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Qualia inversion thought experiments are ubiquitous in contemporary philosophy of mind (largely due to the influence of Shoemaker 1982 and Block 1990). The most popular kind is one or another variant of Locke's hypothetical case of “spectrum inversion”, in which strawberries and ripe tomatoes produce visual experiences of the sort that are actually produced by grass and cucumbers, grass and cucumbers produce experiences of the sort that are actually produced by strawberries and ripe tomatoes, and so on. This entry surveys the main philosophical applications of what Dennett has called “one of philosophy's most virulent memes” (1991, 389).
Section 1 explains what “qualia” are supposed to be. Section 2 describes the many different sorts of “inverted qualia” (specifically, “inverted spectrum”) thought experiments, including a close cousin that does not involve inversion. Section 3 discusses the major philosophical arguments that appeal to spectrum inversion.
This article is long and goes into intricate details that some readers will wish to ignore. Those wanting a shorter introduction should read section 1 (skipping subsection 1.1), section 2 (subsections 2.1, 2.2, 2.3), and subsection 3.1. Those new to the topic should first read the entry on qualia.
- 1. Qualia
- 2. Inverted qualia scenarios
- 3. Spectrum Inversion in an Argument…
- 3.1 …Against Behaviorism, Functionalism, and Physicalism
- 3.2 …Against Representationalism
- 3.3 …For Appearance Properties
- 3.4 …For Modes of Presentation
- 3.5 …For Relativism
- 3.6 …For Skepticism About Others' Minds
- 3.7 …For the Explanatory Gap
- 3.8 …For the Ineffability of Qualia
- 3.9 ...For the Inconsistency of Content-Externalism, Representationalism, and Qualia-Internalism
- 3.10 Summary: Required Features of Inverted Spectrum Scenarios
- Other Internet Resources
- Related entries
Qualia (singular ‘quale’), in a common modern usage, are properties of experiences that type them in phenomenological respects. Imagine seeing three colored patches against a neutral background in good light, one after the other. In particular, imagine seeing a vermilion patch, then a crimson patch, and finally a turquoise patch. (Those with poor imaginations may consult Figure 1.)
Figure 1: vermilion, crimson, and turquoise patches
Three experiences of the imagined sort differ in their phenomenology, or in “what it's like” to undergo them. What it's like to see the crimson patch is not the same as what it's like to see the turquoise patch, for example. Further — assuming you have normal color vision — seeing the crimson patch is more similar, in phenomenological respects, to seeing the vermilion patch than it is to seeing the turquoise patch.
Thus your experience of the crimson patch has a quale (call it ‘QC’) that your experiences of the vermilion and turquoise patches lack. Your experience of the vermilion patch has a quale (QV) that your experiences of the crimson and turquoise patches lack; likewise, your experience of the turquoise patch has quale QT. What about an experience of all three patches, as when viewing the whole of figure 1? Which of QC, QV, and QT does that have? The answer usually implicit in the literature is ‘All three’ (as opposed to ‘None’). This is probably the more natural way of understanding qualia terminology, given the explanation so far, and is the one adopted in this article.
In addition to the quale QC, your experience of the crimson patch has quale QR which it shares with your experiences of the vermilion patch, blood, fire trucks, strawberries, ripe tomatoes, and so on. Your experience of the turquoise patch (in isolation) lacks QR.
It must be emphasized that ‘QC’, for example, is not explicitly defined using color terminology. ‘QC’ is not stipulated to be an abbreviation of ‘the property of being an experience of something's looking crimson’, for instance. Rather, the role of descriptions like the latter is simply to draw attention to the salient property that ‘QC’ is supposed to be a name for, in much the same way that one might introduce the unfamiliar name ‘Eugene Cernan’ by saying that it refers to the last man to walk on the moon. In the jargon, the description ‘the property of being an experience of something's looking crimson’ can be used to fix the reference of ‘QC’. (See the entry on reference.)
Qualia terminology can be introduced in a similar manner for other sorts of visual experiences (seeing differently shaped patches, for instance), for other perceptual modalities, for bodily sensations, and for thoughts, imagery, emotions, and so forth. It is controversial whether some of these mental events/states have qualia — in particular, episodes of conscious thought, at least some of which seem devoid of phenomenology.
One might wonder why some special terminology is required. Admittedly ‘QR’, for example, is not defined in terms of ‘red’, but isn't QR in fact the property of being an experience of something's looking red? And if it is, why introduce another name? However, as discussed later (subsection 3.2), there is an argument against this identification.
‘Qualia’ is an especially confusing piece of terminology, even by the standards of the profession that brought us ‘realism’. In the sense just explained, the claim that experiences have qualia seems fairly harmless. The innocent student might well be puzzled, then, to learn of Frank Jackson's controversial “knowledge argument for qualia” (Jackson 1982), and Dennett's attempt to dismiss qualia as a philosopher's invention (Dennett 1988). But on closer examination, much of this apparent disagreement is merely terminological. On Jackson's use of the term, qualia are properties of mental states “which no amount of purely physical information includes” (1982, 273); on Dennett's, they are “ineffable”, “intrinsic”, “private”, and “directly or immediately apprehensible in consciousness” (1988, 229; cf. Tye 2002, 447). And none of this is part of the official explanation of ‘qualia’ in the previous section.
Another use of ‘qualia’ that is particularly important to distinguish from the present one is Dretske's. According to Dretske, qualia include colors — properties of objects like tomatoes, not experiences. This is because he explains qualia as “the ways objects phenomenally appear or seem” (1995, 73), and red is one way that tomatoes appear. Qualia, on Dretske's use, are properties of objects of experiences; in this article qualia are properties of experiences.
The American pragmatist C. I. Lewis introduced ‘qualia’ into contemporary philosophy. Qualia, he explains in Mind and the World Order, are “recognizable qualitative characters of the given” (1929, 121). According to Lewis, what is “given” in experience are sense-data (although Lewis himself preferred other terminology: see 55-7), not objects like tomatoes. Goodman's well-known discussion of qualia in The Structure of Appearance (1951) follows Lewis's use. Among Jackson, Dennett, and Dretske, Dretske's use of ‘qualia’ is the closest to Lewis's. Restricting attention to the case of veridical perception, we may think of Dretske as basically agreeing with Lewis about the characterization of qualia, but disagreeing with Lewis about the given. When one sees that a tomato is red, according to Lewis a sense-datum, not the tomato, is given; according to Dretske what is given is the tomato. So, since a “recognizable qualitative character” of the tomato is its color, Dretske thinks that colors are examples of qualia.
Let us say that a scenario is a (more-or-less detailed) story, which may be possible or impossible. (So, for example, there is a scenario in which someone squares the circle.) Corresponding to a scenario is what we can call a hypothesis: that the scenario is possible. So, for example, the hypothesis corresponding to a circle-squaring scenario is false. There are a variety of “inverted qualia” scenarios in the literature — almost always involving color perception — whose corresponding hypotheses differ in plausibility. These hypotheses are used as premises in a number of philosophical arguments, discussed in section 3 below.
Consider the hue circle in figure 2, taken from the Natural Color System color space, which is organized around the four hues red, green, blue, and yellow. These are the unique hues: they have shades that are not perceptual mixtures of any other hue. For example, there is a shade of green that is neither bluish nor yellowish. The other hues are binary: all of their shades are perceptual mixtures of two unique hues. For example, every shade of purple is bluish and reddish. The four unique hues — yellow, red, blue, green — come in two opponent pairs: red-green and blue-yellow. Red is opposed to green in the sense that there are no reddish-greens or greenish-reds; likewise there are no bluish-yellows or yellowish-blues. The unique hues are equally spaced around the NCS circle, and the other hues are spaced according to their perceptible proportion of the unique hues. So, for example, the orange patch equidistant from the unique yellow pole and unique red pole is equally similar to both.
Figure 2: NCS hue circle
Let I be the function that takes each shade to its opposing shade, thus rotating the hue circle 180°. I maps reds to greens, blues to yellows, bluish-greens to yellowish-reds, and so on (see figure 3).
Figure 3: the function I
Introduce another perceiver, Invert (you are Nonvert). Imagine you are looking at scene S: an arrangement of some fruits (see the left-hand part of figure 4). Now take the apparent hues of objects in S, and transform them using the function I. Use this transformation to create a new scene SI, exactly like the old scene S except that it looks to have differently colored “inverted” fruits (etc.). That is, if a banana originally looks to have hue h, in SI it looks to have hue I(h). (See the right-hand part of figure 4; notice that the greens in S are rather yellowish, and hence get mapped to bluish-reds.) Then one simple inverted qualia scenario is this: what it's like for Invert to look at S is exactly the same as what it's like for Nonvert (i.e., you) to look at SI, and similarly for all other scenes that Invert encounters. According to this scenario, if you look at the right-hand part of figure 4, your experience is phenomenologically the same as Invert's experience when she looks at the left-hand part of figure 4. In qualia terminology: if an object O1 looks to have hue h to Nonvert (with Q being the corresponding quale of her experience), and O2 looks to have hue I(h) (with corresponding quale Q*), then Invert's experience of O1 has quale Q* and her experience of O2 has quale Q. In this sense Invert's qualia are ‘inverted’ with respect to Nonvert's.
Figure 4: 180° hue inversion
Because the example concerns color qualia, this sort of inverted qualia scenario is usually described as a case of “spectrum inversion”. (Note that the 180° inversion takes unique hues to unique hues, and binary hues to binary hues. An inversion scenario produced by a rotation of 45° would take the unique hue red to the binary hue orange; and so presumably would be behaviorally detectable: see subsection 2.3.1 below.)
Philosophy is stuck with the terminology of ‘spectrum inversion’, but it is potentially misleading. First, a spectrum inversion scenario sounds like one which inverts either the spectrum or the colors of objects, but it actually inverts neither. In a typical spectrum inversion scenario, the spectral band 650-700nm remains red, and lemons remain yellow.
Second, even when properly taken as an inversion of experiences, one might suppose that the “spectrum inversion” function corresponds to flipping the spectrum over. That is, using the traditional names for the spectral bands, one might suppose the function maps red to violet, orange to indigo, yellow to blue, green to green, blue to yellow, indigo to orange, and violet to red. However, this is not the usual sort of inversion scenario (red is not mapped to green, for example). Further, this function is not defined for all hues. Many hues — in particular, a large range of “extra-spectral” purples — are not found in the spectrum.
Locke appears to have been the first to formulate explicitly an inverted spectrum scenario. In the chapter of the Essay titled Of True and False Ideas, he writes:
Neither would it carry any Imputation of Falshood to our simple Ideas, if by the different Structure of our Organs, it were so ordered, That the same Object should produce in several Men's Minds different Ideas at the same time; v.g. if the Idea, that a Violet produced in one Man's Mind by his Eyes, were the same that a Marigold produces in another Man's, and vice versâ. For since this could never be known: because one Man's Mind could not pass into another Man's Body, to perceive, what Appearances were produced by those Organs; neither the Ideas hereby, nor the Names, would be at all confounded, or any Falshood be in either. For all Things, that had the Texture of a Violet, producing constantly the Idea, which he called Blue, and those which had the Texture of a Marigold, producing constantly the Idea, which he as constantly called Yellow, whatever those Appearances were in his Mind; he would be able as regularly to distinguish Things for his Use by those Appearances, and understand, and signify those distinctions, marked by the Names Blue and Yellow, as if the Appearances, or Ideas in his Mind, received from those two Flowers, were exactly the same, with the Ideas in other Men's Minds. (1689/1975, II, xxxii, 15)
Locke's description of this inverted spectrum scenario is laden with his own commitment to “Ideas”, which (on one interpretation) are sense-data, some of which possess both color and shape. On this view, spectrum inversion is a case of “sense-datum inversion”: when Invert looks at a violet she becomes acquainted with the kind of sense-datum Nonvert is acquainted with when he looks at a marigold. Setting this tendentious theoretical gloss aside, Locke's scenario has three notable features. First, it is a case of spectrum inversion from birth. Second, it is a case of inversion within the same linguistic community. Third, it is (or is naturally read as being) a case in which Invert and Nonvert are behaviorally alike — a behaviorally undetectable spectrum inversion.
Locke does not fill in the details of his scenario, so it is left unclear whether, for example, the leaves of marigolds and violets would produce “Red Ideas” in the mind of the inverted subject. But suppose, reasonably enough, that Locke's scenario involved a rotation of the hue circle. Locke evidently thought that the hypothesis corresponding to his scenario was true: that his scenario is possible. Was he right?
If we assume that Invert is otherwise like a normal human perceiver, then a major asymmetry in color space shows that Locke was incorrect. Hue (red, green, bluish-red, etc.) is not the only perceptually salient dimension along which colors can vary: there are (usually taken to be) two other dimensions, saturation and lightness. A color is saturated to the extent to which its hue is intense or vivid: pastels are desaturated, and achromatic colors (blacks, whites, and grays) have no saturation. Colors become lighter as they become less grayish or blackened. Arranging the colors along these three dimensions produces a color solid, an example of which is shown in figure 5:
Figure 5: 3D color space: the Munsell color solid
The lightness dimension corresponds to the central vertical axis, with white at the top. The hue and saturation dimensions correspond, respectively, to the angle around the vertical axis, and to the distance from it. Thus the shades of maximum saturation are on the outside of the solid. Notice that the yellows have their maximum saturation at higher levels of lightness than the reds and the blues. So, assuming that Invert's judgments of the relations between colors are — modulo the inversion — normal, a possible Lockean 180° hue rotation scenario would be behaviorally detectable. Invert would judge the maximally saturated colors she calls ‘shades of blue’ to be lighter than the maximally saturated colors she calls ‘shades of yellow’. Further, there are more distinguishable hue steps between blue and red than there are between yellow and green — a fact that is reflected in the Munsell space, whose hue circle has five hues equally spaced: red, yellow, green, blue, purple. (Contrast the NCS space mentioned in the previous subsection.) Hence the Lockean inversion function I, assuming it is defined on all hues, would map some distinct hues (in particular, some bluish reds) to the same hue (in particular, the same yellowish green). The range of I would therefore contain fewer hues than its domain. Invert would not be able to distinguish some stimuli (those she calls ‘bluish red’) that Nonvert could tell apart, and so again the inversion would be behaviorally detectable.
As discussed in section 3 below, inverted spectrum scenarios have a wide range of philosophical uses, and come in a correspondingly wide range of flavors. It is not always required, for example, that Invert and Nonvert are behaviorally alike. But suppose that a behaviorally undetectable scenario is needed, and moreover one that is genuinely possible. With the assumption that Invert is otherwise normal, we just saw that Locke's behaviorally undetectable scenario is not possible. Without relaxing the simple assumption about Invert, can we find one that is?
Suppose we stay with the full range of normal human color experience, and so with the color solid as illustrated in figure 5. The discussion of Locke's scenario shows that a scenario corresponding to a rotation of the color solid around the lightness axis should be avoided. However, as Palmer points out (1999a, 926), there are three inversion scenarios that at least solve the problem posed by the light and saturated yellows. These three scenarios correspond to, respectively, a reversal of the red-green axis; a reversal of the blue-yellow and black-white axes; and the previous two reversals taken together: a reversal of the red-green, blue-yellow, and black-white axes. These three scenarios are (approximately) illustrated in Figure 6 below.
Figure 6: three inversions: red-green (top right); blue-yellow/black-white (bottom left); red-green/blue-yellow/black-white (bottom right)
As noted in the previous subsection, there are more perceptually distinguishable shades between red and blue than there are between green and yellow, which would make red-green inversion behaviorally detectable. And there are yet further asymmetries. Dark yellow is brown (qualitatively different from yellow), whereas dark blue is blue (see figure 6). Similarly, desaturated bluish-red is pink (qualitatively different from saturated bluish-red), whereas desaturated greenish-yellow is similar to saturated greenish-yellow. Again, red is a “warm” color, whereas blue is “cool” — and perhaps this is not a matter of learned associations with temperature (see Hardin 1997, 297-7). In any event, there is clearly scope to resist the claim that one of Palmer's three inversions would be behaviorally undetectable.
Faced with these difficulties, philosophers seeking a clearly possible behaviorally undetectable inversion scenario have either considered a perceiver with limited color vision (for instance black-white vision), or else a perceiver with alien/quasi color vision, where any alien/quasi color space that represents perceptible similarities and differences is stipulated to have appropriate symmetries. Here is Shoemaker trying the first strategy:
But even if our color experience is not in fact such that a mapping of this [behaviorally undetectable] sort is possible, it seems to me conceivable that it might have been — and that is what matters for our present philosophical purposes. For example, I think we know well enough what it would be like to see the world nonchromatically, i.e., in black, white, and the various shades of grey — for we frequently do see it in this way in photographs, moving pictures, and television. And there is an obvious mapping of the nonchromatic shades onto each other which satisfies the conditions for inversion. In the discussion that follows I shall assume, for convenience, that such a mapping is possible for the full range of colors — but I do not think that anything essential turns on whether this assumption is correct. (Shoemaker 1975a, 196; note omitted).
For some responses, see Tye 1995, 205, and Hilbert and Kalderon 2000, 206. “Black-white” inversion is also discussed by Clark (1996) (Other Internet Resources), Myin (2001) and Broackes (2007), and was briefly mentioned by Wittgenstein (1977, III-84). For a short autobiography of a complete achromat (someone with only black-white rod vision) who is also a vision scientist, see Nordby 1996 (Other Internet Resources).
Here is Block trying the second strategy:
[D]o the empirical issues really matter for the challenge that the possibility of an inverted spectrum poses for functionalism? My answer is: only in a subtle and indirect way. For if there could be creatures who have color experience or at least visual experience for whom the relevant empirical points do not apply, then functionalism is refuted even if human spectra cannot be inverted. For example, perhaps it is a consequence of the human genome that humans tend to be unwilling to give a name to light green, even though they are willing to give a name to light red (‘pink’). Still, there could be people whose visual experience is similar if not identical to ours who find it equally natural to give names to light green as to light red. (Perhaps we could even genetically engineer humans to become so willing.) (Block 1999, 946; cf. Shoemaker 1982, 336-8, and Levine 1991, 34-6.)
For some doubts about the second strategy, see Hardin 1997, 299-300.
Hilbert and Kalderon argue that “every possible quality space must be asymmetrical” (2000, 204) (that is, must lack any symmetries); if so, both strategies are misguided (see also Dennett 1991, 389-98; 1993, 927; 1994).
If a behaviorally undetectable spectrum inversion scenario is possible, how do we know it does not actually obtain? There is a temptation to say that we do not know — moreover, that we cannot know. (For more discussion, see subsection 3.6 below.) And if we cannot verify or falsify the claim that such a scenario does not obtain, then according to the verificationist theory of meaning held by the logical positivists (Ayer 1959) the scenario is meaningless. Indeed, the logical positivists sometimes gave spectrum inversion as an example of an unverifiable claim (Schlick 1932/3, 93, quoted in Shoemaker 1982, 339; see also Ayer 1936, 173-4, and Wittgenstein 1958, §272).
The allegedly meaningless scenario is a case of interpersonal (or intersubjective) spectrum inversion: Invert is spectrally inverted with respect to another person, Nonvert. But there is another sort of inversion scenario, in which a single person's qualia are inverted with respect to her qualia at an earlier time. As Shoemaker notes (1982, 327), a case of intrapersonal (or intrasubjective) spectrum inversion appears to have been first discussed by Wittgenstein:
Consider this case: someone says ‘I can't understand it, I see everything red blue today and vice versa.’ We answer ‘it must look queer!’ He says it does and, e.g., goes on to say how cold the glowing coal looks and how warm the clear (blue) sky. I think we should under these or similar circumstances be inclined to say that he saw red what we saw blue. And again we should say that we know that he means by the words ‘blue’ and ‘red’ what we do as he has always used them as we do. (Wittgenstein 1968, 284; quoted in Shoemaker 1982, 327-8)
Although Wittgenstein seems to have thought that a behaviorally undetectable interpersonal spectrum inversion scenario is not possible (arguably for verificationist reasons), Shoemaker claims that once the possibility of a Wittgensteinian intrapersonal inversion is granted, there is an inexorable slide to the possibility of a behaviorally undetectable interpersonal scenario:
…if the color experience of a person can differ from that of others at some point during his career, it should be possible for such a difference to exist throughout a person's career. But if this a possibility, then it does seem perfectly coherent to suppose, and perfectly compatible with all the behavioral evidence we have about the experiences of others, that, in Wittgenstein's words, “one section of mankind has one sensation of red and another section another.” (Shoemaker 1982, 329)
We can think of this sort of argument as proceeding in four steps (see Block 1990, Shoemaker 1996b):
Step 1: this is possible: an “overnight” intrapersonal inversion, as in the quotation from Wittgenstein.
Step 2: if (Step 1), then this is possible: an “overnight” inversion followed by semantic adaptation (applying ‘red’ to glowing coal, ‘blue’ to the sky, etc.), but with memory of one's experiences before the inversion. That is, one (re)learns to use color terminology like a normal person, while remembering that one's experiences of glowing coal (etc.) used to be very different. The inversion remains detectable, because one asserts, for example, that one's experiences have drastically changed.
Step 3: if (Step 2), then this is possible: an “overnight” inversion followed by semantic adaptation, followed by amnesia about one's past experiences, with the result that one's pre- and post- inversion behavioral dispositions are the same. At this step, one's behavior is just as it would have been if one had simply been stricken with amnesia, with no prior inversion.
Step 4: if (Step 3), then this is possible: a “from birth” behaviorally undetectable interpersonal inversion scenario.
Similar arguments starting from a Wittgensteinian intrapersonal scenario can be given for the other kinds of interpersonal inversion hypotheses discussed in section 3 below.
One might think that at least step 4 is unproblematic. However, according to the “Frege-Schlick view” (Shoemaker 1982, 339), interpersonal comparisons of qualia (unlike intrapersonal comparisons) do not make sense. The Frege-Schlick view could be supported on verificationist grounds; for a more interesting line of defense, see Stalnaker 1999, 2006, and Shoemaker 2006b and Block 2007, 103-7, for discussion. Since it makes perfect sense (and indeed is often true) to say that tomatoes look red to most people, a proponent of the Frege-Schlick view must deny, for example, that QR is the property of being an experience of something's looking red (see section 1 above and Stalnaker 1999, 225).
Asymmetries in color space pose problems for step 3 of the previous argument. But — especially for those with verificationist sympathies — step 3 is problematic even if these concerns are waived. Why be so sure that the “total adaptation” (semantic adaptation plus amnesia) doesn't reinvert the qualia? After all, if you imagine being the subject yourself, after the period of amnesia you have no sense that anything is amiss — so perhaps nothing is. Similar doubts can be raised about step 2: suppose you use color terminology exactly as you did before the step 1 inversion — that is, spontaneously on the basis of how things look — but you seem to recall that your past experiences were radically different. Would you be confident that you hadn't misremembered your past experiences? (See Dennett 1988; 1991, Ch. 12; 1993; 1994; and Rey 1992.)
Although Block thinks “that these criticisms can be defeated on their own terms” (1990, 61), his “Inverted Earth” scenario is designed to sidestep them. (See Block 1990, 1996a, 2003.) Instead of considering an “overnight” inversion and the consequent confusion, semantic adaptation and amnesia, your eyes are fitted with “color inverting lenses” and you are transported to another planet — Inverted Earth. This is a place just like Earth except that each object has “the complementary color of [its counterpart] on Earth. The sky is yellow, grass is red, fire hydrants are green, etc.” (1990, 60). The inhabitants also speak Color Inverted English (‘red’ means green, ‘blue’ means yellow, etc.). The right hand part of figure 4 above displays a photograph of fruits taken on Inverted Earth with an ordinary Earthly camera. (Despite the yellow sky, the illumination on Inverted Earth is the same as it is on Earth. Note that achromatic colors are not inverted — on Inverted Earth snow is white and coal is black.) Because of the inverting lenses — and ignoring complications such as those mentioned in subsection 2.3.1 — when you arrive on Inverted Earth you notice no visible change. Your experience when you look at an arrangement of fruits on Inverted Earth is phenomenologically the same as your previous experience of the counterpart arrangement on Earth (see the left hand part of figure 4), and conversation with the locals proceeds just as smoothly as it did back on Earth. This scenario is therefore the converse of typical inverted spectrum scenarios: instead of keeping the environment fixed and varying the internal constitution of the subject, Inverted Earth varies the environment and (due to the inverting lenses) keeps the subject's internal constitution fixed. Block uses Inverted Earth in an argument against functionalism and representationalism (see subsections 3.1 and 3.2 below).
The qualia inversion scenarios discussed so far are merely hypothetical — more cautiously, we do not know whether any of them obtain. There are, however, “shifted” qualia scenarios that actually obtain. And, in fact, many of the philosophical arguments that appeal to the possibility of an inversion scenario can make do instead by appealing to the actual shifted qualia scenario, hence avoiding potentially controversial claims about possibility.
The shifted qualia scenario that is usually discussed concerns — unsurprisingly — color vision. There is a substantial amount of variation between people classified as having “normal” color vision by standard tests, due to differences in the lens of the eye and photoreceptor pigments, among other factors. In one experiment, introduced into the philosophical literature by Hardin (1993, 79-80), Hurvich et al. (1968) found that the apparent location of unique green for spectral lights among 50 subjects varied from 490 to 520nm. This is a large range: 15nm either side of unique green looks distinctly bluish or yellowish. For example, when Smith looks at the third patch in figure 7 (in isolation), his experience might have the quale that Jones's experience has when she looks at the fourth patch in Figure 7, keeping the viewing circumstances fixed. And when Smith looks at the fourth patch, his experience might have the quale that Jones's experience has when she looks at the fifth patch. Thus — at least over a small range of hues — Jones's and Smith's color qualia are “shifted” with respect to each other. Accordingly, this sort of scenario can be described as a case of “shifted spectra” (Block 1999). (NB: here we are assuming that the Frege-Schlick view mentioned in subsection 2.3.2 is incorrect.)
Figure 7: five patches: yellowish-green to bluish-green
Notice that if a behaviorally undetectable scenario is wanted, an actual case of shifted spectra will not fit the bill.
Inversion scenarios — in particular, spectrum inversion — turn up in a wide range of philosophical arguments, which we are now in a position to examine.
Behaviorism in the philosophy of mind is the view that the mental is nothing over and above behavior (including dispositions to behave). Any version of behaviorism implies that the mental supervenes on behavior. That is: necessarily, two creatures who are behaviorally alike are also mentally alike. Likewise, any version of functionalism or physicalism implies that the mental supervenes on, respectively, functional organization and physical makeup. For the purposes of this subsection, it is not necessary to get into the details of these theories. However, two points should be noted. First, it should not be assumed that either behavior, functional organization, or physical makeup is an intrinsic matter — the relevant sorts of behavioral, functional, and physical properties may be extrinsic. In other words, perfect duplicates may differ in behavioral, functional, or physical respects. Second, as these theories are usually understood, difference in behavioral respects implies difference in functional respects, which in turn implies difference in physical respects; none of the converse implications holds. So the three supervenience theses just mentioned are related as follows: the behaviorist supervenience thesis implies the functionalist thesis, which in turn implies the physicalist thesis.
If some behaviorally undetectable inverted spectrum hypothesis is correct, then there could be a pair of creatures who are behaviorally alike but mentally different: Invert and Nonvert are in different mental states when they each look at a tomato, and are behaviorally alike. Hence, if the inverted spectrum hypothesis is correct, behaviorism is false. This gives us an argument against behaviorism:
P1a. The following spectrum inversion scenario is possible: Invert and Nonvert are behaviorally alike, and are both looking at a tomato.
Since P1a implies that the mental does not supervene on behavior:
Ca. Behaviorism is false.
Since behaviorism is not a popular position these days, this application of an inverted qualia scenario is perhaps not so interesting. And given the complications discussed in subsection 2.3.1, there is even room for a behaviorist to resist. However, of considerably more interest are similar arguments against functionalism (and physicalism). Block and Fodor (1972), who invented the terminology of ‘inverted qualia’, were the first to formulate an inverted spectrum argument against functionalism, specifically Turing machine functionalism as defended in Putnam 1967. Ignoring the details of particular functionalisms, the argument is exactly parallel to the one against behaviorism. (Similar remarks go for the inverted spectrum argument against physicalism.) According to functionalism, mental states are functional states: states defined by their causal role with respect to inputs, outputs, and other states. So, according to functionalism, necessarily, two creatures who are functionally alike are also mentally alike. In order to complete the argument, an appropriate inverted spectrum hypothesis must be established, where Invert and Nonvert are functional duplicates.
The anti-functionalist analogue of argument Aa is:
P1b. The following spectrum inversion scenario is possible: Invert and Nonvert are functionally alike, and are both looking at a tomato.
Since P1b implies that the mental does not supervene on functional organization:
Cb. Functionalism is false.
The possibility of a behaviorally undetectable inversion scenario (P1a) can be motivated by appeal to the sorts of considerations discussed in 2.3.1 above. However, in order to refute functionalism a stronger inversion hypothesis (P1b) is needed. As Block and Fodor point out, functionalism allows us to deny that “two organisms are in the same psychological state whenever their behaviors and/or behavioral dispositions are identical” (1972, 86), hence avoiding the stock objections to behaviorism. The functionalist, then, has no problem with behaviorally undetectable inversions. But why should she concede the possibility of a functionally undetectable inversion? The question can be made more pointed by observing that (a) no one has ever articulated a detailed functionalist theory of any mental state, and (b) any realistic version of such a theory would be extremely complicated. In favor of the possibility of a functionally undetectable inversion, Block and Fodor offer its “conceptual coherence”:
It seems to us that the standard verificationist counterarguments against the view that the ‘inverted spectrum’ [scenario] is conceptually coherent are not persuasive. If this is correct, it looks as though the possibility of qualia inversion poses a serious prima facie argument against functionalist accounts of the criteria for type identity of psychological states. (91)
Block and Fodor's apparent move from the “conceptual coherence” of the inversion scenario to its possibility can be questioned. Even though one cannot know a priori that not-p (that is, p is conceptually coherent), p may yet be impossible. For example, one cannot know a priori that gold does not have the atomic number 79, but it is a necessary truth that gold has this atomic number. (This sort of separation between conceptual coherence and possibility is not uncontroversial, but is commonly accepted.)
In any case, there are other conceptually coherent scenarios that are considerably more straightforward than an inverted spectrum scenario, for example a scenario containing a conscious subject and a functional duplicate who is not conscious at all (a “zombie”, in the philosophical sense). So if the move from conceptual coherence to possibility is in fact legitimate, functionalism may be refuted by a simpler argument that does not have an inversion hypothesis as a premise. (Shoemaker is a notable dissenter on this point; he holds that while inverted spectrum scenarios are conceptually coherent, zombie scenarios are not. See Shoemaker 1975a, 1981, 1991.)
A defender of the utility of an inversion scenario in an argument against functionalism might reply that the scenario's possibility does not merely rest on its conceptual coherence. In addition — this reply continues — there is a positive “Cartesian intuition” that such an inversion scenario is possible (a “clear and distinct idea” of the scenario, perhaps), and this is prima facie evidence that it is possible.
However, Cartesian intuition, just like conceptual coherence, is not a very discriminating weapon, tending to spread possibility over a wide landscape (cf. Tye 2003, section 4). Cartesian intuition also tends to certify the possibility of scenarios containing zombies, thinking rocks, entirely disembodied minds (not even embodied in ectoplasm), and so forth — all impossibilities, according to the functionalist. So, as with conceptual coherence, any inverted spectrum argument against functionalism that relies on Cartesian intuitions can be converted into an equally plausible and simpler argument that makes no mention of the inverted spectrum.
There is one other defense of the utility of inversion scenarios in anti-functionalist arguments, namely that some of them are biologically possible — and hence not as far fetched as scenarios containing zombies or thinking rocks. If this is right, then spectrum inversion would be of special significance, since we have a firmer grip on possibilities that are closer to home.
Here is it is helpful to examine Block's Inverted Earth argument against functionalism, which at a superficial glance might not seem to stray beyond the constraints of Earthly biology. As we saw in subsection 2.3.3, the Inverted Earth scenario is designed to avoid certain objections to the usual argument from intrapersonal inversion hypotheses to interpersonal inversion hypotheses. How is the scenario turned into an argument against functionalism?
The brand of functionalism (about qualia) that Block sets out to refute is this:
An experience has [QR] if [and only if] it functions in the right way — if it is caused by red things in the right circumstances, and used in thought about red things and action with respect to red things rightly. The functional roles I am talking about are what I call ‘long-arm’ roles, roles that include real things in the world as the inputs and outputs. They are to be distinguished from the ‘short-arm’ roles that functionalists sometimes prefer, roles that stop at the skin. (1990, 58, note omitted)
Block then tries to establish that after a suitable period of time on Inverted Earth, your beliefs and judgments about the colors of things would be correct: like the locals, you would believe that fire hydrants are green, the sky is yellow, and so on:
[A]ccording to me, after enough time has passed on Inverted Earth, your embedding in the physical and linguistic environment of Inverted Earth would dominate, and so your intentional contents would shift so as to be the same as those of the natives. Consider an analogy (supplied by Martin Davies): if you had a Margaret Thatcher recognitional capacity before your journey to Inverted Earth, and on arriving misidentify twin MT as MT, you are mistaken. But eventually your ‘That's MT’ judgements get to be about twin MT, and so become right after having started out wrong. If you were [transported] at age 15, by the time 50 years have passed, you use ‘red’ to mean green, just as the natives do. (64)
(We can also add that you know that you are on Inverted Earth, and make an effort to speak the local language; see Block 1996a, 42; 2003.)
This step of the argument appeals to externalism about mental content (Putnam 1975, Burge 1979), specifically some sort of causal covariational theory (see the entry externalism about mental content). Putting the basic idea crudely: after a while on Inverted Earth certain of your inner states that on Earth were reliably caused by the presence of red things and thereby represented redness will instead be reliably caused by the presence of green things, and thereby will come to represent greenness.
This gives us an apparent counterexample against the “long arm” functionalist theory. On Inverted Earth your experiences have the functional role that the functionalist theory says is necessary and sufficient for possessing QR: they are “caused by red things in the right circumstances, and used in thought about red things and action with respect to red things rightly”. But on Inverted Earth your experiences with this functional role have QG, not (or not always) QR.
If we insist that the Inverted Earth scenario is constrained by actual biology, can it still be maintained that your experiences caused by red things on Inverted Earth have the QR-role? That is not clear, even if we grant Block's claim about the “shift in intentional contents” without a corresponding change in qualia. The problem is twofold. First, because of asymmetries in color space and additional complications (see note ), to say nothing of the details of the “inverting lenses”, your total functional organization would certainly change in various respects after traveling to a biologically possible Inverted Earth. Second, Block's description of the long-arm functional theory is highly schematic. It may be that a suitably sophisticated and developed form of this theory would not have the consequence that, on a biologically possible Inverted Earth, your experiences caused by red things have the QR-role. Similar points go for an argument against functionalism using a traditional inverted spectrum scenario.
Unsurprisingly, Block does not rest very much — if any — weight on the biological possibility of the Inverted Earth scenario:
But what if the facts of human physiology get in the way of the case as I described it? My response is the same as the one mentioned earlier (based on Shoemaker's rebuttal of Harrison), namely that it is possible for there to be a race of people very much like us, with color vision, and color sensations, but whose physiology does not rule out the case described (or spectrum inversion). The functionalist can hardly be satisfied with the claim that our experiences are functional states but the other race's experiences are not. (1990, 64)
This response concedes that the Inverted Earth argument against functionalism may need to appeal to more-or-less outlandish possibilities. And if it does, then since other possibilities not involving inversions, and arguably no more outlandish, will do just as well, it is doubtful that Inverted Earth-type scenarios have an essential role to play in arguments against functionalism.
The anti-physicalist inverted spectrum argument is:
P1c. The following spectrum inversion scenario is possible: Invert and Nonvert are physically alike, and are both looking at a tomato.
Since P1c implies that the mental does not supervene on physical makeup:
Cc. Physicalism is false.
Although there is some controversy about just how science-fictional anti-functionalist inversion scenarios need to be, anti-physicalist inversion scenarios are usually supposed to be very remote from actuality, and their possibility is hotly disputed. Almost uncontroversially: if an inverted spectrum argument against physicalism works at all, then a simple zombie scenario will equally serve the purpose.
It is widely held that perceptual experiences represent the perceiver's environment as being a certain way. For example, the experience of someone with normal color vision looking at figure 1 represents (inter alia) her environment as containing a crimson, vermilion, and turquoise square. In the terminology of Chalmers 2004 (slightly adapted), a representational property is a property of a mental state/event that specifies (perhaps only in part) the state/event's representational content. For example, the property of being a visual experience that represents that there is a crimson square before one is a representational property (for a taxonomy of representational properties, see Chalmers 2004, section 2). The basic idea of representationalism or intentionalism is that qualia are representational properties, or at least supervene on representational properties. One advantage of representationalism is that it appears to reduce “phenomenal consciousness” (Block 1995) to a certain kind of intentionality. Since the problem of providing a naturalistic account of intentionality is often thought to be tractable, representationalism brings the possibility of a naturalistic account of consciousness (see, e.g., Dretske 1995, Lycan 1996, and Tye 2000).
Spectrum inversion scenarios help to focus the dispute between representationalists and their critics. (Actual cases of shifted spectra can also serve: see Block 1999.) Any version of representationalism is committed to the following thesis. Consider a case of red-green spectrum inversion, and imagine Invert and Nonvert are both looking at the red peppers depicted in figure 6, against a neutral background. Nonvert's experience has QR, while Invert's experience has QG. Because the two experiences have different qualia, any version of representationalism implies that, if this scenario is possible, the two experiences differ in representational content. Hence, if the foregoing scenario can be filled out so that (a) the two experiences have the same content and (b) the scenario is possible, then representationalism is refuted.
How can these two desiderata be satisfied? Fortunately for the anti-representationalist — or phenomenist (Block 2003) — the usual ways of trying to secure (a) do not require Invert and Nonvert to be behavioral duplicates (or, for that matter, functional duplicates). The anti-representationalist can therefore dismiss concerns that a behaviorally undetectable inversion scenario is impossible.
The description of the anti-representationalist scenario is typically completed with the following three features. First, Invert is able to use her color vision to reidentify objects, distinguish objects from their backgrounds, etc., with more-or-less the facility of Nonvert. In Locke's phrase, Invert “would be able as regularly to distinguish Things for [her] Use by those Appearances”. Second, Invert has been spectrally inverted from birth (or at least for a long period of time). Third, Nonvert and Invert belong to the same linguistic community: in particular, they use color vocabulary in the same way, applying ‘red’ to tomatoes, ‘yellow’ to bananas, and so forth.
Assume that this scenario is possible (for an argument that it isn't, see Sundström 2002). The three features just mentioned are intended to support the view that this scenario is one in which, when Invert and Nonvert both look at the fruits depicted in figure 6, their experiences have the same representational properties. In particular (glossing over a complication to be discussed in subsection 3.3 below), the banana looks yellow to both Invert and Nonvert, the strawberries look red to both, and so on. So, assuming that bananas are yellow, strawberries are red, etc., neither Invert nor Nonvert is suffering from some global color illusion. If this inverted spectrum hypothesis is correct, then qualia do not supervene on representational properties, and therefore representationalism is false.
(Here is one way of putting the Inverted Earth version of this argument (see subsections 2.3.3 and 3.1). After first arriving on Inverted Earth, your word ‘red’ means red, and to you the green peppers on Inverted Earth look red. But after a period of acclimatization, you come to speak the language of the locals, and your experiences come to represent correctly the colors of things — green peppers on Inverted Earth look green. Now compare your present experience of a green pepper on Inverted Earth with your previous experience of peppers of exactly that shade back on Earth. Same content, but different qualia. Alternatively, the anti-representationalist argument can proceed by exhibiting an example of the converse: same qualia, but different content — see Block 1990, 64-7.)
The three features of the anti-representationalist scenario can motivate the conclusion that Invert is not systematically misperceiving the colors of things as follows. First, because Invert's color vision is as useful as Nonvert's for discriminating and identifying objects, surely it would be arbitrary to suppose that Invert's color vision, but not Nonvert's, is the source of pervasive illusions. Second, because Nonvert has been inverted since birth, a complicated system of causal connections between the colors of objects in her environment and states of her visual system has been in place for a long period. In particular, there is a reliable causal connection between the presence of a red object before Invert's eyes and a certain neural event occurring in Invert; this sort of causal connection is plausibly sufficient to bestow the property of representing redness on this type of neural event. Third, because Invert and Nonvert belong to the same linguistic community, Invert's word ‘red’ means red. So when Invert says (as she does), ‘Strawberries look red to me’, she means that strawberries look red to her. So, if strawberries do not look red to her, Invert is systematically in error about how things look, and this result is not credible.
Naturally, each of these reasons for thinking that Invert is not misperceiving the colors of objects can be questioned. Against the first, one might dispute the claim that it would be arbitrary to convict only Invert of error — after all, for all that's been said, Nonvert and Invert might differ functionally, which is presumably a relevant difference. Against the second, there are well-known problems for the “causal covariational” account of mental content that it assumes (see, e.g., Fodor 1992, Ch. 3). Finally, against the third, it may be argued that the consequence that Invert is mistaken about the content of her experience is not unacceptable (Tye 2002, 451).
It will be useful to set out the anti-representationalist argument more carefully. Assume as a suppressed premise that the inverted spectrum scenario just described is possible, and suppose that Invert and Nonvert are both looking at a ripe tomato in good light:
P1. Neither Invert nor Nonvert is misperceiving the color of the tomato.
P2. The tomato is red (and not any other color).
C1. The tomato looks the same color (namely, red) to both Invert and Nonvert.
P3. If representationalism is true, then the phenomenal difference between Invert and Nonvert is due to a difference in the colors that their experiences represent the tomato as having.
Hence, from C1 and P3:
C2. Representationalism is false.
Some of the dialectic surrounding P1 has been described. In the following three subsections, other ways of resisting the argument will be discussed.
If Argument B is sound, tomatoes look red to both Invert and Nonvert, although the corresponding qualia are different. This is why spectrum inversion was not described in subsection 2.1 as a case where tomatoes look green to Invert (and look red to Nonvert). If spectrum inversion is explained in these terms, the thought experiment is quite unsuitable for anti-representationalist purposes.
According to the (orthodox) representationalist, an experience has QB, say, just in case it is an experience that represents blue. According to the phenomenist who endorses Argument B, an experience has QB just in case it has a certain non-representational property. Let us stipulate that ‘B’ refers to this non-representational property, if such a thing exists. Then the two views may be put as follows:
QB = B (a certain nonrepresentational property).
QB = property of visually representing blue (i.e., being an experience of something's looking blue).
The sense-datum theory is usually taken to be a form of phenomenism; it will be treated as such here. According to the sense-datum theorist, sense-data that are associated with experiences of seeing the sky, lapis lazuli, cobalt glass, etc., have a distinctive property; the traditional sense-datum theorist took this property to be the color blue (see, e.g., Moore 1953, 30, n.2), but let us speak more neutrally and call it ‘blue′’ (Peacocke 1983, Ch. 1). Then, according to the sense-datum theorist, the phenomenist equation can be spelled out more informatively thus:
QB = B = being a sensing of a blue′ sense-datum.
Orthodox phenomenists (for instance Block and Levine) have no truck with sense-data, and typically leave the phenomenist equation unadorned. However, the sense-datum theorist can offer the following consideration in her favor.
Imagine two experiences: first, an experience (call it ‘e1’) of a blue triangle next to a red square; second, an experience (e2) of a red triangle next to a blue square. e1 has color qualia QB and QR, and also “spatial qualia”, which we can label ‘QTr’ and ‘QSq’. The reference of these four bits of qualia terminology (‘QB’, ‘QR’, ‘QTr’, and ‘QSq’) has been fixed by, respectively, experiences of blue objects, experiences of red objects, experiences of triangles, and experiences of squares. e2, of course, also has QB, QR, QTr, and QSq. Yet e1 and e2 differ phenomenologically, and therefore differ in qualia. So more qualia terminology is required: in particular, a quale name whose reference is fixed by experiences of blue triangles and red squares, and another name whose reference is fixed by experiences of red triangles and blue squares. In a useful notation, the first quale name is ‘QRx & Sq(x) & By &Tr(y)’, and the second is ‘QRx & Tr(x) & By & Sq(y)’. Obviously further qualia names with ever-more complicated subscripts will be needed.
Now notice that there are many entailment relations between qualia-statements — for example, ‘e has QRx & Sq(x)’ entails ‘e has QRx’, and ‘e has QRx & Tr(x) & By & Sq(y)’ entails ‘e has QRx & Sq(y)’, and so on. The orthodox representationalist and the sense-datum theorist have simple accounts of these entailments in terms of the structure of the objects of experiences (apparent structure, for the representationalist; actual structure, for the sense-datum theorist). Assuming representationalism: ‘e has QRx & Sq(x)’ (equivalently, ‘e is an experience of something's looking red and square’) clearly entails ‘e has QRx’ (equivalently, ‘e is an experience of something's looking red’). Assuming the sense-datum theory: ‘e has QRx & Sq(x)’ (equivalently, ‘e is a sensing of a red and square sense-datum’) clearly entails ‘e has QRx’ (equivalently, ‘e is a sensing of a red sense-datum’). The orthodox phenomenist cannot give a similar explanation of these entailments, and it is not clear whether she is entitled to them at all.
Return to the anti-representationalist argument of the previous subsection:
P1. Neither Invert nor Nonvert is misperceiving the color of the tomato.
P2. The tomato is red (and not any other color).
C1. The tomato looks the same color (namely, red) to both Invert and Nonvert.
P3. If representationalism is true, then the phenomenal difference between Invert and Nonvert is due to a difference in the colors that their experiences represent the tomato as having.
Hence, from C1 and P3:
C2. Representationalism is false.
Representationalists usually resist P1. But there are other options. According to Shoemaker, the flaw in the argument is not P1, but rather P3. In addition to representing colors, Shoemaker thinks that visual experiences represent other (“colorlike”) properties that we do not have words for in English, and which he calls appearance properties. On this view, both Invert and Nonvert's experiences represent the tomato as red. However, Invert's experience also represents the tomato as having a certain salient appearance property (call it ‘APG’), while Nonvert's experience represents the tomato as having a certain salient appearance property (APR). It is this representational difference between Invert and Nonvert that accounts for the phenomenological difference between their experiences. One may, then, view Shoemaker's main argument for appearance properties as proceeding from P1, P2, and representationalism (i.e., not-C2), to the conclusion that P3 is false.
What are the appearance properties APG and APR? Since Shoemaker thinks that it is implausible that Invert is systematically misperceiving the colors, it is not surprising that he also thinks that neither Nonvert nor Invert is systematically misperceiving the appearance properties. The tomato, then, has both APG and APR. In Shoemaker 1994b, APR is said to be (where QR “is the quale that characterizes [Nonvert's] experience of red things”) the property of “currently producing [a QR] experience in someone related to it in a certain way, namely someone viewing it under normal lighting conditions” (254), and similarly for APG (see also Shoemaker 1994a). This secures the result that the tomato has APR when Nonvert is looking at it; as Shoemaker notes, it implies that the tomato lacks APR when it is not being perceived. This account of appearance properties has been substantially revised and developed in Shoemaker's later work. According to Shoemaker 2002, appearance properties include dispositions to produce certain experiences in certain perceivers (a suggestion that was considered but rejected in Shoemaker 1994a, b). Shoemaker 2006a revises the account further; for discussion, see Egan 2006.
Thau (2002, Ch. 5) holds a similar view, but there are some important differences. First, Thau's argument does not turn on the need to secure spectrum inversion without misrepresentation, and instead deploys an adaptation of Jackson's (1982) thought experiment concerning black-and-white Mary. (See the entry on qualia: the knowledge argument.) Second, because Thau is not concerned to ensure that neither Invert nor Nonvert is misperceiving the tomato, he does not try to argue that the tomato has both APG and APR, leaving the question unexamined. Third, Thau's argument for appearance properties commits him to the view that they cannot be named (222-5); Shoemaker is not so committed. Finally, Thau does not think, unlike Shoemaker, that colors are visually represented (211). According to Thau, beliefs about the colors of things are based on experiences that represent objects as having appearance properties. These beliefs are justified, Thau argues, because there is a correlation between an object's having color C and its looking to have APC (235-6).
An illustration of “Frege's puzzle” is this. It is apparently possible to believe that Michael Caine is a Cockney, while not believing that Maurice Micklewhite is a Cockney. But how can this be, since Michael Caine and Maurice Micklewhite are the same individual?
According to many philosophers, appearances are not misleading, and the two beliefs really are different: specifically, they represent the very same individual, the beloved star of Alfie, in different ways, or under different modes of presentation. On this view, the propositional content of a belief is a Fregean Thought, with modes of presentation as constituents — as opposed to a structured Russellian proposition, with objects and properties as constituents. Put differently but connectedly, the example shows that the names ‘Michael Caine’ and ‘Maurice Micklewhite’ have different Fregean senses — their semantic values cannot simply be their referents.
A similar issue arises in the philosophy of perception (see, e.g., Boghossian and Velleman 1991, Peacocke 2001, Thau 2002). When one looks at a cucumber, does the propositional content of one's experience have a constituent that is a “mode of presentation” of greenness (a neo-Fregean view) or does it instead simply contain the property greenness itself? Using the familiar ordered pair notation for propositional content (see, e.g., Thau 2002, 83), and ignoring issues about whether the cucumber itself is associated with a mode of presentation, the dispute may be put as follows. On the neo-Fregean view, the content of one's experience of the cucumber is <the cucumber, MOPgreenness>; on the neo-Russellian view, the content of one's experiences is <the cucumber, greenness>.
Recall the third premise of argument B (see the previous two subsections):
P3. If representationalism is true, then the phenomenal difference between Invert and Nonvert is due to a difference in the colors that their experiences represent the tomato as having.
As explained in subsection 3.3, one may resist P3 by claiming that color experience represents appearance properties. That amounts to a defense of representationalism by introducing a distinction “at the level of reference”. However, P3 may also be denied by introducing a distinction “at the level of sense”. On this view, the difference between Invert and Nonvert is like the difference — as the Fregean has it — between Ian, who believes that Michael Caine is a Cockney, and Nan, who believes that Maurice Micklewhite is a Cockney. On this Fregean view of the content of perception, the difference between Invert's and Nonvert's experiences is that they represent the very same property, namely redness, in different ways, or under different modes of presentation.
Thau 2002 argues against modes of presentation (and also points out the close connections between the inverted spectrum and Frege's puzzle). Chalmers 2004 and Block 2007 defend a Fregean view.
We are not quite finished with Argument B:
P1. Neither Invert nor Nonvert is misperceiving the color of the tomato.
P2. The tomato is red (and not any other color).
C1. The tomato looks the same color (namely, red) to both Invert and Nonvert.
Hence, from C1 and P3:
C2. Representationalism is false.
So far, reasons to reject P1 and P3 have been discussed. But one might also question the step from P1 and P2 to C1. As an analogy, suppose that Hare is on a train, looking at a tomato in his lunchbox, and that Tortoise is on the platform, looking at the tomato as the train speeds by. Both Hare and Tortoise have normal vision, in particular, normal visual motion perception. Consider the following argument.
P1*. Neither Hare nor Tortoise is misperceiving the motion of the tomato.
P2*. The tomato is moving (not stationary).
C1*. The tomato looks to be moving to both Hare and Tortoise.
Since the tomato is moving relative to Tortoise, and is not moving relative to Hare, if P2* is true, it must not be taken to mean that the tomato is moving relative to Hare. Assume, then, that P2* is given the following true interpretation: the tomato is moving relative to Tortoise. However, Hare does not have to perceive that the tomato is moving relative to Tortoise in order to perceive (correctly) the tomato's motion — perceiving it as not moving relative to himself will also suffice. Hence, Hare's and Tortoise's experiences can both be veridical, despite representing the tomato's motion differently, which is to say that Argument B* is invalid.
One might diagnose a similar mistake in Argument B, and thus endorse relativism about color. According to relativism the tomato is not red simpliciter: rather, it is red relative to Nonvert (not green relative to Nonvert), and green relative to Invert (not red relative to Invert). In other words, the tomato is simultaneously red-for-Nonvert and green-for-Invert. Since, on this view, the tomato looks red-for-Nonvert to Nonvert, and red-for-Invert to Invert, both their experiences are veridical, despite representing the tomato differently.
What is this property of being red-for-Nonvert? The usual answer is something along the lines of the account of appearance properties in Shoemaker 2002: something is red-for-Nonvert iff it is disposed to cause experiences with R in perceivers of Nonvert's kind. And this, of course, is essentially the “secondary quality” account of color that many find in Locke. Sometimes relativism is combined with representationalism (McGinn 1983, Tye 1994), but it arguably fits more naturally with phenomenism (McLaughlin 2003, Cohen 2004).
Shoemaker did not block Argument B in this straightforward fashion because he finds relativism implausible. As he puts it in a review of McGinn 1983:
Suppose…that overnight we all undergo intrasubjective ‘spectrum inversion’…It cannot seriously be maintained that the result of the change would be that henceforth grass is red, port wine green, etc. And it is plausible that, once we were accustomed to the change, we would no longer say that grass looks red (for it would look the way we had become accustomed to having green things look). This point is even clearer if we imagine that we undergo intrasubjective inversion one at a time rather than all of us at once. (1986, 411)
Like the argument for appearance properties, the argument for relativism can be made by appeal to shifted spectra (see, in particular, Cohen 2004). Averill 1992 argues for a version of relativism using physically possible intrapersonal shifted spectra scenarios, involving a slight change in the eye, or in the atmosphere.
The “inverted spectrum” quotation from Locke in subsection 2.2 above continues:
I am nevertheless very apt to think, that the sensible Ideas, produced by any Object in different Men's Minds, are most commonly very near and undiscernibly alike. For which Opinion, I think, there might be many Reasons offered: but that being besides my present Business, I shall not trouble my Reader with them; but only mind him, that the contrary Supposition, if it could be proved, is of little use, either for the Improvement of our Knowledge, or Conveniency of Life; and so we need not trouble our selves to examine it. (1689/1975, II, xxxii, 15)
It is regrettable that Locke did not trouble his Reader, because it is not at all clear what reasons may be offered.
Let p be the claim that when others look at ripe tomatoes, their experiences have QR. Let S be a spectrum inversion scenario with the following simple feature: when others look at ripe tomatoes, their experiences have QG, not QR. (So p and S are incompatible.) Consider the following skeptical argument:
P1. One's evidence about others' behavior and use of color words does not favor p over S.
P2. One has no other evidence that favors p over S.
P3. If one's evidence does not favor p over S, one does not know p.
C. One does not know p.
Although philosophers have generally not been impressed by similar arguments for skepticism about the external world, there is little consensus on the status of arguments along the above lines. For example, Block writes: “I claim we simply do not know whether spectrum inversion obtains or not” (1990, 57). Argument C is less threatening than some other skeptical arguments because, even if sound, generalizations of it to skepticism about other kinds of mental states are implausible. For example, a parallel argument against one's knowledge of other's beliefs would have a dubious first premise.
P1 will be denied by an orthodox representationalist. Setting a controversial skepticism about testimony aside, presumably one can know on the basis of testimony that tomatoes look red to many people. (See Shoemaker 1982, 334.) So, since orthodox representationalism equates QR with the property of being an experience of something's looking red, one may know on the basis of testimony that when others look at tomatoes, their experiences have QR.
Some philosophers think that the fact that others are biologically similar to oneself is an important piece of evidence for their mental similarity (see, e.g., Hill 1991, Ch. 9), and P2 might be denied on these grounds (see, e.g., Papineau 2002, 132). For more discussion, see Block 2002.
Many philosophers think there is an “explanatory gap” (Levine 1983, 2001) between physical facts and facts about conscious experience. On this view, even if consciousness is a physical phenomenon, it cannot be given a physical explanation. Inverted spectrum scenarios often play a role in arguments for the gap:
Let's call the physical story for seeing red “R” and the physical story for seeing green “G…” When we consider the qualitative character of our visual experiences when looking at ripe McIntosh apples, as opposed to looking at ripe cucumbers, the difference is not explained by appeal to G and R. For R doesn't really explain why I have the one kind of qualitative experience — the kind I have when looking at McIntosh apples — and not the other. As evidence for this, note that it seems just as easy to imagine G as to imagine R underlying the qualitative experience that is in fact associated with R. The reverse, of course, also seems quite imaginable. (Levine 1983, 356-7)
The argument for the gap suggested by Levine 1983 can be set out as follows:
P1. If a physical theory T explains the fact that we have experiences with QR when looking at McIntosh apples, and experiences with QG when looking at cucumbers, then it is not imaginable that the explanans holds without the explanandum. That is, it is not imaginable that T holds and we do not have experiences with QR when looking at McIntosh apples (etc.).
P2. A red-green spectrum inversion scenario in which T holds is imaginable.
C. No physical theory explains the fact that we have experiences with QR when looking at McIntosh apples, and experiences with QG when looking at cucumbers.
Notice that Argument D does not have as a premise a spectrum inversion hypothesis — that a certain spectrum inversion scenario is possible. All the argument requires is that the spectrum inversion scenario is imaginable. Indeed, since Levine is a physicalist, he thinks that this scenario is not possible.
What is the intended interpretation of ‘imagine’ in P1 and P2? (In the literature ‘conceive’ is used interchangeably.) The usual answer (Levine 2001, Ch. 2) is this: p is imaginable iff not-p is not a priori. On this interpretation, P1 amounts to this: it is a priori that if the explanans holds, so does the explanandum; that is, that the explanans a priori entails the explanandum. This can be motivated by appeal to the “deductive-nomological” model of explanation (see Hempel 1965, and the entry on scientific explanation); this model is controversial, and in fact Levine rejects it, but he argues that there is a broader motivation:
From the brief survey of current theories of scientific explanation just presented, I think the following claim can be justified: in a good scientific explanation, the explanans either entails the explanandum, or it entails a probability distribution over a range of alternatives, among which the explanandum resides. (2001, 74)
One might resist Argument D by denying P2 (for some ammunition, see Hardin 1987; 1993, 134-42; for a reply see Levine 1991; see also Hardin 1991). A much more common response is to deny P1 (Block and Stalnaker 1999; for a reply see Chalmers and Jackson 2001).
One exegetical complication is that Levine himself now denies P1, while continuing to maintain the existence of the explanatory gap on the basis of an argument related to Argument D, although somewhat more complicated (2001, Ch. 3). And in any case, just like the inverted spectrum argument against behaviorism, functionalism and physicalism (see subsection 3.1 above), inverted spectrum scenarios are not playing an essential role in the case for the gap, and indeed Levine 2001 leans more heavily on “absent qualia” scenarios: “The conceivability of zombies…is the principal manifestation of the explanatory gap” (79).
The introduction of ‘QR’, ‘QG’, and so forth, at the start of this article might have occasioned some suspicion. Assume that spectrum inversion does not occur, and consider a counterfactual situation in which, as Block puts it, “spectrum inversion is rife” (1990, 55). Suppose that philosophers in this counterfactual situation introduced qualia terminology in the way it was introduced in section 1. If their qualia terminology is meaningless, then it is hard to see why our terminology is better off — we use ‘QR’ just as it is used in the counterfactual situation. If, on the other hand, their qualia terminology is meaningful, then presumably ‘QR’, as they use it, refers to something other than a quale. (Since spectrum inversion is rife, their use of ‘QR’ is not associated with any particular quale.) Again, given the overlap in use, why suppose that our word ‘QR’ is any different? Either way: ‘QR’ does not refer to a quale. There is a threat, then, that qualia cannot be named in a public language — that they are ineffable (cf. Dennett 1988, 228-9). Indeed, that seems to be Block's opinion: “if an inverted spectrum is possible, then experiential contents that can be expressed in public language (for example, looking red) are not qualitative contents, but rather intentional contents” (1990, 55; see also Block 2007, 73-4). (“Qualitative contents” are qualia that are not representational properties: see subsection 3.2.)
Frege held a version of the ineffability view. One of his theses in The Foundations of Arithmetic is that arithmetic is “objective”, which he explains as follows:
What is objective…is what is subject to laws, what can be conceived and judged, what is expressible in words. What is purely intuitable is not communicable. To make this clear, let us suppose two rational beings such that projective properties and relations are all they can intuite — the lying of three points on a line, of four points on a plane, and so on; and let what the one intuites as plane appear to the other as a point, and vice versa, so that what for the one is the line joining two points for the other is the line of intersection of two planes, and so on with the one intuition always dual to the other. In these circumstances they could understand one another quite well and would never realize the difference between their intuitions, since in projective geometry every proposition has its dual counterpart; any disagreements over points of aesthetic appreciation would not be conclusive evidence. Over all geometrical theorems they would be in complete agreement, only interpreting the words in terms of their respective intuitions. With the word ‘point’, for example, one would connect one intuition and the other another. We can therefore still say that this word has for them an objective meaning, provided only that by this meaning we do not understand any of the peculiarities of their respective intuitions. (1884/1953, §26)
This is an inverted spatial qualia scenario. According to Frege, the inversion would not show up in the semantics of words: both Nonvert and Invert use the word ‘point’ with the same meaning, despite associating very different “intuitions” with it. In the next paragraph, Frege makes a similar claim about color terminology.
The word ‘white’ ordinarily makes us think of a certain sensation, which is, of course, entirely subjective; but even in ordinary everyday speech, it often bears, I think, an objective sense. When we call snow white, we mean to refer to an objective quality which we recognize, in ordinary daylight, by a certain sensation. If the snow is being seen in a coloured light, we take that into account in our judgement and say, for instance, ‘It appears red at present, but it is white.’ Even a colour-blind man can speak of red and green, in spite of the fact that he does not distinguish between these colors in his sensations; he recognizes the distinction by the fact that others make it, or perhaps by making a physical experiment. Often, therefore, a colour word does not signify our subjective sensation, which we cannot know to agree with anyone else's (for obviously calling things by the same name does not guarantee as much), but rather an objective quality. (§26)
Although Frege seems to concede that sometimes a color word “signifies our subjective sensation”, the general drift of the argument points to a much stronger conclusion, that our subjective sensations are simply not “expressible in words”. A related example is Wittgenstein's “beetle in the box”:
Suppose everyone had a box with something in it: we call it a ‘beetle’. No one can look into anyone else's box, and everyone says he knows what a beetle is only by looking at his beetle. — Here it would be quite possible for everyone to have something different in his box. One might even imagine such a thing constantly changing. — But suppose the word ‘beetle’ had a use in these people's language? — If so it would not be used as the name of a thing. The thing in the box has no place in the language game at all; not even as a something: for the box might even be empty. No, one can ‘divide through’ by the thing in the box; it cancels out, whatever it is. (1958, §293)
(Notice that Wittgenstein imagines “absent beetles”, corresponding to an “absent qualia” scenario.)
Here is one argument suggested by these passages.
Suppose that Humbert is semantically (and otherwise) competent, has normal color vision, is a member of our linguistic community, and uses qualia terminology (‘QR’, ‘QG’, etc.), as introduced in section 1 above. Further suppose that spectrum inversion does not in fact occur.
Now consider a counterfactual spectrum inversion scenario in which “spectrum inversion is rife”. Invert has been spectrally inverted with respect to some other members of his community since birth, all of whom use color terminology in much the same way. Nonvert is spectrally inverted with respect to his neighbor Invert, but — comparing this scenario with the actual scenario described in the previous paragraph — is not spectrally inverted with respect to Humbert. Further suppose that Nonvert and his neighbor Invert use qualia terminology as introduced in section 1 above. Assume as a suppressed premise that this scenario is possible.
Let ‘X’ abbreviate the definite description ‘the quale distinctive of Humbert's experiences of red things’ (by hypothesis, this definite description is coextensive with ‘the quale distinctive of Nonvert's experiences of red things in the counterfactual inversion scenario’).
P1. ‘QR’, as Invert uses it, and ‘QR’, as Nonvert uses it, refer (if at all) to the same property.
P2. ‘QR’, as Invert uses it, does not refer to X.
C1. ‘QR’, as Nonvert uses it, does not refer to X.
P3. ‘QR’, as Humbert uses it, and ‘QR’, as Nonvert uses it, refer (if at all) to the same property.
Hence, from C1 and P3:
C2. ‘QR’, as Humbert uses it, does not refer to X.
Since the rest of us are in no better position than Humbert, C2 leads inevitably to the conclusion that ‘QR’, ‘QG’, etc., as introduced in the manner of section 1, do not in fact refer to qualia. One might view Argument E as showing that certain salient aspects of our mental lives are linguistically elusive (as Frege apparently did); alternatively, one might follow Wittgenstein and conclude that the very idea of qualia rests on a conceptual confusion.
In fact, C2 does not imply that qualia are completely unspeakable — it does not, that is, imply that no expression refers to X (i.e., the quale distinctive of Humbert's experiences of red things). Indeed, if the sentence to the right of ‘C2’ succeeds in expressing a truth, then ‘X’ (and so ‘the quale distinctive of Humbert's experiences of red things’) refers to X. If Argument E is as far as we can go, then the moral seems to be that particular qualia can only be picked out ‘by description’ — they cannot be referred to by semantically simple expressions, such as ‘QR’ and ‘QG’. But — bearing in mind Wittgenstein's remark that “the box might even be empty” — one might attempt to extend the argument to show that even the word ‘qualia’ itself is devoid of significance.
However, Argument E is not obviously sound. The premise in need of most defense is P3. When qualia terminology was introduced in section 1, it was tacitly presupposed that spectrum inversion was not rife. In Invert's and Nonvert's community, that presupposition is false, and so it should not be surprising if the attempt to introduce ‘QR’ into their public language fails. But in Humbert's community the presupposition is true; so why wouldn't ‘QR’, as the members of this community use it, successfully refer to the quale distinctive of Humbert's experiences of red things?
Externalism about beliefs and other propositional attitudes, and also about perceptual experiences, was alluded to in subsections 3.1 and 3.2. Premise P1 of our much-scrutinized Argument B — ‘Neither Invert nor Nonvert is misperceiving the color of the tomato’ — was supported, in part, by a particular externalist theory of perceptual content. According to the externalist, some representational properties of subjects, like the property of believing that water is wet, or that arthritis is painful, or the property of having an experience of something's looking red, are extrinsic: these properties are not necessarily shared between perfect duplicates (or even less-than-perfect duplicates with perfectly duplicated brains). Smith may believe that water is wet, yet twin-Smith on Putnam's Twin Earth does not believe that water is wet. The tomato may look red to Jones, yet not to twin-Jones on Inverted Earth. (In an alternative scenario, twin-Jones has just been created by happenstance in a swamp: see Davidson 1987.)
It is also widely held that qualia are intrinsic (see, e.g., Block 1990, 68). (More exactly: properties of subjects like having an experience with quale Q, are intrinsic.) If Jones is having an experience with quale Q, then there is no possible world w in which twin-Jones is not having an experience with quale Q.
Finally, representationalism (see subsection 3.2 above) is — if not as popular as the previous two claims — at least defended by many contemporary philosophers.
Now consider the following argument (cf. Byrne and Hilbert 1997b, 271-2):
P1. Representational properties are extrinsic.
P2. Representationalism is true (for simplicity, in the simple form of subsection 3.2 above: QC = the property of being an experience of something's looking to have color C).
P3. Qualia are intrinsic.
Consider the representational property of having an experience of something's looking red. By P1, this property is extrinsic, and so there is a possible world w in which a subject x has this property and y — a perfect duplicate of x — lacks it. Solely for illustration, we may take w to be a possible world in which Nonvert and his twin Invert are both looking at a tomato in a white bowl (but perhaps the twins are on different planets). Nonvert is having an experience of something's looking red, and Invert is not; more specifically: (i) the tomato looks red, and nothing looks green, to Nonvert; (ii) the tomato looks green, and nothing looks red, to Invert. By P2, Nonvert's experience has QR (and not QG); conversely for Invert. So Nonvert and Invert are twins whose experiences do not share qualia; in other words, qualia are not intrinsic. By P3, contradiction. Hence:
C. At least one of P1, P2, and P3 is false.
Notice that Argument F does not assume the possibility of a scenario in which duplicate perceivers are spectrally inverted. This spectrum inversion hypothesis is ruled out by P3, and P3 is of course consistent with Argument F's conclusion.
Argument F shows that either content-externalism, representationalism, or qualia-internalism should be rejected. For a discussion of this problem, see Egan and John 2003 (Other Internet Resources); Dretske (1995, Ch. 5) argues against P3 (see also Tye 1995, 150-5; 2002, Ch. 6; Lycan 1996, 115-7; and Noë 2005, Ch. 7); P1 is denied in Chalmers 2004.
Relatedly, McGinn (1989, 58-94) runs a “spatially Inverted Earth” argument against what he calls ‘strong externalism’ about perceptual content (a particular kind of externalism); Davies (1997) adapts McGinn's example to argue for externalism about perceptual content. Both sides of the “externalism/internalism” debate as encapsulated in Argument F presuppose that it is possible to keep a perceiver's internal constitution fixed while greatly varying the environment; this assumption is critically examined in Hurley 1998, Chs. 7, 8, and Myin 2001.
|Conclusion||Required features of scenario|
|Behaviorism is false.||Behaviorally undetectable inversion.|
|Functionalism is false.||Functionally undetectable inversion.|
|Physicalism is false.||Physically undetectable inversion.|
|Representationalism is false.||Inversion with no misperception (so a behaviorally undetectable inversion is not required); in addition, lifelong inversion and same linguistic community. Shifted spectra might do as well.|
|There are appearance properties.||As immediately above (“Representationalism is false”).|
|There are perceptual modes of presentation.||As immediately above.|
|Color relativism is true.||As immediately above.|
|One does not know about others' qualia.||Inversion that is not ruled out by one's actual evidence about others' behavior and use of color words.|
|There is an explanatory gap.||Inversion that obtains together with the actual physical theory of color experiences; the scenario does not need to be possible, only imaginable.|
|Qualia are ineffable.||Inverted and noninverted subjects in same community, with the use of qualia terminology similar to the actual use.|
|Content-externalism, representationalism, and qualia-internalism are inconsistent.||Inverted subjects who are perfect duplicates; this scenario is not assumed to be possible.|
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- Egan, A., and John, J., 2003, “A Puzzle about Perception” (pdf).
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- A Glossary of Color Science, compiled by Alex Byrne (MIT) and David R. Hilbert (University of Illinois/Chicago).
- Chromatikon, Rolf Kuehni's color website (North Carolina State University). (See in particular Color Spaces, presentation in PDF.)
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- Short Wikipedia entry on the Munsell system.
behaviorism | color | consciousness: and intentionality | consciousness: representational theories of | functionalism | Locke, John | mental content | mental content: causal theories of | mental content: externalism about | mental content: narrow | mental content: teleological theories of | other minds | perception: the problem of | physicalism | qualia | sense-data
For advice and assistance I am very grateful to Jonathan Cohen, Tyler Doggett, Andy Egan, Rachel Faith, Ned Hall, Elizabeth Harman, David Hilbert, Jim John, Fiona Macpherson, and Daniel Stoljar.