curriculum followed in the schools of the town, and, given Aristotle's fame, competition for students between the schools of different towns soon meant that Aristotle's works became the main element in the Arts curriculum (despite the misgivings of the theologians, who noted the conflicts between Aristotle's philosophy and Christian belief).

In their interpretations of Aristotle's natural philosophy and metaphysics and in philosophical thinking generally, the medieval schools were much influenced by Muslim and Jewish thinkers. This was not true, however, in political philosophy. By some accident of transmission, the Islamic world does not seem to have known Aristotle's Politics, but the Muslims did become acquainted with Plato's Republic—which, however, was not translated into Latin during the middle ages. In Arabic there was a good deal of political philosophy showing the influence of Plato (for some information see “Political Thought in Medieval Islam” listed below under “Other Internet Resources”), but it had little or no influence over political philosophy in Medieval Europe.

Aristotle's Politics was translated into Latin for the first time in the mid-1260s by William of Moerbeke. (An incomplete translation had been made a few years earlier, possibly by Moerbeke, and the Nicomachean Ethics, some parts of which relate to politics, had been translated by Robert Grosseteste a little earlier.) Although the Politics did not become part of the core curriculum, it was closely studied by many of the leading philosophers of the scholastic period.[49] Notable commentaries on the Politics were written by Thomas Aquinas and Peter of Auvergne.[50] Ockham drew on their commentaries to give a clear and concise summary of Aristotle's political theory.[51] For a modern account of the work see the entry on Aristotle's political theory.

Ideas which medieval political writers took from Aristotle (or which Aristotle reinforced) include the following:

  • It is natural for human beings to form cities. “Political” [i.e., city] life is natural to human kind.[52] On the face of it, this is in conflict with Augustine (see §3 above).
  • The city or state exists not just for security and trade, but to foster the “good life”, the life according to virtue.[53]
  • Some human beings are slaves “by nature”, i.e., there are, or may be, human beings marked out by nature for subordination to the interests of others. Natural slaves are human beings naturally lacking in intelligence and in capacity to achieve virtue or happiness.[54] This conflicted with the thinking of the New Testament (see §2.2), the lawyers (§6) and the Stoics and the Fathers of the Church (§3).
  • Women should, in general, be ruled by men.[55] The inferiority of women was already the general opinion, but Aristotle reinforced it, not only by what he said in the Politics but also by his biological theories.
  • There are various forms of government, of which some are good and some are perversions. The good forms seek “the common good”, i.e., the good of both ruler and ruled. The best is kingship, the worst tyranny.[56] “The common good” became a basic conception in medieval political philosophy.[57]
  • There is a “best” regime, the form of government that best fosters the common good. The “ideal polity” was not a topic of pre-Aristotelian medieval thought, but it became a common theme.[58]
  • “The rule of law” is better than “the rule of men”,[59] i.e., it is better to have rules impartially applied than to leave every decision to the unfettered discretion of the rulers. This fitted in with the earlier medieval idea that the difference between a king and a tyrant is that the king observes the law (see §5).
  • However, since no legislator can foresee every case that may arise, the rule of law must be tempered by epieikeia, “equity”, the making of exceptions to general rules when exceptional cases arise.[60]
  • A good form of government must be stable, not liable to revolution.[61] Medieval Aristotelians gave some thought to precautions against the degeneration of kingship into tyranny.[62] Marsilius presents Defensor pacis as a supplement to Aristotle's discussion of the causes of revolution.
  • Although Aristotle regarded kingship as ideally best (and medieval writers agreed), Aristotle also gives an argument for democracy—or, more exactly, an argument that in good government there is a role for ordinary people. If ordinary people deliberate as a body they may make sound decisions.[63] Marsilius (and others) used Aristotle's remarks to support the proposition that the people are the ultimate political authority, an idea also found in the Roman law.
  • All of Aristotle's works supported one of the central institutions of medieval university life, disputation, in which the master states opposing positions and supports them with strong arguments, then evaluates the arguments by criticism.[64] The practice of disputing about important questions, including questions relating to politics, was deeply ingrained in medieval culture.

8. Papal Fullness of Power

So much for the sources of medieval political philosophy and its early stages. Let us turn now to the contributions made by scholastic and late scholastic writers, who often became involved in conflict between secular rulers and the papacy.

One focus of controversy was the papal claim to “fullness of power”. Originally the claim meant that the Pope had preeminently whatever power any other authority had within the Church, so that he could intervene by full right in any Church affair.[65] During the 13th century this conception was invoked when the Pope authorised the mendicant friars to preach and perform religious functions in a diocese even without the consent of the diocesan bishop. Such interventions were strongly opposed by many secular clerics who argued that bishops had their authority by divine law and were not merely agents of the Pope.[66]

During the 13th and 14th centuries Popes also claimed the right to intervene in affairs normally the province of secular rulers. This claim was made especially in reference to the Roman Empire. Pope Leo III had crowned Charlemagne as Roman Emperor in 800, and in 962 Pope John XII gave the title “Roman Emperor” to the German prince Otto I. From then until 1806 a succession of German princes claimed the title. The Popes took the view that they had transferred the Empire from the Greeks to the Franks in the person of Charlemagne, and from the Franks to the Germans in the person of Otto I, thereby showing that the Roman Empire was subject to the Popes, and in particular that the Pope had a right to approve or reject the candidate elected to be emperor. (The Emperor was elected by the German princes who constituted the electoral college—like the Pope, the Emperor was a monarch chosen by an electoral college to hold office for life.) Spain, France, England and some other places rejected the authority of the “Roman Empire”, but incidents in the history of various kingdoms supported papal claims to authority over kings.

Besides the historical arguments there were theological or philosophical arguments. If “there is no power but from God” (Romans 13:1, §2.1 above) and the Pope is God's representative on earth, then it seems that power comes to Christian kings through the Pope. Medieval writers were not acquainted with Plato's notion of a “philosopher king” (Republic, 473e), since very little of Plato had been translated into Latin, but in effect pro-papal theologians were arguing that the Pope was a “theologian king”, an expert on the meaning of life whose guidance was authoritative in all matters.

The Popes did not in fact wish to take on the burdens of day-to-day government throughout the world. Their claim was that, while ruling was normally the business of secular rulers, the Pope could intervene by full right in governmental matters whenever he saw good reason to do so. Canon lawyers drew up lists of circumstances in which the Pope might intervene,[67] but some items in the list were so comprehensive as to leave no area in which Popes could not intervene. For example, intervention ratione peccati, “by reason of sin”, meant that if a secular ruler commits an injustice (which is a sin) then the Pope might intervene.

Papal claims were opposed by secular rulers, by clerical writers who saw some interest in defending the secular rulers, and by theologians unconvinced by the pro-papal arguments and concerned about the likely effects of papal encroachment. Most of the political writers of the 13th and 14th centuries were involved in controversy about the extent and limits (or absence of limits) of papal authority.[68]

9. Thomas Aquinas

Thomas Aquinas wrote a work in the “mirror of princes” genre, namely On Kingship, to the King of Cyprus, but otherwise his political writing was incidental to his academic work, and not, as was the case with most medieval political writers, an attempt to influence contemporary events. The Summa theologiae includes discussions of dominion in the state of innocence, natural law and other kinds of law, property, the best form of government, the duty of obedience, war, coercion of heretics and infidels, and other political matters. These discussions are not organised into a separate treatise on politics but distributed through the work in accordance with its plan as a summary of theology.[69]

Whereas Augustine had held that in the state of innocence there would have been no lordship of man over man, Thomas says that there would have been dominium [lordship] in the state of innocence (Summa, 1, q. 96, a. 4). This has sometimes been taken as a rejection of Augustine in favour of Aristotle's doctrine that politics is natural. However, Thomas says that in the state of innocence there would have been no coercion, but there would have been government in the sense of wise leadership voluntarily accepted by the less wise. This is a view found not in Aristotle but in earlier Latin writers, for example Seneca (see §3), and the contradiction with Augustine is merely verbal—for Augustine dominium implies coercion, for Thomas its sense is broader.

On natural law and other kinds of law Thomas again follows not Aristotle but the tradition of civil and canon law going back to the Roman Stoics.[70] He distinguishes divine law (eternal and positive) from human law, and among human laws he distinguishes natural law from the law of nations and civil law; see Summa, 1–2, q. 95, a. 4. Law is concerned with direction to the common good, which belongs to the whole people (Summa, 1–2, q. 90, a. 3). All positive human law must be in accordance with natural law, though its prescriptions will depend upon choice and circumstances (for example, natural law prescribes that we must not kill, but human positive law makes additional rules to prevent killing, rules that may depend on arbitrary choice—e.g. there may be a rule requiring motorists to drive on the left and not the right, or vice versa). See Summa, 1–2, q. 95, a. 2. Natural law is in effect morality, and according to Thomas the human mind, reflecting on and analysing human experience, can see the truth of various fundamental moral principles, which are thus “self-evident”, not in need of proof, and too fundamental to be capable of proof (Summa, 1–2, q. 91, a. 3, and q. 94, a. 2.).[71]

On property, Thomas follows the view of the Stoics and the Fathers that property exists by human positive law. Natural law permits us to use things (Summa, 2–2, q. 66, a. 1), but property goes beyond power to use: it includes a power to exclude others from use, and this power is conferred by human positive law (Summa, 2–2, q. 66, a. 2). Property rights give way to extreme need (see §6 above), so in time of extreme need using another's property without permission is not theft (Summa, 2–2, q. 66, a. 7).

The best form of government, according to Thomas, is a mixed government combining elements of democracy, aristocracy and kingship (Summa, 1–2, q. 105, a. 1). This is reminiscent of Aristotle's preference for mixed government over either democracy or oligarchy, but in fact many ancient writers, including Cicero, advocated mixed government, and on this topic Thomas is closer to Polybius than to Aristotle.[72]

On the duty to obey government, Thomas does not adopt the position that many others found in the New Testament, that disobedience is never justified. According to Thomas Aquinas, though there is a general duty to obey the law and the government, an unjust law is not a law (Summa, 1–2, q. 96, a. 4; see also 2–2, q. 104, a. 5).

On war, Thomas is an exponent of a version of the “just war” theory Augustine took from the ancient Romans. For a war to be just, it must be commanded by someone in authority, there must be a just cause, and it must be carried on without disproportionate violence. It is not justifiable to lie to an enemy, since that would destroy the trust that will be needed to restore peace. See Summa, 2–2, q. 40, a. 1, a. 3.

On questions relating to the coercion of heretics and unbelievers, Thomas supports the practice of the medieval Church. A heretic (i.e., someone who has been baptised as a Catholic but has since rejected orthodox Catholic doctrine) can rightly be compelled to return to the Church, but a Jew or unbeliever who has never been a Catholic should not be converted by force (Summa, 2–2, q. 10, a. 8). Simple people should not be exposed to the opinions of unbelievers (Summa, 2–2, q. 10, a. 7, 9). The children of Jews should not be taken from them and brought up as Catholics, since this would violate natural justice, which gives parents control over under-age children (Summa, 2–2, q. 10, a. 12). The religious rites of Jews may be tolerated, but not those of other unbelievers, except to avoid strife or in hope of their gradual conversion (Summa, 2–2, q. 10, a. 11).

9.1 Secular and Spiritual Power

The relationship between secular and spiritual power is discussed briefly at the end of an early work, the Scripta super libros sententiarum. (For translation, see Thomas Aquinas [1978], pp. 106–7.) Thomas asks, When two authorities conflict, how should we decide which to obey? He answers that if one authority originates totally from the other (as, he says, the authority of a bishop derives from the Pope), greater obedience in all matters is due to the originating authority. If, however, both powers originate from a higher authority, the higher authority will determine which of them takes precedence on which occasion. Spiritual and secular power, he says, both come from God, so we should obey the spiritual over the secular only in matters which God has specified, namely matters concerning the salvation of the soul, and in civic matters we should obey the secular power—“unless spiritual and secular power are joined in one person, as they are in the Pope, who by God's arrangement holds the apex of both spiritual and secular powers”. In other words, the Pope has supreme authority in both secular and spiritual matters.

In De regno Thomas constructs an Aristotelian teleological argument to the same conclusion. A polity has an end, purpose or goal, which may be sought in a variety of ways, effectively or not, and it is a composite entity consisting of many individuals with their own individual purposes. For both reasons there is needed some directing agency to guide the potentially conflicting individuals effectively to their common goal. Every being is in some way one; a composite entity has a unity of order, i.e., of direction to a single end. In preserving its being, therefore, the directing agency has to preserve the polity in peace and unity by ordering it to a common goal. There is a hierarchy of goals, that is, there are intermediate ends which are also means to higher ends. A polity exists to secure its citizens' lives, but above living there is living well, i.e., virtuously, and above that there is living so as to attain the “beatific vision” of God (the Christian heaven). If all these ordered ends were attainable simply by human effort, the one supreme directing agency would be concerned with them all; however, to attain the beatific vision requires “grace”, i.e., God's special help, which natural human activity cannot earn. Besides the state, humanity therefore needs the Church, a human agency God has established to confer grace through the sacraments. Hence there is a distinction between secular government, which uses naturally available means to guide citizens to their final goal, and ecclesiastical government, which uses supernatural means, the sacraments. Secular rulers must be subject to the Pope, “for those to whom pertains the care of intermediate ends should be subject to him to whom pertains the care of the ultimate end”.

For more detail see the section on Political Community in the entry on Aquinas's moral, political and legal philosophy.

10. Giles of Rome

Philip IV, King of France 1285–1314, was one of the most ruthless of medieval rulers. He came into conflict with Pope Boniface VIII, one of the most arrogant of medieval Popes, and with Pope Clement V, one of the most timid. Clement acquiesced in Philip's attack on the Templar Order and other outrages to evade the king's pressure to condemn his predecessor, Boniface, as a heretic. These conflicts gave rise to a body of writings of great interest to the history of political thought.[73] Of these the most important were Giles of Rome's De ecclesiastica potestate (On Ecclesiastical Power) and John of Paris's De potestate regia et papali (On Royal and Papal Power), both c. 1302,[74] respectively an assertion of supreme papal power and an attempt to restate the dualism of Duo sunt (see §6 and note 35).

Giles argues that the Pope's fullness of power extends to political matters, so that the Pope is the supreme ruler of the world, God's deputy on earth, who delegates power to governments and supervises their activities. Giles's term for governmental power is dominium, which was also a term for property; Giles assimilates the two kinds of dominium, so that he holds that the Pope is also the supreme owner. He supports his position with many arguments, of which I will report only two. (1) He appeals to the idea that the universe is a single unity with a hierarchical ordering in which the Pope is the supreme hierarch among mankind: there are two swords, but the temporal sword must be subject to the spiritual, i.e., secular rulers must be subject to the Pope.[75] (2) He applies Augustine's discussion of the question whether the Romans had a true republic (see §4.1) to argue that no one who does not submit to Christ's dominium, and therefore to the dominium of the Pope as Christ's vicar, can have any just dominium himself. As Augustine said, property is possessed by the laws of emperors and kings (§4.3), which presupposes the authority of a community: so, Giles argues, since people who fail to honour the true God cannot belong to a community, only members of the community of the faithful can have any right to political power or property.[76] Wyclif later took these arguments further to the conclusion that no sinner, indeed only the predestined, can have any just dominium, a doctrine condemned by the Council of Constance. The thesis that only Christians can have lordship was inconsistent with the theological tradition and was generally rejected.[77]

Giles of Rome may have had a hand in drafting Boniface's document Unam sanctam, generally regarded as the most extreme statement of papal authority. Whether he drafted it or not, the ideas and language of Unam sanctam are reminiscent of Giles's work.[78]

For more on Giles's philosophy and political philosophy, including his influential book on the education of a prince,[79] see Giles of Rome.

11. John of Paris

John of Paris reasserts the traditional distinction between ownership and rulership. The fact that a ruler adjudicates property disputes does not make him supreme owner. A community (a state, or the Church, or particular communities) acquires property only from individuals, and the head of the community is the administrator of the community's property, not its owner. This is true also of the Pope, who does not have unrestricted power over Church property, still less over the properties of lay people (pp. 96–105).[80] John's assumption that original appropriation is by individuals, and his remark that individuals acquire property by “labour and industry” (pp. 86, 103), have led to suggestions that he anticipated Locke's theory of property. However, John indicates that individuals acquire property under human law (pp. 148, 154, 225–6),[81] which is the view traditional among medieval theologians, following Augustine (see §4.3). Property is acquired under human law, but it is acquired by individuals, not directly by rulers.

As for rulership, John argues that the Pope cannot be the supreme temporal ruler because the spiritual and temporal powers should be held by different persons. John gives the traditional reasons (see §6), emphasizing the argument that the priest should be exclusively devoted to spiritual affairs (pp. 117–8). The temporal power is not established by, or in any way caused by, the spiritual power. Both come from God, but neither comes through the other. The spiritual is in some sense superior, but not as being the cause of the temporal power (pp. 93, 192). The basis of the distinction between the two powers is not subject matter or ends, but means. Each power is limited to its own appropriate means of action; the secular power uses natural means, the Church uses supernatural means (pp. 142–61). This is very much like Thomas Aquinas's picture of two powers leading mankind toward the goals of human life in ordered hierarchy, one using natural means and the other supernatural. Thomas infers from the fact that the Church is concerned with the highest end the conclusion that the Pope ought to direct the secular ruler (see above, §9.1). John explicitly rejects this line of argument. Teaching is a spiritual function, but in a household the teacher does not direct the physician. The physician exercises a higher art than the pharmacist, but, though the physician guides the pharmacist, he cannot give authoritative directions or dismiss the pharmacist. Such officials in a great household do not direct one another, but are all under the direction of the head of the family. Similarly both Pope and prince derive their authority from God, who sets the limits of their power, and he has not subordinated one to the other (pp. 182, 184–6, 93).

12. Marsilius of Padua

Another upsurge in writing about politics was prompted by the actions of Pope John XXII (Pope 1316–1330). John's opponents included Marsilius of Padua and William of Ockham. Pope John rejected the Franciscan doctrine that those who practice the highest form of religious poverty, like Christ and the Apostles, will own nothing whatever, either as individuals or as a body. Relying on arguments drawn from the civil law, John held that no one can justly use consumables, such as food, without owning what they use. Since no one can live without using things, at least food, no one can justly live without property, as the Franciscans claimed to do. John also became involved in conflict with Ludwig of Bavaria. Relying on the papal claim that the emperor-elect requires papal approval, John rejected the electors' choice of Ludwig as Roman Emperor (see §8).

Marsilius of Padua's Defensor pacis (1324)[82] set out to refute the doctrine of papal fullness of power and, in particular, to prove that the pope is not the source of government power. He argues that all coercive power comes from the people (pp. 44–9, 61–3/65–72, 88–90), and that no people can have more than one supreme ruler, who is the source of all coercive power in that community (pp. 80–6/114–22). (Marsilius is the first exponent of the doctrine of sovereignty later put forward by Hobbes and many others, i.e., the doctrine that there must be ultimately just one coercive power in a state.) The supreme ruler cannot be a cleric, since Christ has forbidden the clergy to become involved in temporal affairs (pp. 113–40/159–92). And the supreme ruler does not enforce divine law as such, since God wills that divine law should be enforced by sanctions only in the next world, to give every opportunity for repentance before death (pp. 164, 175–9/221, 235–239). The supreme ruler is therefore not an enforcer of religion and his rule is not subject to direction by the clergy. Within the Church, the Pope has from Christ no more authority than any other cleric. Christ did not appoint Peter as head of the Church, Peter never went to Rome, the bishop of Rome is not Peter's successor as head of the Church (pp. 44–9/61–3). As for religious poverty, Marsilius sides with the Franciscans and takes their doctrine further—not only is it legitimate for religious to live entirely without ownership of property (they can use what they need with the owner's permission), but this is what Christ intended for all the clergy (pp. 183–4, 196–215/244–6, 262–86). Thus on his view the Pope and clergy should have no lordship at all, either in the sense of coercive jurisdiction or in the sense of ownership of property. His position is diametrically opposite that of Giles of Rome.

Marsilius did believe that the Church exercised some authority over its members, but, so far as this was a doctrinal authority, it was exercised not by the Pope but by a general Council (Marsilius held that the Bible and general Councils are infallible, but not the Pope (pp. 274–9/360–66)). Now that Europe is Christian a general Council cannot be convened or its decisions enforced except by the Christian lay ruler (pp. 287–98/376–90). The establishment of a hierarchy and the division of the Church into bishoprics and other acts of Church government are also done by authority of the lay ruler. Rather than secular government being subordinated to the Church, the Church is subordinated to the secular government in all that concerns coercive power.[83]

13. William of Ockham

When his authorship of Defensor pacis was discovered, Marsilius hastily left Paris and took refuge at the court of Ludwig of Bavaria in Munich. Not long afterwards a number of dissident Franciscans also took refuge in Munich, among them William of Ockham. From about 1332 until his death in 1347 Ockham wrote a series of books and pamphlets, now usually called his political writings, arguing that Pope John XXII and his successor Benedict XII ought to be deposed.

13.1 Property

In the first of these, the Work of Ninety Days, Ockham defended against Pope John XXII the Franciscan claim that the highest form of religious poverty is to live without property or any other right enforceable by a human court. John had argued that no one can justly consume something without owning it. Marsilius and others had answered that we can justly consume things we don't own if we have the owner's permission. It was objected that permission confers a right, and permission to consume transfers ownership. Ockham answers by means of a distinction between natural rights and legal rights.[84] In the state of innocence ownership would have been contrary to natural law because everyone had a natural right to use any thing,[85] but after the Fall natural law gave (or God gave) to human communities the right to enact human law assigning property,[86] i.e. assigning to individuals or groups the right to exclude others from using certain things.[87] This law binds morally, since we must respect agreements. Thus the institution of property morally “ties” or impedes the natural right to use things, so that in ordinary circumstances we cannot justly use another's things. However, the original natural right is not altogether abolished; on some occasions we can still exercise it. For example, if an object is unappropriated, we can use it without asserting property rights over it. In circumstances of extreme need, we can use another's property to sustain life. Even outside a situation of necessity, we can use another's property with the owner's permission, not only to preserve life but for any legitimate purpose. Permission sometimes confers a legal right, but sometimes the person giving permission, or the person accepting it, does not intend to give, or accept, any right enforceable in a human court; in such a case, if the permission is withdrawn, for good reason or not, the person who previously had permission has no legal remedy. Such permission to use property does not confer ownership or any other legal right, or any new right of any kind, but merely “unties” the natural right to use. The natural right is enough to make use, even consumption, just. The Franciscans can therefore justly use and consume things that belong to others without having any legal rights, relying on the natural right to use untied by the owner's permission.[88]

There are clear echoes of the debate between John XXII and the Franciscans in 17th century theories of property.[89]

13.2 Papal Power Limited

Soon Ockham began to write about the conflict between John and the Roman Empire, and, like Marsilius, he saw the papal claim to fullness of power as the root of many evils.[90] Unlike Marsilius, however, he did not reject the idea of papal fullness of power in every sense. Against Marsilius (whom he quotes extensively on this topic),[91] Ockham defended the traditional belief that Christ appointed Peter as head of the Church, and he held that the Pope, as Peter's successor, has supreme power in the Church. The Pope and other clergy must not become involved in secular affairs, regularly, but in exceptional circumstances, Ockham says, when no lay person is able or willing to take the lead in some matter necessary to the welfare of the Christian community, the Pope may intervene in secular matters. This is an application of Aristotle's notion of epieikeia (see §7).[92] The Pope's regular power in religious matters and occasional power to intervene in secular matters justify the traditional ascription to the Pope of fullness of power. However, this fullness of power is not omnipotence. Not only must the Pope respect the moral law and the teachings of the Church, but he must also respect rights based on human law and compact, and he must respect the Gospel liberty of Christians. A Pope who oversteps these bounds may be deposed; indeed, if his action involves heresy, he is deposed ipso facto—and according to Ockham, Popes John and Benedict were heretics.[93]

13.3 Secular Power also Limited

Besides disagreeing with Marsilius over the status of Peter and the extent of the Pope's power, Ockham rejected his thesis that a community cannot be well governed unless all coercive power is concentrated in one sovereign authority.[94] Ockham argues that, on the contrary, such concentration is dangerous and incompatible with freedom. Just as he had argued that the extreme version of the doctrine of papal fullness of power would make Christians the Pope's slaves, contrary to the gospel liberty, so he argues that the corresponding doctrine of fullness of power for the Emperor would be incompatible with the best form of government, in which subjects are free persons and not slaves. Accordingly, Ockham argues for limitations on the power of the secular ruler. He glosses the famous absolutist texts of the Roman law (see above, §6 and note 33). That the emperor is “released from the laws” (legibus solutus) is not true, because he is bound not only by natural and divine law but also by the law of nations (a branch of human positive law), according to which some are not slaves but free. “What pleases the prince has the force of law”, but only when it is something reasonable and just for the sake of the common good and when this is manifestly expressed.[95]

13.4 Rights of the Community

According to the canon “Ius civile” (Decretum, dist. 1, c.8), “Civil law is the law proper to itself that each people or city establishes, for divine and human reason”. Ockham took this as a statement of a natural right belonging to each “free” community, i.e. one not already under government, to establish its own law and its own government.[96] This right exists by natural law in the third sense (§6.1 above), i.e. “on supposition”, namely on the supposition that the community needs law and government. This is true of every community after the Fall. After the Fall natural law gave (or God gave) the human race the power to establish both property and government; God gave these powers not only to believers but also to unbelievers. A particular community exercises the power to establish government by choosing a ruler and a form of government; the ruler's power therefore comes from God, but also “from the people”, i.e. from the community. But although power comes to the ruler by the community's agreement, disagreement is not enough to remove it: the ruler has a right to the power the community has conferred as long as he exercises it properly, and he cannot normally be corrected or removed. But in exceptional circumstances, if the ruler becomes a tyrant, or if there is some other pressing reason in terms of the common good, the community can depose its ruler or change its form of government.[97] This is true also of the Church. Although Christ gave headship in the Church to Peter and his successors, each Christian community has power by Natural Law to elect its own head. The Christian community can depose a wicked pope and could perhaps even change the constitution of the Church, at least temporarily, from the papal monarchy Christ established to some other form.[98]

According to Paul, “there is no power but from God” (Rom. 13:1), and according to a gloss on the canon law, the Emperor's power is “from God alone” (dist 96, Si imperator, s.v.“divinitus”). Ockham quotes these texts, and says that although the secular ruler's power is “from the people”, yet it is also “from God alone”, and not only indirectly (i.e. from God as ultimate cause) but directly, “without intermediary”. These propositions are not obviously reconcilable. In a work apparently not circulated during the middle ages, the Breviloquium, Ockham tries to reconcile them: political power comes from God, but God confers it on the ruler selected the community; once rulership has been conferred, the ruler is subject to God alone—regularly, though on occasion a community can correct or depose its ruler.[99]

13.5 Freedom of Discussion within the Church

In part I of his Dialogus, books 3 and 4 (c. 1334) Ockham discusses heresy and heretics, arguing that for someone to be a heretic it is not enough that something that person believes is heresy, he or she must also believe it “pertinaciously”, and to discover pertinacity it is often necessary to enter into discussion to find whether the person is ready to abandon the error when it is shown to be such. For example, a layperson who believes undogmatically a doctrine that is in fact heresy, until it has been shown to be heresy in a way adapted to that person's understanding, may maintain it “a thousand times”, even in the face of contradiction by bishop or Pope, without being a heretic (1 Dialogus 4.23). On the other hand, a Pope who tries to impose a false doctrine on others is known to be pertinacious precisely from the fact that he is trying to impose false doctrine on others, and a Pope who becomes a heretic automatically ceases to be Pope. Thus ordinary Christians (or a Pope arguing as a theologian and not purporting to exercise papal authority) can argue for a heresy as long as they are open to evidence and make no attempt to impose their belief on others, whereas a Pope who tries to impose a heresy immediately ceases to be Pope and loses all authority. Christians must defend dissidents who are upholding a position that may possibly be the truth against a possibly heretical Pope, until the uncertainty is resolved by discussion. This is an argument for freedom of discussion within the Church (though not for toleration in general).[100]

14. The Conciliar Movement

In 1378 some of the cardinals who had elected Pope Urban VI met again and elected another Pope, claiming that their earlier choice had been coerced. This was the beginning of the Great Western Schism. Various possible solutions were debated. One proposal was to call a General Council of the Church to end the schism. To this it was objected that only a Pope could call a Council and that its decisions needed papal confirmation. The prominent French churchman and academic, Jean Gerson, argued that such requirements were a matter of human ecclesiastical law, which should be set aside if it impedes the reformation of the Church. The arguments of Gerson and others prevailed, and the schism was in the end healed by a Council. The Council of Constance, 1414–1418, deposed two rival Popes (by then there were three, one of whom resigned) and elected a new Pope. The Council also passed the decrees Sacrosancta (otherwise called Haec Sancta) which claimed that a Council has power over a Pope in all matters pertaining to faith and the reformation of the Church and in particular the present schism,[101] and Frequens, which required the calling of a Council every ten years.

The conciliarists were those who argued that, at least in extraordinary circumstances, a Council could be called, if necessary without papal permission, to deal with schism, with authority over even a true Pope. They included Pierre d'Ailly, John Gerson, Henry of Langenstein, John Maior, Jaques Almain, Nicholas of Cusa and others. They argued that every corporation has the power to take the measures that may be necessary if its survival is endangered by failure in its head. The Church must be able to deal with situations in which the papacy is vacant or uncertain or corrupt; otherwise its existence would be more precarious than the existence of a secular body politic, which can replace its head if necessary. The analogy between the Church and a secular body politic ran through much conciliarist thinking.

As the conciliar movement developed, some argued, more radically, that even in ordinary circumstances the judgment of a Council prevailed over that of a Pope. Later Popes (though they owed their position to Constance) opposed conciliarism, at least in its more radical form, and warned secular rulers that conciliarist ideas also threatened the power of kings—they were aware of the analogy between conciliarist views of church government and anti-monarchical views of secular government. The analogy was also noticed by some of those who wrote during the quarrel between Parliament and the King in 17th century England.[102] Despite its possible anti-monarchical implications, the notion that the Pope was subordinate to a Council remained attractive to the French monarchy, and in France conciliarism was one of the sources of Gallicanism.

There were a number of strands in conciliarist thought. One important influence was the tradition of canon law, in which it had been acknowledged that a Pope could be judged and deposed if he became a heretic or notorious sinner.[103] Ockham had likewise argued that “on occasion” anyone able to do so could rightly do whatever was necessary to preserve the Church, for example by deposing a Pope who had become a heretic or notorious sinner. An unacknowledged influence was Marsilius, who had argued that the ultimate authority in the Church was the Christian people, that Councils should be convened by the secular ruler and that a Council could not err in matters of faith.[104] Many conciliarists held that Christ's commission (Mark 16:15, “Go ye into the whole world, and preach the gospel to every creature”) was primarily to the Church as a whole, and held either that the authority of the whole Church is vested in the Pope, or in the Council when papal power is obstructed or abused, or else that the authority of the whole Church is normally vested in a Council (while a Council is in session). On either view, the Council could depose an unsatisfactory Pope, but on the second view the Council is the chief organ of Church authority even in normal circumstances. Ockham's view was that the normal constitution of the Church is monarchical (according to Ockham, Christ had appointed Peter as sole head of the Church), and a Council or indeed someone else may acquire power over a Pope, or in place of a Pope, only in exceptional circumstances.[105]

15. Francisco de Vitoria

In the sixteenth century there was a renewal of scholasticism, especially in Spain and Italy.[106] Francisco de Vitoria was a Spanish Dominican, who had studied at the University of Paris, where he was influenced by a revival of interest there taking place in the work of Thomas Aquinas. He returned to Spain and became professor of theology at Salamanca in 1526. Vitoria's lectures on the American Indians and on the law of war were given originally in 1532 and published after his death in 1557.[107]

15.1 The Indians Lately Discovered

Vitoria argues that the Indians had a right to property and independent government which the Spaniards ought to respect. The Indians are not “natural slaves”. Aristotle did not mean “that it is lawful to seize the goods and lands, and enslave and sell the persons, of those who are by nature less intelligent” (p. 251). (Vitoria may have been influenced by Duns Scotus's discussion of slavery—see note 53.) The Emperor is not lord of the whole world, and even if he were he would not be able to transfer the Indians' property to others (pp. 252–8). Likewise the Pope is not temporal lord of the world, and even in spiritual matters he has no jurisdiction over non-Christians—“For what have I to do to judge them that are without?” The right of discovery, i.e., the right to appropriate a new discovery that did not already belong to anyone, does not apply, since what the Spaniards have discovered in America did already belong to someone. The Indians cannot be dispossessed on the pretext they have not accepted the Christian faith. Even if they had rejected the faith after it had been properly preached to them (but “I hear only of provocations, savage crimes, and multitudes of unholy acts” on the part of the Spaniards, p. 271), they could still not justly be despoiled of their possessions. Their sins do not justify dispossession. Even when the Indians consent to be dispossessed, they cannot justly be dispossessed: “The barbarians do not realize what they are doing; perhaps, indeed, they do not even understand what it is the Spaniards are asking of them. Besides which, the request is made by armed men, who surround a fearful and defenceless crowd” (p. 276).

By the law of nations, the Spaniards have the right to travel among the Indians and trade with them, and Spanish visitors have the right to share in anything that the Indians treat as unappropriated or common. Also by the law of nations, the children born to Spaniards in America have the right to citizenship where they have been born (p. 281). If the Indians refuse such rights, the Spaniards should reason with them. If the Indians try to drive them away by force, it is lawful for the Spaniards to meet force with force. But “the barbarians may still be understandably fearful of men whose customs seem so strange, and who they can see are armed and much stronger... If this fear moves them to mount an attack... it would indeed be lawful for the Spaniards to defend themselves... but... they may not exercise the other rights of war” (p. 282).

15.2 Just War

Vitoria's concern about conflict in America led him to write on the justice of warfare. Following Augustine, Vitoria says that, notwithstanding such texts as Matthew 5:39, Christians may engage in war (pp. 297–8). An individual has a right of defensive war if attacked, since natural law permits a person to resist force with force, but offensive or punitive war can be waged only by a commonwealth or ruler (pp. 299–302). There must be a just cause. Just causes do not include difference of religion, the ruler's glory, or the expansion of an empire. There is only one just cause, namely a serious wrong done to citizens of the state that goes to war (or done to some other person—humanitarian intervention is permitted (p. 288)). For the purpose of correcting and deterring wrong done to his subjects, a ruler has jurisdiction over foreigners, and he may exercise this jurisdiction through warfare (p. 305). If a subject is convinced that a war is wrong, he ought not to serve in it, but people without access to good information are entitled to accept the ruler's assurance that the war is just. “There may nevertheless be arguments and proofs of the injustice of a war so powerful that even citizens and subjects of the lower class may not use ignorance as an excuse for serving as soldiers.” The intentional killing of innocent subjects of the enemy regime is never permissible (despite the Old Testament texts that approve it). Collateral damage to the innocent is permissible but must not be disproportionate (p. 315). (See the entry on the doctrine of double effect.) War must not be waged so as to ruin the people against whom it is directed. There is an obligation to see that greater evils do not arise out of the war than the war would avert. Vitoria's discussion of warfare is still worthy of attention.

16. Francisco Suárez

Another Spanish philosopher-theologian of the late scholastic period who wrote about political questions was Francisco Suárez (1548–1619).[108] In his De legibus (1612) he defended a version of Thomas Aquinas's philosophy of law.

16.1 Natural Law and Divine Commands

Is natural law, or morality, based on divine commandment? According to Gregory of Rimini (c.1300–1358) morality does not depend on God's will or intellect: “For if, to assume the impossible, the divine reason or God himself did not exist or his reason was in error, still, if someone acted against angelic or human right reason or any other (if there be any), he would sin. And if there existed absolutely no right reason, still, if someone acted against what some right reason, if it existed, would say should be done, he would sin”. Similar views were put forward by Gabriel Vasquez (c.1540–1604): “If we should concede, which is indeed impossible, that God did not judge as he does now, and if there remained in us the use of reason, sin would remain.” Suárez agrees that there are acts wrong in themselves, apart from anyone's will, but argues that a provident God must command rational creatures not to do such acts. Since we can know by natural reason that God exists and is provident, we can know by natural reason that morality is commanded by God, and as such it is Natural Law. This seems to be a “double obligation” theory of morality: some things are wrong intrinsically but are, in addition, contrary to Natural Law because they are forbidden by God.[109]

16.2 Political Power

Suárez follows Aristotle in holding that human beings are naturally social. Human life requires association in communities, first in the family, then in cities, then perhaps in kingdoms (but not in a world empire). The family is not self-sufficient, so membership in some wider community is a necessity. Every community wider than the family needs a government with political power, including power to make laws. Directive government would have been necessary even if the Fall had never occurred (cf. Thomas Aquinas, §9 above), but after the Fall government needs power to coerce those who will not voluntarily obey its laws. Since community living and government power are natural necessities, political power comes from God as the author of nature.[110]

Where is governmental power first located, in individual men or in the human race as a whole? All men are born free, and nature gives no individual political jurisdiction over another. The theory that Adam had such jurisdiction and passed it to successors by primogeniture or by his will must be rejected, since Adam's power was domestic, not political; natural law does not make the progenitor king over his posterity. Political power originates when families congregate into a city. It does not exist in aggregations of people without order or moral union, it exists when a set of people choose to unite as a community. Such a community is a sub-set of the human race; there is no need for a community comprehending the whole human race—indeed a world community would not be expedient, since it would be too difficult to govern. Even in primitive times, the human race as a whole did not form one community, except perhaps briefly; soon after creation mankind divided into particular communities. Independent, particular communities cooperate and avoid war by following the Law of Nations.[111]

In choosing to form a particular community, people thereby establish political power, since government is necessary to the ongoing existence of any community: it would be inconsistent to will to form a community but not to have a government. A community is formed by the consent of those who join it, but an additional act of will is not needed to create governmental power. Such power is therefore bestowed on the community immediately by God as the author of nature.[112] However, although they cannot choose to have no government, the members of the community do choose the form of their government (rule by one, by a few or by many, or by the community as a body); they can even choose to be ruled by someone outside their community (just as an individual can voluntarily become a slave). A king or other ruler has power not immediately from God but from the community that consents to his rule, but once the community has bestowed rulership, the ruler is the vicar of God and must be obeyed. He has acquired a right to his power and cannot be deprived, unless he lapses into tyranny; if he does, the community has a “right of war” against him.[113]

The political philosophy of Suárez has resemblances with that of earlier medieval writers, notably Ockham (§4.3 above), and also with the philosophy of Grotius, Locke, and other early modern political philosophers.

17. The Medieval Tradition of Political Philosophy

Although Political Philosophy was not part of the core curriculum in the universities, and although the writings surveyed above were generally not produced with the idea of contributing to a philosophical discipline, by the end of the middle ages the discipline of political philosophy (or political theology) had attained self-consciousness and a sense of constituting a tradition. Manuscript copies of political writings by different authors were often bound together as volumes; see Oui [1979]. There was a readership to which such works could be addressed; see Miethke [1980]. Suárez and other late scholastic writers gave an outline of the history of a problem and surveyed what others had said about it. In the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries a number of collections of political writings were published, e.g. by Dupuy, Dupin, and Goldast. Early modern writers such as Hooker, Grotius, Hobbes and Locke could easily find the works of at least some writers who had written on politics during the middle ages or would know of their ideas at least by hearsay.

If there is a theme to this history, it is perhaps the development of political liberalism. The liberal trend was helped, perhaps paradoxically, by the close interweaving of religion with other threads of medieval life. This meant not only that religion influenced all aspects of life, but also, reciprocally, that the other departments of life influenced religious thinking. The influence of the Roman Law and Aristotle, and of the culture of late antiquity familiar to the Fathers of the Church, also meant that ideas originating outside the framework of the Christian religion had an impact on religious thinking. The duality between kingship and priesthood (perhaps originally due merely to the fact that Christians had no political power), and the conflicts that resulted from that duality, meant that religious thinking had to accommodate the concerns of powerful people who were not officials in the religious institutions.

From the time of Constantine, and in the west especially from the time of Augustine, Christians practiced the coercion of heretics and the repression of unbelief. However, their regime was never completely repressive. Among medieval political philosopher-theologians there was always some acknowledgement of the rights of unbelievers (e.g., of the rights of Jewish parents, the Church's lack of jurisdiction over “those without”, the property rights of unbelievers). There was a recognition of the duty to reason and persuade (“A man cannot believe unless he is willing”). In social relations there was a belief in an underlying liberty and equality, and a belief that originally government and slavery did not exist, an idea that government, law, and property arose by “pact” or custom, and an idea that originally government belonged to “the people” and was entrusted to rulers by the consent of the people. These beliefs were akin to the modern liberal presumption in favour of personal liberty. There was a belief in the “rule of law”, in a distinction between good government and tyranny, in “natural rights”. There was a belief in limited government (see Ockham in §13.3) and in a distinction (not yet a separation) between Church and State. Concerning the constitution of the Church a strong claim for unfettered papal power was made by some Popes and their supporters, but this was strongly resisted by writers who argued that a heretic or sinful Pope, including one who violated the rights of the laity and of unbelievers, could be deposed. Something like freedom of speech was embodied in the practice of disputation. Ockham explicitly advocated free discussion of disagreements among Christians. Where all this still fell short of political liberalism was the absence of any argument for equal freedom of all religions. Locke, Bayle and others in the seventeenth century advocated toleration, though not for Catholics, since Catholics themselves rejected equal freedom of religion and were dangerous to others.

The arguments of medieval political philosophers are only partly available in modern political philosophy. Non-believers cannot make much use of arguments with theological premises. But even for us, there is perhaps some value in the reminder that, under some circumstances, a religious tradition is capable of developing—not only in response to external pressure but even out of its own resources—in the direction of peace and cooperation between members of the two cities.

Bibliography

Editions of Latin Texts

See below, Augustine [1955], Bonaventure [1882], Dyson [1999a], [1999b], Giles of Rome [1961], [1968], Gratian [1879], John of Paris [1969], Marsilius of Padua [1928], [1932–33], [1979], William of Ockham [1974], [1995b].

Translations of Latin Texts

See below, Augustine [1998], [2001], Dyson [1999a], [1999b], Giles of Rome [1986], James of Viterbo [1995], John of Paris [1971], [1974], Jonas of Orleans, Marsilius of Padua [1980], [1993], Ptolemy of Luca [1997], Suárez [1944], Thomas Aquinas [1978], [2002], Vitoria [1991], William of Ockham [1992], [1995a], [1995b], [1998], [2001].

More or Less Comprehensive Histories

See below, Burns [1988], Canning [1996], Carlyle [1930], Coleman [2000], Gierke [1951], Lagarde [1956–70], Miethke, [2000a], Skinner [1978], Tierney [1982].

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Aquinas, Saint Thomas: moral, political, and legal philosophy | Aristotle, General Topics: political theory | Augustine, Saint | ethics: natural law tradition | Giles of Rome | Grotius, Hugo | John of Salisbury | medieval philosophy | medieval philosophy: literary forms of | Ockham [Occam], William | Wyclif, John: political Philosophy

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