Human Rights

First published Fri Feb 7, 2003; substantive revision Fri Dec 13, 2013

Human rights are norms that help to protect all people everywhere from severe political, legal, and social abuses. Examples of human rights are the right to freedom of religion, the right to a fair trial when charged with a crime, the right not to be tortured, and the right to engage in political activity. These rights exist in morality and in law at the national and international levels. Historical sources for bills of rights include the Magna Carta (1215), the English Bill of Rights (1689), the French Declaration of the Rights of Man and the Citizen (1789), and the Bill of Rights in the United States Constitution (1791). Early philosophical sources of the idea of human rights include Francisco Suarez (1548–1617), Hugo Grotius (1583–1645), Samuel Pufendorf (1632–1694), John Locke (1632–1704), and Immanuel Kant (1724–1804). The main sources of the contemporary conception of human rights are the Universal Declaration of Human Rights (United Nations, 1948b) and the many human rights documents and treaties that followed in international organizations such as the United Nations, the Council of Europe, the Organization of American States, and the African Union (on the early history of human rights see Tierney 2001 and Griffin 2008; for the history of the Universal Declaration see Glendon 2001, Lauren 1998, and Morsink 1999; and for the recent history of international human rights see Moyn 2010 and Jean Cohen 2012).

The philosophy of human rights addresses questions about the existence, content, nature, universality, justification, and legal status of human rights. The strong claims made on behalf of human rights (for example, that they are universal, or that they exist independently of legal enactment as justified moral norms) frequently provoke skeptical doubts and countering philosophical defences (on these critiques see Waldron 1988 and the entry on rights). Reflection on these doubts and the responses that can be made to them has become a sub-field of political and legal philosophy with a substantial literature (see the Bibliography below).

This entry includes a lengthy fifth section, International Human Rights Law and Organizations, that offers a comprehensive survey of today's international system for the promotion and protection of human rights.

1. The General Idea of Human Rights

This section attempts to explain the generic idea of human rights by identifying four defining features. The goal is to answer the question of what human rights are with a general description of the concept rather than a list of specific rights. Two people can have the same general idea of human rights even though they disagree about which rights belong on a list of such rights and even about whether universal moral rights exist. This four-part explanation attempts to cover all kinds of human rights including both moral and legal human rights and both old and new human rights (e.g., both Lockean natural rights and contemporary international human rights). The explanation anticipates, however, that particular kinds of human rights will have additional features. Starting with this generic concept does not commit us to treating all kinds of human rights in a single unified theory (see Buchanan 2013 for an argument that we should not attempt to theorize together universal moral rights and international legal human rights).

(1) Human rights are rights Lest we miss the obvious, human rights are rights (see the entry on rights and Cruft 2012). Most if not all human rights are claim rights that impose duties or responsibilities on their addressees or dutybearers. Rights focus on a freedom, protection, status, or benefit for the rightholders (Beitz 2009). The duties associated with human rights often require actions involving respect, protection, facilitation, and provision. Rights are usually mandatory in the sense of imposing duties on their addressees, but some legal human rights seem to do little more than declare high-priority goals and assign responsibility for their progressive realization. One can argue, of course, that goal-like rights are not real rights, but it may be better to recognize that they comprise a weak but useful notion of a right (See Beitz 2009 for a defense of the view that not all human rights are rights in a strong sense. And see Feinberg 1973 for the idea of “manifesto rights”). A human rights norm might exist as (a) a shared norm of actual human moralities, (b) a justified moral norm supported by strong reasons, (c) a legal right at the national level (where it might be referred to as a “civil” or “constitutional” right), or (d) a legal right within international law. A human rights advocate might wish to see human rights exist in all four ways (See Section 2.1 How Can Human Rights Exist?).

(2) Human rights are plural If someone accepted that there are human rights but held that there is only one of them, this might make sense if she meant that there is one abstract underlying right that generates a list of specific rights (See Dworkin 2011 for a view of this sort). But if this person meant that there is just one such specific right such as the right to peaceful assembly this would be a highly revisionary view. Human rights address a variety of specific problems such as guaranteeing fair trials, ending slavery, ensuring the availability of education, and preventing genocide. Some philosophers advocate very short lists of human rights but nevertheless accept plurality (see Joshua Cohen 2004 and Ignatief 2004).

(3) Human rights are universal All living humans—or perhaps all living persons—have human rights. One does not have to be a particular kind of person or a member of some specific nation or religion to have human rights. Included in the idea of universality is some conception of independent existence. People have human rights independently of whether they are found in the practices, morality, or law of their country or culture. This idea of universality needs several qualifications, however. First, some rights, such as the right to vote, are held only by adult citizens or residents and apply only to voting in one's own country. Second, the human right to freedom of movement may be taken away temporarily from a person who is convicted of committing a serious crime. And third, some human rights treaties focus on the rights of vulnerable groups such as minorities, women, indigenous peoples, and children.

(4) Human rights have high-priority. Maurice Cranston held that human rights are matters of “paramount importance” and their violation “a grave affront to justice” (Cranston 1967). If human rights did not have high priority they would not have the ability to compete with other powerful considerations such as national stability and security, individual and national self-determination, and national and global prosperity. High priority does not mean, however, that human rights are absolute. As James Griffin says, human rights should be understood as “resistant to trade-offs, but not too resistant” (Griffin 2008). Further, there seems to be priority variation within human rights. For example, when the right to life conflicts with the right to privacy, the latter will generally be outweighed.

Let's now consider five other features or functions that might be added.

Should human rights be defined as inalienable?. Inalienability does not mean that rights are absolute or can never be overridden by other considerations. Rather it means that its holder cannot lose it temporarily or permanently by bad conduct or by voluntarily giving it up. It is doubtful that all human rights are inalienable in this sense. One who endorses both human rights and imprisonment as punishment for serious crimes must hold that people's rights to freedom of movement can be forfeited temporarily or permanently by just convictions of serious crimes. Perhaps it is sufficient to say that human rights are very hard to lose. (For a stronger view of inalienability, see Donnelly 2003, 10).

Should human rights be defined as minimal rights? A number of philosophers have proposed the view that human rights are minimal in the sense of not being too numerous (a few dozen rights rather than hundreds or thousands), and not being too demanding (See Joshua Cohen 2004, Ignatieff 2005, Nickel 2007, and Rawls 1999). Their views suggest that human rights are—or should be—more concerned with avoiding the worst than with achieving the best. Henry Shue suggests that human rights concern the “lower limits on tolerable human conduct” rather than “great aspirations and exalted ideals” (Shue 1996). When human rights are modest standards they leave most legal and policy matters open to democratic decision-making at the national and local levels. This allows them to have high priority, to accommodate a great deal of cultural and institutional variation, and to leave open a large space for democratic decision-making at the national level. Still, there is no contradiction in the idea of an extremely expansive list of human rights and hence minimalism is not a defining feature of human rights (for criticism of the view that human rights are minimal standards see Brems 2009 and Raz 2010). Minimalism is best seen as a normative prescription for what international human rights should be. Moderate forms of minimalism have considerable appeal, but not as part of the definition of human rights.

Should human rights be defined as always including moral rights? Philosophers coming to human rights theory from ethics sometimes assume that human rights must be, at bottom, moral rather than legal rights. There is no contradiction, however, in people saying that they believe in human rights, but only when they are legal rights at the national or international levels. As Louis Henkin observed, “Political forces have mooted the principal philosophical objections, bridging the chasm between natural and positive law by converting natural human rights into positive legal rights” (Henkin 1978). Theorists who insist that the only human rights are legal rights may find, however, that the interpretations they can give of characteristics such as the universality of human rights and of their independent existence are fairly weak.

Should human rights be defined in terms of serving some sort of political function? Instead of seeing human rights as grounded in some sort of independently existing moral reality, a theorist might see them as the norms of a highly useful political practice that humans have constructed or evolved. Such a view would see the idea of human rights as playing various political roles at the national and international levels and as serving thereby to protect urgent human or national interests. These political roles might include providing standards for international evaluations of how governments treat their people and as helping to specify when use of economic sanctions or military intervention is permissible. There are powerful advocates of this sort of view (see Rawls 1999 and Beitz 2009; see also the entry on John Rawls). These theorists would add to the four defining elements above some set of political roles or functions. This view may be plausible for the very salient international human rights that have emerged in international law and politics in the last fifty years. But human rights can exist and function in contexts not involving international scrutiny and intervention such as a world with only one state. Imagine, for example, that an asteroid strike had killed everyone in all countries except New Zealand, leaving it the only state in existence. Surely the idea of human rights as well as many dimensions of human rights practice could continue in New Zealand, even though there would be no international relations, law, or politics (for an argument of this sort see Tasioulas 2012). And if a few people were discovered to have survived in Iceland and were living without a government or state, New Zealanders would know that human rights governed how these people should be treated even though they were stateless. How deeply the idea of human rights must be rooted in international law and practice should not be settled by definitional fiat. We can allow, however, that the sorts of political functions that Rawls and Beitz describe are typically served by international human rights today.

2. The Existence and Grounds of Human Rights

2.1 How Can Human Rights Exist?

The most obvious way in which human rights exist is as norms of national and international law created by enactment and judicial decisions. At the international level, human rights norms exist because of treaties that have turned them into international law. For example, the human right not to be held in slavery or servitude in Article 4 of the European Convention and in Article 8 of the International Covenant on Civil and Political Rights exists because these treaties establish it. At the national level, human rights norms exist because they have through legislative enactment, judicial decision, or custom become part of a country's law. For example, the right against slavery exists in the United States because the 13th Amendment to the U.S. Constitution prohibits slavery and servitude. When rights are embedded in international law we speak of them as human rights; but when they are enacted in national law we more frequently describe them as civil or constitutional rights.

Enactment in national and international law is one of the ways in which human rights exist. But many have suggested that this is not the only way. If human rights exist only because of enactment, their availability is contingent on domestic and international political developments. Many people have looked for a way to support the idea that human rights have roots that are deeper and less subject to human decisions than legal enactment. One version of this idea is that people are born with rights, that human rights are somehow innate or inherent in human beings (see Morsink 2009). One way that a normative status could be inherent in humans is by being God-given. The U.S. Declaration of Independence (1776) claims that people are “endowed by their Creator” with natural rights to life, liberty, and the pursuit of happiness. On this view, God, the supreme lawmaker, enacted some basic human rights.

Rights plausibly attributed to divine decree must be very general and abstract (life, liberty, etc.) so that they can apply to thousands of years of human history, not just to recent centuries. But contemporary human rights are specific and many of them presuppose contemporary institutions (e.g., the right to a fair trial and the right to education). Even if people are born with God-given natural rights, we need to explain how to get from those general and abstract rights to the specific rights found in contemporary declarations and treaties.

Attributing human rights to God's commands may give them a secure status at the metaphysical level, but in a very diverse world it does not make them practically secure. Billions of people do not believe in the God of Christianity, Islam, and Judaism. If people do not believe in God, or in the sort of god that prescribes rights, then if you want to base human rights on theological beliefs you must persuade these people of a rights-supporting theological view. This is likely to be even harder than persuading them of human rights. Legal enactment at the national and international levels provides a far more secure status for practical purposes.

Human rights could also exist independently of legal enactment by being part of actual human moralities. All human groups seem to have moralities: imperative norms of behavior backed by reasons and values. These moralities contain specific norms (for example, a prohibition of the intentional murder of an innocent person) and specific values (for example, valuing human life.) One way in which human rights could exist apart from divine or human enactment is as norms accepted in all or almost all actual human moralities. If almost all human groups have moralities containing norms prohibiting murder, these norms could constitute the human right to life. Human rights can be seen as basic moral norms shared by all or almost all accepted human moralities.

This view is attractive but has serious difficulties. Although worldwide acceptance of human rights has been increasing rapidly in recent decades (see 4. Universal Human Rights in a World of Diverse Beliefs and Practices), worldwide moral unanimity about human rights does not exist. Human rights declarations and treaties are intended to change existing norms, not just describe the existing moral consensus.

Yet another way of explaining the existence of human rights is to say that they exist most basically in true or justified ethical outlooks. On this account, to say that there is a human right against torture is mainly to assert that there are strong reasons for believing that it is always wrong to engage in torture and that protections should be provided against its practice. This approach would view the Universal Declaration as attempting to formulate a justified political morality. It was not merely trying to identify a preexisting moral consensus; it was also trying to create a consensus that could be supported by very plausible moral and practical reasons. This approach requires commitment to the objectivity of such reasons. It holds that just as there are reliable ways of finding out how the physical world works, or what makes buildings sturdy and durable, there are ways of finding out what individuals may justifiably demand of each other and of governments. Even if unanimity about human rights is currently lacking, rational agreement is available to humans if they will commit themselves to open-minded and serious moral and political inquiry. If moral reasons exist independently of human construction, they can—when combined with premises about current institutions, problems, and resources—generate moral norms different from those currently accepted or enacted. The Universal Declaration seems to proceed on exactly this assumption (see Morsink 2009). One problem with this view is that existence as good reasons seems a rather thin form of existence for human rights. But perhaps we can view this thinness as a practical rather than a theoretical problem, as something to be remedied by the formulation and enactment of legal norms. The best form of existence for human rights would combine robust legal existence with the sort of moral existence that comes from being supported by strong moral and practical reasons.

2.2 Human Agency as the Basis of Human Rights

A justification for human rights—whether teleological, consequentialist, deontological, or something else—should justify the main features of human rights including their mandatory character, their universality, and their high priority. This makes the construction of a good justification a daunting task.

Grounding human rights in human agency and autonomy has had strong advocates in recent decades. In Human Rights: Essays on Justification and Application (1982) Alan Gewirth offered an agency-based justification for human rights. He argued that denying the value of successful agency and action is not an option for a human being; having a life requires regarding the indispensable conditions of agency and action as necessary goods. Abstractly described, these conditions of successful agency are freedom and well-being. A prudent rational agent who must have freedom and well-being will assert a “prudential right claim” to them. Having demanded that others must respect her freedom and well-being, consistency requires her to recognize and respect the freedom and well-being of other persons. Since all other agents are in exactly the same position as she is of desperately needing freedom and well-being, consistency requires her to recognize and respect their freedom and well-being. She “logically must accept” that other people as agents have equal rights to freedom and well-being. These two abstract rights work alone and together to generate equal specific human rights of familiar sorts (Gewirth 1978, 1982, 1996). Gewirth's aspiration was to provide an argument for human rights that applies to all human agents and that is inescapable. From a few hard-to-dispute facts and a principle of consistency he thinks we can derive two generic human rights—and from them, a list of more determinate rights. Gewirth's views have generated a large critical literature (see Beyleveld 1991 and Boylan 1999).

A more recent attempt to base human rights on agency and autonomy is found in James Griffin's book, On Human Rights 2008. Griffin does not share Gewirth's goal of providing a logically inescapable argument for human rights, but his overall view shares key structural features with Gewirth's. These include starting the justification with the unique value of agency and autonomy, postulating some abstract rights, and making a place for a right to well-being within an agency-based approach.

In the current dispute between “moral” (or “orthodox”) and “political” conceptions of human rights, Griffin strongly sides with those who see human rights as fundamentally moral rights (on this debate see Gilabert 2011 and Liao and Etinson 2012). Their defining role, in Griffin's view, is protecting people's ability to form and pursue conceptions of a worthwhile life—a capacity that Griffin variously refers to as “autonomy,” “normative agency,” and “personhood.” This ability to form, revise, and pursue conceptions of a worthwhile life is taken to be of paramount value, the exclusive source of human dignity, and thereby the basis of human rights (Griffin 2008: 27–44). Griffin holds that people value this capacity “especially highly, often more highly than even our happiness.”

“Practicalities” also shape human rights in Griffin's view. He describes practicalities as “a second ground” of human rights. They prescribe making the boundaries of rights clear by avoiding “too many complicated bends,” enlarging rights a little to give them safety margins, and consulting facts about human nature and the nature of society. Accordingly, the justifying generic function that Griffin assigns to human rights is protecting normative agency while taking account of practicalities.

Griffin claims that human rights suffer even more than other normative concepts from an “indeterminacy of sense” that makes them vulnerable to proliferation (Griffin 2008, 14–15). He thinks that tying all human rights to the single value of normative agency while taking account of practicalities is the best way to remedy this malady. He criticizes the frequent invention of new human rights and the “ballooning of the content” of established rights. Still, Griffin is friendly towards most of the rights in the Universal Declaration of Human Rights. Beyond this, Griffin takes human right to include many rights in interpersonal morality. For example, Griffin thinks that a child's human right to education applies not just against governments but also against a child's parents.

Griffin's thesis that all human rights are grounded in normative agency is put forward not so much as a description but as a proposal, as the best way of giving human rights unity, coherence, and limits. Unfortunately, accepting and following this proposal is unlikely to yield effective barriers to proliferation or a sharp line between human rights and other moral norms. The main reason is one that Griffin himself recognizes: the “generative capacities” of normative agency are “quite great.” Providing adequate protections of the three components of normative agency (autonomy, freedom, and minimal well-being) will encounter a lot of threats to these values and hence will require lots of rights. A better strategy here involves imposing demanding tests through the justificatory process—and particularly near its end when questions of burdensomeness and feasibility are being considered (Nickel 2007). Perhaps Griffin could build these tests into his notion of practicalities.

Griffin thinks that he can explain the universality of human rights by recognizing that normative agency is a threshold concept—once one is above the threshold one gets the same rights as everyone else. One's degree of normative agency does not matter. There are no “degrees of being a person” among competent adults. Treating normative agency in this way, however, is a normative policy, not just a fact about concepts. An alternative policy is possible, namely proportioning people's rights to their level of normative agency. This is what we do with children; their rights grow as they develop greater agency and responsibility. To exclude proportional rights, and to explain the egalitarian dimensions of human rights such as their universality and their character as equal rights to be enjoyed without discrimination, some additional ground pertaining to equality seems to be needed.

2.3 Political Conceptions of Human Rights

A political conception of human rights offers an account of what human rights are—or at least of what contemporary human rights are at the national and international levels. Advocates of political conceptions of human rights are often agnostic about universal moral rights while rejecting moral skepticism and thinking possible the provision of sound normative justifications for the content, normativity, and roles of human rights.

John Rawls introduced the idea of a political conception of human rights in his book, The Law of Peoples (Rawls 1999). The basic idea is that we can understand what human rights are and what their justification requires by identifying the main roles they play in some political sphere. In The Law of Peoples this sphere is international relations (and, secondarily, national politics). Rawls was attempting a normative reconstruction of international law and politics within today's international system, and this helps explain Rawls's focus on how human rights function within this system. Human rights within interpersonal relations are not part of this sphere.

Rawls says that human rights are a special class of urgent rights. He seems to accept the definition of human rights given in Section 1 above. Besides saying that human rights are rights that are high priority or “urgent,” Rawls also accepts that they are plural and universal. But Rawls was working on a narrower project than Gewirth and Griffin. The international human rights he was concerned with are also defined by their roles in helping define in various ways the normative structure of the global system. They provide content to other normative concepts such as legitimacy, sovereignty, permissible intervention, and membership in good standing in the international community.

The justificatory process for human rights and the other principles of the law of peoples is analogous to the one for principles of justice at the national level that Rawls described in A Theory of Justice (Rawls 1971). Instead of asking about the terms of cooperation that free and equal citizens would agree to under fair conditions, we ask about the terms of cooperation that free and equal peoples or countries would agree to under fair conditions. We imagine representatives of the world's countries meeting to choose the normative principles that constitute the basic international structure. These representatives are imagined to see the countries they represent as free (rightfully independent) and equal (equally worthy of respect and fair treatment). These representatives are also imagined to be choosing rationally in light of the fundamental interests of their country, to be reasonable in seeking to find and respect fair terms of cooperation, and impartial because they are behind a “veil of ignorance”—they lack information about the country they represent such as its size, wealth, and power. Rawls holds that under these conditions these representatives will unanimously choose principles for the global order that include some basic human rights (for further explanation of the global original position see the entries on John Rawls and original position).

Rawls advocated a modest list of human rights, one that leaves out many fundamental freedoms, rights of political participation, and equality rights. He did this for two reasons. One is that he wanted a list that is not parochial to the liberal democracies and that countries around the world would find attractive. The second reason is that he viewed serious violations of human rights as triggers of the permissibility of various kinds of intervention by other countries, and only the most important rights can play this role.

Leaving out any protection for equality and democracy is a high price to pay for assigning human rights the role of making international intervention permissible when they are seriously violated. We can accommodate Rawls's underlying idea without paying that price. To accept the idea that countries engaging in massive violations of the most important human rights are not to be tolerated we do not need to follow Rawls in equating international human rights with a heavily-pruned list. Instead we can work up a view—which is needed for other purposes anyway—of which human rights are the weightiest and then assign the intervention-permitting role to this subset (see Nickel 2007: 98–103).

Let's now turn to Charles Beitz's account of human rights in The Idea of Human Rights (Beitz 2009). His view shares many similarities with Rawls's but is more fully developed. Like Rawls, Beitz deals with human rights only as they have developed in contemporary international human rights practice. Beitz suggests that we can develop an understanding of human rights by attending to “the practical inferences that would be drawn by competent participants in the practice from what they regard as valid claims of human rights.” Observations of what competent participants say and do inform the account of what human rights are. The focus is not on what human rights are at some deep philosophical level; it is rather on how they work by guiding actions within a recently emerged and still evolving discursive practice. The norms of the practice guide the interpretation and application of human rights, the appropriateness of criticism in terms of human rights, adjudication in human rights courts, and—perhaps most importantly—responding to serious violations of human rights. Beitz says that human rights are “matters of international concern” and that they are “potential triggers of transnational protective and remedial action.”

Beitz does not agree with Rawls's view that these roles require an abbreviated list of human rights. He accepts that the requirements of human rights are weaker than the requirements of social justice at the national level, but denies that human rights are minimal or highly modest in other respects.

Beitz rightly suggests that a person can accept and use the idea of human rights without accepting any particular view about their foundations. It is less clear that he is right in suggesting that good justifications of human rights should avoid as far as possible controversial assumptions about religion, metaphysics, ideology, and intrinsic value (see the entry public reason). Beitz emphasizes the practical good that human rights do, not their reflection of some underlying moral reality. This makes human rights attractive to people from around the world with their diverse religious and philosophical traditions. The broad justification for human rights and their normativity that Beitz offers is that they protect “urgent individual interests against predictable dangers (”standard threats“) to which they are vulnerable under typical circumstances of life in a modern world order composed of states.”

3. Which Rights are Human Rights?

This section discusses the question of which rights belong on lists of human rights. Not every question of social justice or wise governance is a human rights issue. For example, a country could have too much income inequality or inadequate provision for higher education without violating any human rights. Deciding which norms should be counted as human rights is a matter of considerable difficulty. And there is continuing pressure to expand lists of human rights to include new areas. Many political movements would like to see their main concerns categorized as matters of human rights, since this would publicize, promote, and legitimize their concerns at the international level. A possible result of this is “human rights inflation,” the devaluation of human rights caused by producing too much bad human rights currency (See Cranston 1973, Orend 2002, Wellman 1999, Griffin 2010).

One way to avoid rights inflation is to follow Cranston in insisting that human rights only deal with extremely important goods, protections, and freedoms. A supplementary approach is to impose several justificatory tests for specific human rights. For example, it could be required that a proposed human right not only deal with some very important good but also respond to a common and serious threat to that good, impose burdens on the addressees that are justifiable and no larger than necessary, and be feasible in most of the world's countries (see Nickel 2007). This approach restrains rights inflation with several tests, not just one master test.

Human rights are specific and problem-oriented (Dershowitz 2004, Donnelly 2003, Shue 1996, Talbott 2005). Historic bills of rights often begin with a list of complaints about the abuses of previous regimes or eras. Bills of rights may have preambles that speak grandly and abstractly of life, liberty, and the inherent dignity of persons, but their lists of rights contain specific norms addressed to familiar political, legal, or economic problems.

In deciding which specific rights are human rights it is possible to make either too little or too much of international documents such as the Universal Declaration and the European Convention. One makes too little of them by proceeding as if drawing up a list of important rights were a new question, never before addressed, and as if there were no practical wisdom to be found in the choices of rights that went into the historic documents. And one makes too much of them by presuming that those documents tell us everything we need to know about human rights. This approach involves a kind of fundamentalism: it holds that when a right is on the official lists of human rights that settles its status as a human right (“If it's in the book that's all I need to know.”) But the process of identifying human rights in the United Nations and elsewhere was a political process with plenty of imperfections. There is little reason to take international diplomats as the most authoritative guides to which human rights there are. Further, even if a treaty could settle the issue of whether a certain right is a human right within international law, such a treaty cannot settle its weight. It may claim that the right is supported by weighty considerations, but it cannot make this so. If an international treaty enacted a right to visit national parks without charge as a human right, the ratification of that treaty would make free access to national parks a human right within international law. But it would not be able to make us believe that the right to visit national parks without charge was sufficiently important to be a real human right.

3.1 Civil and Political Rights

These rights are familiar from historic bills of rights such as the French Declaration of the Rights of Man and the Citizen (1789) and the U.S. Bill of Rights (1791, with subsequent amendments). Contemporary sources include the first 21 Articles of the Universal Declaration, and such treaties as the European Convention, the International Covenant on Civil and Political Rights, the American Convention on Human Rights, and the African Charter on Human and People's Rights. Some representative formulations follow:

Everyone has the right to freedom of thought and expression. This right includes freedom to seek, receive, and impart information and ideas of all kinds, regardless of frontiers, either orally, in writing, in print, in the form of art, or through any other medium of one's choice. (American Convention on Human Rights, Article 13.1)
Everyone has the right to freedom of peaceful assembly and to freedom of association with others, including the right to form and to join trade unions for the protection of his interests (European Convention, Article 11).
Every citizen shall have the right to participate freely in the government of his country, either directly or through freely chosen representatives in accordance with the provisions of the law. 2. Every citizen shall have the right of equal access to the public service of his country. 3. Every individual shall have the right of access to public property and services in strict equality of all persons before the law (African Charter, Article 13).

Most civil and political rights are not absolute—they can in some cases be overridden by other considerations. For example, the right to freedom of movement can be restricted by public and private property rights, by restraining orders related to domestic violence, and by legal punishments. Further, after a disaster such as a hurricane or earthquake free movement is often appropriately suspended to keep out the curious, to permit access of emergency vehicles and equipment, and to prevent looting. The International Covenant on Civil and Political Rights permits rights to be suspended during times “of public emergency which threatens the life of the nation” (Article 4). But it excludes some rights from suspension including the right to life, the prohibition of torture, the prohibition of slavery, the prohibition of ex post facto criminal laws, and freedom of thought and religion.

3.2 Rights of Women, Minorities, and Groups

Equality of rights for historically disadvantaged or subordinated groups is a longstanding concern of the human rights movement. Human rights documents repeatedly emphasize that all people, including women and members of minority ethnic and religious groups, have equal human rights and should be able to enjoy them without discrimination. The right to freedom from discrimination figures prominently in the Universal Declaration and subsequent treaties. The Civil and Political Covenant, for example, commits participating states to respect and protect their people's rights “without distinction of any kind, such as race, color, sex, language, political or other opinion, national or social origin, property, birth, or social status” (on minority and group rights see Nickel 2007, ch. 10).

A number of standard individual rights are especially important to ethnic and religious minorities, including rights to freedom of association, freedom of assembly, freedom of religion, and freedom from discrimination. Human rights documents also include rights that refer to minorities explicitly and give them special protections. For example, the Civil and Political Covenant in Article 27 says that persons belonging to ethnic, religious, or linguistic minorities “shall not be denied the right, in community with other members of their group, to enjoy their own culture, to profess and practice their own religion, or to use their own language.”

Feminists have often protested that standard lists of human rights do not sufficiently take into account the different risks faced by women and men. For example, issues like domestic violence, reproductive choice, and trafficking of women and girls for sex work did not have a prominent place in early human rights documents and treaties. Lists of human rights have had to be expanded “to include the degradation and violation of women” (Bunch 2006, 58; see also Lockwood 2006). Violations of women's human rights often occur in the home at the hands of other family members, not in the street at the hands of the police. Most violence against women occurs in the “private” sphere. This has meant that governments cannot be seen as the only addressees of human rights and that the right to privacy of home and family needs qualifications to allow police to protect women within the home.

The issue of how formulations of human rights should respond to variations in the sorts of risks and dangers that different people face is difficult and arises not just in relation to gender but also in relation to age, profession, political affiliation, religion, and personal interests. Due process rights, for example, are much more useful to young people (and particularly young men) than they are to older people since the latter are far less likely to run afoul of the law.

Since 1964 the United Nations has mainly dealt with the rights of women and minorities through specialized treaties such as the International Convention on the Elimination of All Forms of Racial Discrimination (1965); the Convention on the Elimination of All Forms of Discrimination Against Women (1979); the Convention on the Rights of the Child (1989), and the Convention on the Rights of Persons with Disabilities (2007). See also the Declaration on the Rights of Indigenous Peoples (2007). Specialized treaties allow international norms to address unique problems of particular groups such as assistance and care during pregnancy and childbearing in the case of women, custody issues in the case of children, and the loss of historic territories by indigenous peoples.

Minority groups are often targets of violence. Human rights norms call upon governments to refrain from such violence and to provide protections against it. This work is partly done by the right to life, which is a standard individual right. It is also done by the right against genocide which protects groups from attempts to destroy or decimate them. The Genocide Convention was one of the first human rights treaties after World War II. The right against genocide seems to be a group right. It is held by both individuals and groups and provides protection to groups as groups. It is largely negative in the sense that it requires governments and other agencies to refrain from destroying groups; but it also requires that legal and other protections against genocide be created at the national level.

Can a group right fit the general idea of human rights proposed earlier? Perhaps it can if we broaden the conception of who can hold human rights to include ethnic and religious groups (see the entry on group rights). This can be made more palatable, perhaps, by recognizing that the beneficiaries of the right against genocide are individual humans who enjoy greater security against attempts to destroy the group to which they belong (Kymlicka 1989).

3.3 Environmental Rights

In spite of the danger of rights inflation, there are doubtless norms that should be counted as human rights but are not generally so treated. After all, there are lots of areas in which people's dignity and fundamental interests are threatened by governmental actions and omissions. Consider environmental rights, which are often defined as rights of animals or of nature itself (see the entry on environmental ethics). Conceived in this way they do not fit our general idea of human rights because the rightholders are not humans or human groups. But more modest formulations are possible; environmental rights can be understood as rights to an environment that is healthy and safe. Such a right is human-oriented: it does not directly address issues such as the claims of animals, biodiversity, or sustainable development (Nickel 1993. See also Hayward 2005).

A justification for this right must show that environmental problems pose serious threats to fundamental human interests, values, or norms; that governments may appropriately be burdened with the responsibility of protecting people against these threats; and that most governments actually have the ability to do this. This last requirement—feasibility—may be the most difficult. Environmental protection is expensive and difficult, and many governments will be unable to do very much of it while meeting other important responsibilities. The problem of feasibility in poorer countries might be addressed here in the same way that it was in the Social Covenant. That treaty commits governments not to the immediate realization of social rights for all, but rather to making the realization of such rights a high-priority goal and beginning to take steps towards its fulfillment.

Implementing a new right has opportunity costs. If no new resources are available, implementing a new right will mean that fewer resources are available for the implementation of existing rights. Rights are not magical sources of supply (Holmes and Sunstein 1999, Nickel 2007, ch. 5). This is not to deny, however, that successful implementation of a right can reduce threats in some areas and thereby reduce costs. For example, success in protecting the rights of minorities may reduce ethnic conflict and the threats to rights that it generates.

In 2012 the United Nations Human Rights Council appointed an Independent Expert on Human Rights and the Environment. The mandate for this position includes studying “human rights obligations relating to the enjoyment of a safe, clean, healthy and sustainable environment” and finding ways in which human rights can contribute to environmental protection.

3.4 Social Rights

The Universal Declaration included social (or “welfare”) rights that address matters such as education, food, and employment. Their inclusion has been the source of much controversy (see Beetham 1995). Social rights are often alleged to be statements of desirable goals but not really rights. The European Convention did not include them (although it was later amended to include the right to education). Instead they were put into a separate treaty, the European Social Charter. When the United Nations began the process of putting the rights of the Universal Declaration into international law, it followed the model of the European system by treating economic and social standards in a treaty separate from the one dealing with civil and political rights. This treaty, the International Covenant on Economic, Social, and Cultural Rights (the “Social Covenant,” 1966), treated these standards as rights—albeit rights to be progressively realized.

The Social Covenant's list of rights includes nondiscrimination and equality for women in economic and social life (Articles 2 and 3), freedom to work and opportunities to work (Article 4), fair pay and decent conditions of work (Article 7), the right to form trade unions and to strike (Article 8), social security (Article 9), special protections for mothers and children (Article 10), the right to adequate food, clothing, and housing (Article 11), the right to basic health services (Article 12), the right to education (Article 13), and the right to participate in cultural life and scientific progress (Article 15).

Article 2.1 of the Social Covenant sets out what each of the parties commits itself to do about this list, namely to “take steps, individually and through international assistance and co-operation…to the maximum of its available resources, with a view to achieving progressively the full realization of the rights recognized in the present Covenant.” In contrast, the Civil and Political Covenant simply commits its signatories to “respect and to ensure to all individuals within its territory the rights recognized in the present Covenant” (Article 2.1). The contrast between these two levels of commitment has led some people to suspect that economic and social rights are really just valuable goals.

The system to monitor and promote compliance with the Social Covenant is modest since it mainly requires participating countries to make periodic reports on measures taken to comply with the treaty. Countries agree “to submit…reports on the measures which they have adopted and the progress made in achieving the observance of the rights recognized herein” (Article 16). A committee of experts, created by the Economic and Social Council in 1987, is given the job of looking at the progress reports from the participating countries. This body, the Committee on Economic, Social and Cultural Rights, studies the reports, discusses them with representatives of the governments reporting, and issues interpretive statements known as “General Comments” on the requirements of the treaty. A recent amendment to the treaty allows residents of countries that approve the amendment to submit complaints of violations to the Committee.

Why did the Social Covenant opt for progressive implementation and thereby treat its rights as being somewhat like goals? The main reason is that nearly half of the world's countries were in no position in terms of economic, institutional, and human resources to realize these standards fully or even largely. For many countries, noncompliance due to inability would have been certain if these standards had been treated as immediately binding. We will return to this topic below.

Opponents of social rights often deny them the status of human rights, restricting that standing to civil and political rights. Familiar objections to social rights include the following: (1) they do not serve truly fundamental interests; (2) they are too burdensome on governments and taxpayers; and (3) they are not feasible in less-developed countries (on these issues see Beetham 1995; Cranston 1967, 1973; Howard 1987; Nickel 2007).

It is far from the case that most social rights pertain to superficial interests. Consider two examples: the right to an adequate standard of living and the right to free public education. These rights require governments to try to remedy widespread and serious evils such as hunger and ignorance. The importance of food and other basic material conditions of life is easy to show. These goods are essential to people's ability to live, function, and flourish. Without adequate access to these goods, interests in life, health, and liberty are endangered and serious illness and death are probable. Lack of access to educational opportunities typically limits (both absolutely and comparatively) people's abilities to participate fully and effectively in the political and economic life of their country (Hodgson 1998). Lack of education increases the likelihood of unemployment and underemployment.

Another way to defend the importance of social rights is to show the highly useful support they provide to the full realization of civil and political rights. If a government succeeds in eliminating hunger and providing education to everyone this promotes people's abilities to know, use, and enjoy their liberties, due process rights, and rights of political participation. This is easiest to see in regard to education. Ignorance is a barrier to the realization of civil and political rights because uneducated people often do not know what rights they have and what they can do to use and defend them. It is also easy to see in the area of democratic participation. Education and a minimum income make it easier for people at the bottom economically to follow politics, participate in political campaigns, and to spend the time and money needed to go to the polls and vote.

The second objection is that social rights are too burdensome. It is very expensive to guarantee to everyone basic education and minimal material conditions of life. Perhaps social rights are too expensive or burdensome to be justified even in rich countries. Frequently the claim that social rights are too burdensome uses other, less controversial human rights as a standard of comparison, and suggests that social rights are substantially more burdensome or expensive than liberty rights. Suppose that we use as a basis of comparison liberty rights such as freedom of communication, association, and movement. These rights require both respect and protection from governments. And people cannot be adequately protected in their enjoyment of liberties such as these unless they also have security and due process rights. The costs of liberty, as it were, include the costs of law and criminal justice. Once we see this, liberty rights start to look a lot more costly. To provide effective liberties to communicate, associate, and move it is not enough for a society to make a prohibition of interference with these activities part of its law and accepted morality. An effective system of provision for these liberties will require a legal scheme that defines personal and property rights and protects these rights against invasions while ensuring due process to those accused of crimes. Providing such legal protection in the form of legislatures, police, courts, and prisons is extremely expensive.

Further, we should not think of social rights as simply giving everyone a free supply of the goods these rights protect. Guarantees of things like food and housing will be intolerably expensive and will undermine productivity if everyone simply receives a free supply. A viable system of social rights will require most people to provide these goods for themselves and their families through work as long as they are given the necessary opportunities, education, and infrastructure. Government-implemented social rights provide guarantees of availability (or “secure access”), but governments should have to supply the requisite goods in only a small fraction of cases. Note that education is often an exception to this since many countries provide free public education irrespective of ability to pay.

Countries that do not accept and implement social rights still have to bear somehow the costs of providing for the needy since these countries—particularly if they recognize democratic rights of political participation—are unlikely to find it tolerable to allow sizeable parts of the population to starve and be homeless. If government does not supply food, clothing, and shelter to those unable to provide for themselves, then families, friends, and communities will have to shoulder this burden. It is only in the last century that government-sponsored social rights have taken over a substantial part of the burden of providing for the needy. The taxes associated with social rights are partial replacements for other burdensome duties, namely the duties of families and communities to provide adequate care for the unemployed, sick, disabled, and aged. Deciding whether to implement social rights is not a matter of deciding whether to bear such burdens, but rather of deciding whether to continue with total reliance on a system of informal provision that distributes assistance in a very spotty way and whose costs fall very unevenly on families, friends, and communities.

Once we recognize that liberty rights also carry high costs, that intelligent systems of provision for social rights supply the requisite goods to people in only a small minority of cases, and that these systems are substitutes for other, more local ways of providing for the needy, the difference in size between the costs of liberty rights and the costs of social rights ceases to seem so large.

Even if the burdens imposed by social rights are not excessive, it might still be wrong to impose them on individuals. Libertarians object to social rights as requiring impermissible taxation. Nozick, for example, says that “Taxation of earnings from labor is on a par with forced labor” (Nozick 1974, 169). This view is vulnerable to an attack asserting two things. First, taxation is permissible when it is used to support government-organized systems of humanitarian assistance that fulfill more effectively than charity duties of assistance that all individuals have (Beetham 1995, 53). Second, property rights are not so strong that they can never be outweighed by the requirements of meeting other rights. 

The third objection to social rights is that they are not feasible in many countries. It is very expensive to provide guarantees of subsistence, minimal public health measures, and basic education. As we saw above, the Social Covenant dealt with the issue of feasibility by calling for progressive implementation, that is, implementation as financial and other resources permit. Does this view of implementation turn social rights into high-priority goals? If so, is that a bad thing?

Standards that outrun the abilities of many of their addressees are good candidates for normative treatment as goals. Treating such standards as goals, which allows us to view them as largely aspirational rather than as imposing immediate duties, avoids massive problems of inability-based noncompliance. One may worry, however, that this is too much of a demotion. As norms, goals seem much weaker than rights. But goals can be formulated in ways that make them more like rights. Goals can be assigned addressees (the party who is to pursue the goal), beneficiaries, scopes that define the objective to be pursued, and a high level of priority (see Nickel 2013). Strong reasons for the importance of these goals can be provided. And supervisory bodies can monitor levels of progress and pressure low-performing addressees to attend to and work on their goals.

Treating very demanding rights as goals has several advantages. One is that proposed goals that exceed one's abilities are not as farcical as proposed duties that exceed one's abilities. Creating grand lists of human rights that many countries cannot at present realize seems fraudulent to many people, and perhaps this fraudulence is reduced if we understand that these “rights” are really goals that countries should promote. Goals are inherently ability-calibrated. What you should do now about your goals depends on your abilities and other commitments. Goals coexist happily with low levels of ability to achieve them. Another advantage is that goals are flexible; addressees with different levels of ability can choose ways of pursuing the goals that suit their circumstances and means. Because of these attractions of goals, it will be worth exploring ways to transform very demanding human rights into goals. The transformation may be full or partial.

A right together with its supporting reasons might be divided into two parts. One part, call it the “demand side,” sets out the rightholder's claim and the reasons why it is very valuable or important that this claim be fulfilled. In the right to a fair trial when one is arrested and accused of a crime` the demand side would set out the rightholder's claim to a fair trial and the reasons why that claim is very valuable or important. The other part, the “supply side,” would set out the addressees' responsibilities in regard to the rightholder's claim. It would explain why this claim to a fair trial is a matter of duty, what the duties are, and why it is these particular addressees rather than other possible addressees that have the duty (Feinberg 1973).

A goal that is similar to a right could also be divided into these two parts. The demand side would set out the beneficiary's claim or demand and the reasons why it is very desirable or important that this demand be fulfilled. For example, the demand side might set out the reasons why it is desirable for the beneficiary to have access to employment. And the supply side would set out the addressee's responsibility in regard to the beneficiary's demand. It would explain why promoting access to employment for the beneficiary should be a goal for the addressee. It does not impose duties on the addressee, but it shows that the addressee has good reasons for acting to satisfy the demand.

Since even a goal that is supported by good reasons imposes no duties—that is, fails to be mandatory in character—we may think that such goals are poor substitutes for rights and should not be called “rights.” But it is possible to create right-goal mixtures that contain some mandatory elements and that therefore seem more like real rights (see Brems 2009 for a similar idea). A minimal right-goal mixture would include a duty to try to realize the goal as quickly as possible. Here the demand side would set out the beneficiary's demand or claim and the reasons why it is very desirable or important that this demand be fulfilled. And the supply side would explain not only why the addressee has good reasons to pursue this goal, but also explain why the addressee has a duty to try to realize this goal with all deliberate speed. The economic and social rights in the Social Covenant seem to fit this model. The countries ratifying the Covenant agree to make it a matter of government duty to realize the list of rights as soon as possible. As we saw earlier, each of the Social Covenant's signatories has agreed to “take steps, individually and through international assistance and co-operation to the maximum of its available resources, with a view to achieving progressively the full realization of the rights recognized in the present Covenant.” The signatories agree, on this interpretation, to make it a matter of duty to realize the listed rights as soon and as far as resources permit.

A problem with such a right-goal mixture is that it allows the addressee great discretion concerning when to do something about the right and how much to do. A panel supervising compliance with a human rights treaty may wish to remove some of this discretion by requiring that the addressees at least take some significant and good faith steps immediately and regularly and that these steps be documented. Duties to try are less vaporous if they are combined with duties that require immediate steps. Countries may be required to act in certain ways (e.g., make a good faith effort and be prepared to demonstrate that they have done so), set specific benchmarks and timetables, establish agencies to work on the goals, provide them with budgets, and use expert assistance from international agencies. To facilitate the monitoring of compliance the country may be required to collect data continuously concerning realization of the goals, make periodic reports, and allow its citizens to complain to the monitoring body about failures to pursue the goals energetically (United Nations 1991).

Insistence that human rights not be too demanding can be complemented by measures to enhance the ability of developing countries to realize human rights. Possible strategies for such a combined approach include using aid to increase the resources available for implementing rights, providing education to current and future officials, offering technical assistance concerning mechanisms of implementation, and battling corruption.

John Rawls proposed a duty of liberal democratic countries to aid poor or “burdened” countries. Rawls defines “burdened societies” as ones that “lack the political and cultural traditions, the human capital and know-how and, often, the material and technological resources needed to be well-ordered” (Rawls 1999). Rawls holds that well-off countries have a moral duty to assist burdened societies. Unfortunately Rawls does not provide much justification for this claim. In particular he does not use his idea of an international “original position” to work out how the justification for such a duty would go and what objections it would need to overcome.

A good defense of a duty of well-off countries to assist poor ones in realizing human rights would not automatically impose that duty on the citizens of the well-off countries (except, of course, through the taxes they pay). But perhaps citizens should share somehow in duties of international aid. One approach to explaining how and why citizens share in these duties involves viewing the citizens of a democratic country as having ultimate responsibility for the human rights duties of their government. If their government has a duty to respect or implement the right to a fair trial, or a duty to aid poor countries, its citizens share in that duty. They are required as voters, political agents, and taxpayers to try to promote and support their government's compliance with its human rights duties. This principle of shared duty is particularly attractive in democratic societies where the citizens are the ultimate source of political authority. This view makes individuals back-up addressees for the duties of their governments.

Thomas Pogge has taken a related but slightly different approach to generating individual duties from human rights that have governments as their primary addressees. Pogge emphasizes the Universal Declaration's Article 28 which says that “Everyone is entitled to a social and international order in which this the rights and freedoms set forth in this Declaration can be fully realized.” Pogge sees in this Article a plausible norm, namely that both countries and individuals have negative duties not to be complicit in an international order that unfairly disadvantages poor countries and the people in them. A coercive political order, whether national or international, “must not avoidably restrict the freedom of some so as to render their access to basic necessities insecure—especially through official denial or deprivation. If it does, then all human agents have a negative duty, correlative to the postulated social and economic human rights, not to cooperate in upholding it unless they compensate for their cooperation by protecting its victims or by working for its reform. Those violating this duty share responsibility for the harms (insecure access to basic necessities) produced by the unjust institutional order in question” (Pogge 2002, 67).

4. Universal Human Rights in a World of Diverse Beliefs and Practices

Human rights prescribe universal standards in areas such as security, law enforcement, equality, political participation, and education. The peoples and countries of planet Earth are, however, enormously varied in their practices, traditions, religions, and levels of economic and political development. Putting these two propositions together may be enough to generate the worry that universal human rights do not sufficiently accommodate the diversity of Earth's peoples. A theoretical expression of this worry is “relativism,” the idea that ethical, political, and legal standards for a particular country or region are mostly shaped by the traditions, beliefs, and conditions of that country or region (see the entry on moral relativism). The anthropologist William G. Sumner, writing in 1906, asserted that “the mores can make anything right and prevent condemnation of anything” (Sumner 1906, 521).

Relativists sometimes accuse human rights advocates of ethnocentrism, arrogance, and cultural imperialism (Talbott 2005, 39–42). Ethnocentrism is the assumption, usually unconscious, that “one’s own group is the center of everything” and that its beliefs, practices, and norms provide the standards by which other groups are “scaled and rated” (Sumner 1906, 12–13). This can lead to arrogance and intolerance in dealings with other countries, ethical systems, and religions. Finally, cultural imperialism occurs when the economically, technologically, and militarily strongest countries impose their beliefs, values, and institutions on the rest of the world. Relativists often combine these charges with a prescription, namely that tolerance of varied practices and traditions ought to be instilled and practiced through measures that include extended learning about other cultures.

The conflict between relativists and human rights advocates may be partially based on differences in their underlying philosophical beliefs, particularly in metaethics. Relativists are often subjectivists or noncognitivists and think of morality as socially constructed and transmitted. In contrast, philosophically-inclined human rights advocates are more likely to adhere to cognitivism, moral realism, and intuitionism.

During the drafting in 1947 of the Universal Declaration, the Executive Board of the American Anthropological Association warned of the danger that the Declaration would be “a statement of rights conceived only in terms of the values prevalent in Western Europe and America.” Perhaps the main concern of the AAA Board in the period right after World War II was to condemn the intolerant colonialist attitudes of the day and to advocate cultural and political self-determination. But the Board also made the stronger assertion that “standards and values are relative to the culture from which they derive” and thus “what is held to be a human right in one society may be regarded as anti-social by another people” (American Anthropological Association Statement on Human Rights 1947).

This is not, of course, the stance of most anthropologists today. Currently the American Anthropological Association has a Committee on Human Rights whose objectives include promoting and protecting human rights and developing an anthropological perspective on human rights. While still emphasizing the importance of cultural differences, anthropologists now often support cultural survival and the protection of vulnerable cultures; non-discrimination, and the rights and land claims of indigenous peoples.

The idea that relativism and exposure to other cultures promote tolerance may be correct from a psychological perspective. People who are sensitive to differences in beliefs, practices, and traditions, and who are suspicious of the grounds for extending norms across borders, may be more inclined to be tolerant of other countries and peoples than those who believe in an objective universal morality. Still, philosophers have been generally critical of attempts to argue from relativism to a prescription of tolerance (Talbott 2005: 42–44). If the culture and religion of one country has long fostered intolerant attitudes and practices, and if its citizens and officials act intolerantly towards people from other countries, they are simply following their own traditions and cultural norms. They are just doing what relativists think people mostly do. Accordingly, a relativist from a tolerant country will be hard-pressed to find a basis for criticizing the citizens and officials of the intolerant country. To do so the relativist will have to endorse a transcultural principle of tolerance and to advocate as an outsider cultural change in the direction of greater tolerance. Because of this, relativists who are deeply committed to tolerance may find themselves attracted to a qualified commitment to human rights.

East Asia is the region of the world that participates least in the international human rights system—even though many East Asian countries do participate. In the 1990s Singapore’s Senior Minister Lee Kuan Yew and others argued that international human rights as found in United Nations declarations and treaties were insensitive to distinctive “Asian values” such as prizing families and community (in contrast to strong individualism); putting social harmony over personal freedom; respect for political leaders and institutions; and emphasizing responsibility, hard work, and thriftiness as means of social progress (on the Asian Values debate see Bauer and Bell 1999; Bell 2000; Sen 1997; and Twining 2009). Proponents of the Asian values idea did not wish to abolish all human rights; they rather wanted to deemphasize some families of human rights, particularly the fundamental freedoms and rights of democratic participation (and in some cases the rights of women). They also wanted Western governments and NGOs to stop criticizing them for human rights violations in these areas.

At the 1993 World Conference on Human Rights in Vienna, countries including Singapore, Malaysia, China, and Iran advocated accommodations within human rights practice for cultural and economic differences. Western representatives tended to view the position of these countries as excuses for repression and authoritarianism. The Conference responded by approving the Vienna Declaration. It included in Article 5 the assertion that countries should not pick and choose among human rights: “All human rights are universal, indivisible and interdependent and interrelated. The international community must treat human rights globally in a fair and equal manner, on the same footing, and with the same emphasis. While the significance of national and regional particularities and various historical, cultural and religious backgrounds must be borne in mind, it is the duty of States, regardless of their political, economic and cultural systems, to promote and protect all human rights and fundamental freedoms.”

Perhaps the debate about relativism and human rights has become obsolete. In recent decades widespread acceptance of human rights has occurred in most parts of the world. Three quarters of the world’s countries have ratified the major human rights treaties, and many countries in Africa, the Americas, and Europe participate in regional human rights regimes that have international courts (see 5.4 Regional Arrangements below). Further, all of the world's countries now use similar political institutions (law, courts, legislatures, executives, militaries, bureaucracies, police, prisons, taxation, and public schools) and these institutions carry with them characteristic problems and abuses (Donnelly 2003: 46, 92; Nickel 2007, 173–4). Finally, globalization has diminished the differences among peoples. Today’s world is not the one that early anthropologists and missionaries found. National and cultural boundaries are breached not just by international trade but also by millions of travelers and migrants, electronic communications, international law covering many areas, and the efforts of international governmental and non-governmental organizations. International influences and organizations are everywhere and countries borrow freely and regularly from each other’s inventions and practices.

Worldwide polls on attitudes towards human rights are now available and they show broad support for human rights and international efforts to promote them. A December 2011 report by the Council on Foreign Relations surveyed recent international opinion polls on human rights that probe agreement and disagreement with propositions such as “People have the right to express any opinion,” “People of all faiths can practice their religion freely,” “Women should have the same rights as men,” “People of different races [should be] treated equally,” and governments “should be responsible for ensuring that [their] citizens can meet their basic need for food.” Big majorities of those polled in countries such as Argentina, Ukraine, Azerbaijan, Egypt, Iran, Kenya, Nigeria, China, India, and Indonesia gave affirmative answers. Further, large majorities (on average 70%) in all the countries polled supported UN efforts to promote the human rights set out in the Universal Declaration. Empirical research can now replace or supplement theoretical speculations about how much disagreement on human rights exists worldwide.

5. International Human Rights Law and Organizations

Since 1948 an elaborate body of international human rights law has developed through state practice, the work of international courts, and multilateral treaty making. Dozens of human rights treaties are now operative within organizations such as the United Nations, the Council of Europe, and the African Union. Some of these treaties have been ratified by more than three-quarters of the world's countries. This section sketches the development of international measures to promote and protect human rights. Efforts to protect human rights through international treaties began in 1919 in the League of Nations and expanded after World War II with treaties such as the Genocide Convention (1948), the European Convention on Human Rights and Fundamental Freedoms (1950), and the International Covenants on Civil and Political Rights and on Economic, Social, and Cultural Rights (both 1966). The international promotion and protection of human rights complements the legal protection of human rights at the national level.

5.1 Historical Overview

When a government violates the human rights of its residents the victims may be able to appeal to the country's laws or bill of rights and get a court to order that the violations stop and that the government provide remedies. If suitable national laws and bills of rights are unavailable, however, victims of human rights violations may want help from international law and organizations. Traditionally, international law did not confer rights and protections on individual persons; its concern was exclusively the rights and duties of countries or states. Victims of human rights violations could appeal to heaven, and invoke standards of natural justice, but there were no international organizations working to formulate and enforce legal rights of individuals. After World War I the League of Nations had some success in using minority rights treaties to protect national minorities in Europe, but the effort ended with the rise of Nazi Germany and the beginning of World War II.

Countries fighting Hitler's Germany decided that after their victory a new international organization would be needed to promote international peace and security, and that securing human rights in all countries would help lessen the likelihood of the reoccurrence of large wars (Lauren 1998, Morsink 1999, Glendon 2001). Indeed, prior to the official formation of the United Nations, the Allies imposed human rights obligations on Italy and Central European powers in peace treaties. Similar obligations were imposed on Germany and Japan during the Allied occupation (Henkin 1999). The United Nations was created in 1945. Its Charter established goals of protecting future generations from the “scourge of war” and promoting “fundamental human rights” and the “dignity and worth of the human person.”

Not long after its founding the UN established a committee with the charge of writing an international bill of rights. This document was to be similar to historic bills of rights such as the French Declaration of the Rights of Man and of the Citizen (1789) and the United States Bill of Rights (1791), but was to apply to every person in every country. This international bill of rights emerged in December 1948 as the Universal Declaration of Human Rights (Morsink 1999, Lauren 1998, Glendon 2001). Although some diplomats had hoped for a binding human rights treaty that countries joining the UN would have to adopt, the Universal Declaration was a set of recommended standards rather than a binding treaty. By now, however, almost all of the norms in the Universal Declaration have been incorporated in widely-ratified UN human rights treaties.

The Universal Declaration has been astoundingly successful in setting the pattern for subsequent human rights treaties and in getting countries to include its list of rights in national constitutions and bills of rights (Morsink 1999). The Universal Declaration and the treaties that followed largely define what people today mean when they speak of human rights. The Universal Declaration proposed six families of rights including security rights, due process rights, liberty rights, rights of political participation, equality rights, and social rights. The inclusion of social rights to goods such as education and an adequate standard of living took the Declaration beyond its 18th century antecedents (see Eide 1992).

The Universal Declaration was born at a time that made its success difficult. The Declaration's approval by the General Assembly coincided with the beginning of the Cold War—an ideological and geopolitical conflict between capitalist and communist countries that continued until almost 1990. Ideological differences and hostilities might have stalled the human rights movement if not for human rights advances in Europe. In the early 1950s Western European countries formed the Council of Europe and created the European Convention for the Protection of Human Rights and Fundamental Freedoms. This international treaty entered into force in September of 1953, and was binding upon countries that ratified it. The European Convention established basic rights similar to those in the Universal Declaration, but included provisions for enforcement and adjudication. The European Convention gave birth to the European Court of Human Rights, whose job is to receive, evaluate, and investigate complaints, mediate disputes, issue judgments, and interpret the Convention. The human rights set forth in the Convention are legally enforceable rights to which member states are bound. In creating the European Convention and Court, the countries of Western Europe gradually proved that effective protection of human rights could be provided at the international level.

Inspired by the success of the European Convention, the United Nations followed a similar path, creating numerous treaties aimed at the enforcement and adjudication of the rights set forth in the Universal Declaration. These documents establish legal obligations among the ratifying countries to implement international rights within their national legal and political systems. By 2000 the main human rights treaties had been ratified by a large majority of the world's countries. As Ann Bayefsky writes, “Every UN member state is a party to one or more of the six major human rights treaties. 80% of states have ratified four or more” (Bayefsky 2001).

Regional arrangements, similar to those in Europe, exist in the Americas and Africa (see 5.4.2 and 5.4.3 below). Efforts to protect human rights through international law have obviously not been totally successful—lots of human rights violations still occur today in all parts of the world. International human rights law is a work in progress, and has developed much farther than one could have expected in 1950 or even in 1975.

5.2 United Nations Human Rights Treaties

International human rights treaties transform lists of human rights into legally binding state obligations. The first such United Nations treaty was the Genocide Convention, approved in 1948—just one day before the Universal Declaration. The Convention defines genocide and makes it a crime under international law. It also requires ratifying states to enact legislation prohibiting genocide. Currently the Genocide Convention has more than 130 parties. The International Criminal Court, created by the Rome Treaty of 1998, is authorized to prosecute genocide at the international level, along with crimes against humanity and war crimes.

After the creation of the Universal Declaration, the Human Rights Commission proceeded to try to create treaties to make the rights in the Universal Declaration into norms of international law. Because of the Cold War, the effort went ahead at a glacial pace. To accommodate the ideological division between those who believed in the importance of social rights and those who did not, or who thought that social rights could not be enforced in the same way as civil and political rights, the Commission ultimately decided to create two separate treaties. Drafts of the two International Covenants were submitted to the General Assembly for approval in 1953, but approval was much delayed. Almost twenty years after the Universal Declaration, the United Nations General Assembly finally approved the International Covenant on Civil and Political Rights and the International Covenant on Economic, Social, and Cultural Rights (both 1966). The Civil and Political Covenant contains most of the civil and political rights found in the Universal Declaration. The Social Covenant contains the economic and social rights found in the second half of the Universal Declaration (Articles 22–27). These treaties embodying Universal Declaration rights received enough ratifications to become operative in 1976 and have now become the two most important UN human rights treaties. To date, these treaties have been ratified by about 75 percent of the world's countries.

A country ratifying a UN human rights treaty agrees to respect and implement within domestic law the rights the treaty covers. It also agrees to accept and respond to international scrutiny and criticism of its compliance. This is a significant, if non-coercive, form of accountability. A ratifying country does not necessarily agree to make the human rights norm “self-executing”—that is, directly enforceable in domestic courts. That often requires implementing legislation.

A common method of treaty implementation within the UN is the creation of a standing committee (or “treaty body”) to monitor the performance of member states, and to which those states are required to submit periodic reports on compliance. The Civil and Political Covenant, which has been ratified by more than 150 countries, illustrates this approach. Rather than creating a human rights court, the Covenant created the Human Rights Committee (HRC), to promote compliance with its norms. The eighteen members of the HRC serve as independent experts rather than as state representatives. This potentially gives them some independence from the positions of their governments. The HRC frequently expresses its views as to whether a particular practice is a human rights violation, but it is not authorized to issue legally binding decisions (Alston and Crawford 2000).

The HRC is responsible for publishing “general comments” regarding the interpretation of the Civil and Political Covenant, reviewing periodic state reports on implementation of the Covenant, and receiving and investigating complaints of human rights violations made by states and individuals. The Committee holds public sessions in which it hears from non-governmental organizations such as Amnesty International and meets with representatives of the state making the report. The HRC then publishes “Concluding Observations” that evaluate human rights compliance by the reporting country. This process requires countries to hold discussions with the Human Rights Committee and have their human rights problems exposed to world public opinion. The reporting procedure is useful in encouraging countries to identify their major human rights problems and to devise methods of dealing with them over time. Unfortunately, the reporting system has few teeth when dealing with countries that stonewall or fail to report, and the Human Rights Committee's conclusions often receive little attention (Bayefsky 2001).

In addition to the required reporting procedure, the HRC has the authority to consider state complaints that allege human rights violations by another member state (see Article 41). The Civil and Political Covenant also has an optional protocol, binding only on states that have separately ratified it, that authorizes the HRC to receive, investigate, and mediate complaints from individuals alleging that their rights under the Covenant have been violated by a participating state (Joseph, Schultz, and Castan 2000). About two-thirds of the states adhering to the Covenant have ratified this optional protocol.

Many other UN human rights treaties are implemented in roughly the same way as the Civil and Political Covenant. These include the International Convention on the Elimination of All Forms of Racial Discrimination(1966), the Convention on the Elimination of All Forms of Discrimination Against Women (1979), the Convention on the Rights of the Child (1989), and the Convention against Torture and Other Cruel, Inhuman or Degrading Treatment or Punishment (1984). These human rights treaties create their own treaty bodies to monitor compliance and implementation. The proliferation of treaty bodies and reporting requirements has led to considerable overlap and inefficiency within the UN human rights system (Bayefsky 2001).

The standard UN system for implementing human rights is not very powerful. It is stronger on the promotion of human rights than on their protection through adjudication. Unlike the regional systems in Europe and the Americas, it does not have an international human rights court with powers to order states to change their practices or compensate a victim. Its tools are largely limited to consciousness-raising, persuasion, mediation, and exposure of violations to public scrutiny.

5.3 Other United Nations Human Rights Agencies

Human Rights treaties are only one part of the UN's human rights program. In fact, the UN has several agencies and courts, independent of its human rights treaties, to address continuing human rights abuses. Three notable agencies are the High Commissioner for Human Rights (OHCHR), which serves as a full-time advocate for human rights within the UN; the Human Rights Council, which addresses gross human rights violations; and the Security Council, which has the authority to impose diplomatic and economic sanctions, sponsor peacekeeping missions, and authorize military interventions in cases of human rights emergencies.

5.3.1 The High Commissioner for Human Rights

In 1993, following recommendations included in the World Conference on Human Rights in Vienna, the United Nations General Assembly established the Office of the High Commissioner for Human Rights as part of the UN Secretariat. The OHCHR coordinates the many human rights activities within the UN, working closely with treaty bodies, such as the Human Rights Committee, and other UN agencies such as the Human Rights Council. The High-Commissioner assists in the development of new treaties and procedures, sets the agenda for human rights agencies within the UN, and provides advisory services to governments. Most importantly, the High Commissioner serves as a full-time advocate for human rights within the United Nations (Korey 1998). The OHCHR also has field offices throughout the world, including offices in Central Asia, East and Southern Africa, the Pacific, Latin America, and the Middle East.

5.3.2 The Human Rights Council

In 2006 the longstanding UN Human Rights Commission was replaced by a new Human Rights Council. The Human Rights Commission was a 56 member committee, authorized by the UN Charter, consisting of state representatives. The stated goals of the replacement were to eliminate “double standards and politicization.” The new Council's responsibilities include “promoting universal respect for the protection of all human rights,” addressing gross human rights violations, making recommendations to the General Assembly, and “responding promptly to human rights emergencies.” The Council's other responsibilities include providing direct assistance to UN member states to help them meet their human rights responsibilities through communication, technical assistance, and capacity building.

The Council consists of 47 members, elected directly and individually by the General Assembly with membership based on equitable geographic distribution. Council members serve terms of three years, with a limitation of no more than two consecutive terms. Procedures for Council membership are aimed at keeping countries with very poor human rights records off the Commission. Members must be elected by an absolute majority of the General Assembly, requiring 96 votes in a secret ballot, rather than a simple majority of General Assembly members present. The General Assembly also acts as a check on the Council, with the ability to suspend Council members whose countries commit gross human rights violations. The Council meets at least three times per year for a total of not less than ten weeks, with the ability to hold special sessions when necessary.

An important 2008 development within the procedures of the Council is Universal Periodic Review. This is a system of scrutiny and evaluation run by the Council and its staff in which all UN member states are required once every four years to report on, receive evaluation, and have discussed in the Council their human rights practices. This requirement applies whether or not a country participates in human rights treaties.

5.3.3 The Security Council

The Security Council's mandate under Article 24 of the UN Charter is the maintenance of international peace and security. The fifteen-member body consists of 5 permanent and 10 elected members. Nine votes are needed to approve any measures. Any of the five permanent members (China, France, Russia, the United Kingdom, and the United States) can exercise their veto power to prevent a given action from succeeding. The permanent membership of five countries, with their veto power, is a clear concession to economic and military power within the Security Council. The Security Council can issue binding decisions regarding international security or peace, authorize military interventions and impose diplomatic and economic sanctions (Bailey 1994, Ramcharan 2002). In recent years the Security Council has been willing to discuss and attempt to deal with major human rights crises. After the international failure to intervene to prevent the Rwandan genocide, the Security Council and other UN bodies began to develop the idea of a “Responsibility to Protect” (see Evans 2008).

5.4 Regional Human Rights Systems

Regional arrangements supplement the UN system by promoting and protecting human rights in particular parts of the world. Three regions—Europe, the Americas, and Africa—have formulated their own declarations and conventions for the protection and enforcement of human rights. Because of their locations, regional agencies and courts have better chances of effectively investigating alleged violations promptly and securing relief for victims. Regional agencies are also likely to be more attuned to the culture and identity of the region and may accordingly have a deeper understanding of problems, circumstances, and possible reforms.

5.4.1 The European System

Beginning in the mid-1950s, the European Court of Human Rights, established under the European Convention for the Protection of Human Rights (1950) showed the world that it was possible to adjudicate and enforce human rights at the international level. Article 3 of the Statute of the Council of Europe requires member states to accept the principles of human rights and fundamental freedoms within their jurisdictions. The Council even defines its post-1989 role as that of a “human rights watchdog” for post-communist European countries (see About the Council of Europe). Since its inception membership in the Council of Europe has more than doubled—currently the Council has nearly 50 member states, about 20 of which are Central or Eastern European states.

The European Convention formulates human rights norms, legally binds member states to respect these norms, and creates a system of adjudication and enforcement. The European Convention's commitment clause requires all member states to secure these fundamental rights to every person within their jurisdictions. The first section of the European Convention then sets forth the fundamental rights covered in the convention, while the second section establishes the European Court of Human Rights.

The rights set forth in the European Convention are similar to the first twenty-one articles of the Universal Declaration, covering standard civil and political rights. Social rights were treated in a separate document, the European Social Charter. The European Convention defines its rights in greater detail than the Universal Declaration. A good example of this is seen in the right to life. While the Universal Declaration simply sets forth, “[e]veryone has the right to life…,” the European Convention's formulation is far more specific, requiring a mens rea as a necessary condition for violation and defining specific exceptions to this right (see Article 2).

The European system originally had both a Commission and a Human Rights Court to ensure that member states fulfilled their human rights obligations. In 1998, the European Convention was amended to abolish the Commission, expand and reorganize the Court, and make the Court a full-time operation. Countries that ratify the European Convention agree to respect and implement a list of rights, but they also agree to the investigation, mediation, and adjudication of human rights complaints. The European Court of Human Rights, based in Strasbourg, France, is composed of one judge from each participating state in the Council of Europe. The judges, however, are appointed as independent jurists rather than as state representatives.

Citizens from the participating countries with human rights complaints who have been unable to find a remedy in their national courts may petition the European Court of Human Rights. Complaints by governments about human rights violations in another participating country are also permitted, but are rarely made. If the Court agrees to hear a complaint, it investigates and adjudicates it. Before issuing a judgment, the Court attempts to mediate the dispute. If conciliation fails, the Court will issue a judgment with supporting judicial opinions and impose a remedy. Through this process a large body of international human rights jurisprudence has developed (Jacobs and White 1996; Janis, Kay and Bradley 1995). The Court currently has a very large backlog of cases. In 2004 reforms were implemented to address this problem (see the 2004 amendment, Protocol 14)

5.4.2 The Inter-American System

The Organization of American States (OAS) is the oldest regional organization of states. In 1948, 21 states signed the OAS Charter, establishing the regional organization and affirming their commitment to democracy, liberty, and equality before the law. Article 3 of the OAS Charter recognizes the “fundamental rights of the individual without distinction as to race, nationality, creed, or sex.” The Inter-American system has two main documents, the American Declaration of the Rights and Duties of Man and the American Convention on Human Rights; and two main treaty bodies, the Inter-American Commission on Human Rights and the Inter-American Court of Human Rights.

Even before the UN adopted the Universal Declaration, the Organization of American States approved the American Declaration (1948). Like the Universal Declaration, the American Declaration encompasses the entire range of human rights. Additionally, the declaration includes an explicit list of duties, ranging from general duties toward society and one's children, to an individual's duty to vote, work, and pay taxes (Articles 29–38).

Despite its early beginnings, the Inter-American system of human rights progressed more slowly than its counterparts. Not until 1969 did the OAS adopt the American Convention on Human Rights, which entered into force in June of 1978. The Convention gave legal force to most of the rights established in the American Declaration with a commitment clause requiring states to adopt legislative or other measures necessary for full implementation of these rights. The Convention does not cover social rights. Those were subsequently added by the Protocol of San Salvador (1988).

The Inter-American Commission on Human Rights was established in 1959 and conducted its first investigation in 1961. The Commission is the first of two permanent bodies for promoting and protecting human rights in the Americas and consists of seven members elected by the OAS General Assembly who serve in their personal capacities.

The Commission's main functions include investigating individual complaints and preparing reports on countries with severe human rights problems. To this end the Commission is authorized to:

  • Receive and investigate individual petitions regarding human rights violations
  • Publish reports regarding human rights situations in member states
  • Visit member states and investigate general human rights conditions or particular problem areas
  • Publish studies on specific subject areas, such as indigenous rights and women's rights
  • Make human rights recommendations to member states
  • Submit cases to, or request advisory opinions from the Inter-American Court of Human Rights.

In 1979 the OAS adopted the Statute of the Inter-American Court of Human Rights, officially creating the Inter-American Court and defining its jurisdiction. The Court is authorized to interpret and enforce the Convention (Davidson 1997). The Court is composed of seven judges who serve a six year term as individuals rather than as government representatives. The Court's jurisdiction is limited to cases submitted to it by the Inter-American Commission on Human Rights or by the member states. The Court generally holds public hearings and delivers decisions in public sessions.

Historically, the Commission was a more important actor than the Court in the implementation of the American Convention (Farer 1997). This seems to be changing, however, as the Court plays an increasingly active and central role.

5.4.3 The African System

The African Charter of Human and Peoples' Rights was created within the Organization of African Unity in 1981, entering into force in 1986. In 2000 the Organization of African Unity transformed itself into the African Union. The Constitutive Act, whereby this was accomplished, reaffirmed Africa's determination “to promote and protect human and peoples' rights.” As of 2010 the African Union has 50 members in good standing.

The African Charter obligates ratifying countries to recognize the rights and duties listed and to adopt legislation or measures to bring them into effect (Article 2). The Charter is divided into two parts. The first part sets forth rights and duties and the second part establishes safeguards for them. Like the American Convention on Human Rights, the African Charter sets out not only rights but also duties of individuals (Articles 27–29). These individual duties, included perhaps to counter claims that human rights promote excessive individualism, are directed to family, society, state, and the international community.

The African Charter explicitly posits group rights—the rights of peoples. Examples of such rights include the right of a group to freely dispose of its natural resources in the exclusive interest of its members (Article 21), and the right of a colonized or oppressed group to free themselves from domination (Article 20).

The Charter created an African Commission on Human and Peoples' Rights to promote and ensure the protection of human and peoples' rights in Africa (Article 30). The Commission meets twice a year and consists of eleven members of the African community who serve six year terms in their personal capacities. The functions of the Commission are the promotion of human rights, the protection of these rights, interpretation of the African Charter, and the performance of “any other tasks” requested by the AU (Article 45). The Commission is also authorized to perform studies regarding problems in the area of human rights; formulate rules addressing human rights problems; investigate alleged human rights violations; prepare reports discussing human rights abuses; and make recommendations to the AU Assembly (Articles 45–54). Furthermore, states are required to submit regular reports to the Commission on their human rights problems and efforts to address them (Article 62).

The African Court of Human and Peoples' Rights is now in operation in Arusha, Tanzania. The first election of its eleven judges occurred in 2006. The judges serve six-year terms and are permitted to serve two terms. The Court issued its first judgment concerning admissibility in 2009.

The African system has enormous human rights problems to address, frequently faces non-cooperation by governments, and has inadequate resources (Evans and Murray 2002). But despite these problems the African Union seems to be slowly constructing international mechanisms to promote and protect human rights in Africa.

5.4.4 Other regions

Large areas of the world lack functioning regional human rights systems (although they are, of course, covered by the worldwide UN system). No regional system exists in Asia, although the members of Association of Southeast Asian Nations (ASEAN) created in 2009 an Intergovernmental Commission on Human Rights. The Arab League has an Arab Charter of Human Rights but it has received few ratifications despite its adoption more than a decade ago.

5.5 The International Criminal Court

After countries throw off oppressive regimes or emerge from civil war they face a period of (what we now call) transitional justice. During this period they face the question of what should be done about prosecuting and punishing political, military, and ethnic leaders who organized and carried out severe human rights violations. The International Criminal Court (ICC) is designed to prevent impunity for human rights crimes, genocide, war crimes, and crimes against humanity. The ICC was based on the models and experience of the Nuremberg Tribunal, the International Tribunal for the Former Yugoslavia, and the International Criminal Tribunal for Rwanda.

The ICC was created in 1998 when 120 States adopted the Rome Statute of the International Criminal Court setting forth the jurisdiction and functions of the Court. This treaty came into force in 2002. In the following year the member states adopted Rules of Procedure and Evidence, Elements of Crimes, an Agreement on Privileges and Immunities, and elected the Court's 18 judges (McGoldrick et al. 2004).

The ICC has a prosecutor who receives petitions, conducts investigations, and prosecutes grave international crimes (Articles 34, 42). The Prosecutor may accept referrals made by State Parties or by the UN Security Council, and may also accept information about crimes from individuals and nongovernmental organizations.

The ICC operates as a backup system to efforts at the national level to prosecute war crimes and human rights violations. Under the doctrine of complementarity, the Court's jurisdiction comes into play only when a country is unwilling or unable to make a good faith effort to prosecute and convict violators. A person alleged to have committed a crime under the ICC Statute whose country is unwilling or unable to prosecute him or her falls under the jurisdiction of the ICC if (1) the country of which the accused is a citizen is a party to the Statute, or has authorized the jurisdiction of the court in the matter; (2) the country in whose territory the accused allegedly committed the crime is a party to the Statute, or has authorized the jurisdiction of the court in the matter, or (3) the crime the accused allegedly committed is referred to the Court by the Security Council.

The Court's jurisdiction is limited to “the most serious crimes of concern to the international community as a whole” (Rome Statute, Article 1). The Statute identifies four crimes over which the ICC may exercise jurisdiction: (1) genocide; (2) crimes against humanity; (3) war crimes; and (4) the crime of aggression against another state.

As of 2013, 122 countries have ratified the ICC. Prominent countries that have not joined include China, India, Israel, Russia, and the USA. No Middle Eastern country except Jordan has ratified.

5.6 Promotion of Human Rights by States

Perhaps the most important role that states play in international human rights law is in defining and establishing that law by creating and ratifying human rights treaties. Treaties are generally authored by committees of state representatives, and they are ratified by executive and legislative consent at the national level. Once a treaty is established, states help give it life by creating domestic legislation to implement it, conforming their conduct to its norms, and using it as a standard for domestic and international evaluation and criticism.

Article 56 of the UN Charter obligates member states to take “joint and separate action” to promote observance of human rights and fundamental freedoms for all. Within a country, means of promoting international human rights include incorporating international norms into a state's constitution and criminal law; creating limits on federalism; and, promoting human rights through propaganda and education. Perhaps the most basic method is enforcement through law at the national level. For example, to comply with the Genocide Convention a country must make genocide a crime within its own legal system. Much international law is obeyed because its norms have been incorporated into the legal systems of countries (Hathaway 2005). Since the end of the Cold War, numerous states have formulated new or revised constitutions that include human rights. A sampling of these states includes Romania (1991), Slovenia (1991), Congo (1992), Lithuania (1992), Albania (1993), Russian Federation (1993), Moldova (1994), Tunisia (1995), Cameroon (1996), and Poland (1997) (See Alston 1999.)

An example of the incorporation in domestic law of international norms is found in the United Kingdom's Human Rights Act of 1998. The Act makes the norms of the European Convention part of the domestic law of the UK. Under this Act, a resident of the UK can bring a human rights claim in British courts under this Act instead of having to go to the European Court of Human Rights in Strasbourg, France.

Another mechanism for state promotion of human rights is the creation of national human rights commissions. Their functions include educating people on human rights, promoting human rights, and advising local governments about human rights (Ramcharan 2005). Representatives of state commissions are permitted to participate in annual United Nations human rights sessions, enabling a state's human rights problems or successes to receive attention at the international level (Ramcharan 2005). Countries with national human rights commissions include Australia, Canada, Fiji, India, Ireland, Mexico, Nepal, the Philippines, and Uganda, to name a few.

States often take actions, unilaterally or together with other states, intended to promote and protect human rights in other countries. For example, in the late 1990s Australia led the military effort to restore peace and respect for human rights in East Timor. A new crisis erupted in 2006 and Australia, Portugal, New Zealand, and Malaysia again sent troops to suppress the violence. States use diplomacy, publishing reports and statements, conditioning access to trade or aid on human rights improvements, economic sanctions, and military intervention to promote human rights in other countries.

Humanitarian intervention is the use of force by one state to prevent or stop gross human rights violations and other humanitarian disasters in another state (Teson 2005). Military intervention, even when it has humanitarian purposes, conflicts with the idea of non-intervention—a cornerstone of international law. The principle of non-intervention discourages the use of force against the political and territorial sovereignty of states, and in doing so promotes international peace and security. Perhaps humanitarian intervention, like self-defense, is an exception to the principle of non-intervention.

War can be rationalized by calling it “humanitarian intervention” and emphasizing high-minded motives. This possibility was seriously debated with regard to the United States' intervention in Iraq (see Human Rights Watch: The War in Iraq: Not a Humanitarian Intervention; see also Teson 2005).

Still, there are situations in which military intervention is the only possible means of ending a consistent pattern of gross human rights violations. Humanitarian intervention relies on the principle that sovereign nations have an obligation to respect fundamental human rights. When state officials perpetrate human rights crimes and the government fails to bring them to justice, the responsibility of the international community is triggered. International organizations have been widely criticized for failing to intervene early and decisively during the genocide in Rwanda.

Efforts by states help add real power to the international human rights system. The countries of Western Europe along with Canada and Australia have been the historic pillars of the human rights establishment. (Perhaps the United States should be added to this list, but its record of compliance with and support for human rights is very mixed.) These countries have lent their considerable power and influence to the system, keeping it going during hard times and helping it expand and flourish in better times. Although these countries all have human rights problems of their own, and have not always risen to the challenge of human rights emergencies, they have sometimes provided military and peacekeeping forces at considerable cost to themselves in money and lives. They have often worked closely with the Security Council in these efforts. They do not, however, have a standing legal commitment to do this, except their commitment under the UN Charter to support the actions of the Security Council.

5.7 Nongovernmental Organizations

Nongovernmental organizations such as Human Rights Watch and Doctors without Borders are extremely active at the international level in the areas of human rights, war crimes, and humanitarian aid. Nongovernmental organizations (NGOs) allow for collaborations between local and global efforts for human rights by “translating complex international issues into activities to be undertaken by concerned citizens in their own community” (Durham 2004). The functions of international NGOs include investigating complaints, advocacy with governments and international governmental organizations, and policy making. Local activities include fundraising, lobbying, and general education (Durham 2004).

Although they do not have the authority to implement or enforce international law, NGOs have several advantages over state organizations in the human rights system. Much of their work includes information processing and fact finding, in which NGOs educate people about their human rights and gather information regarding human rights abuses in violating countries (Claude & Weston 1992, Durham 2004). In this process NGOs have the benefit of access to local people and organizations and are often able to get direct and indirect access to critical information about current human rights violations (Durham 2004). Once they gather information, NGOs can design campaigns to educate the international community about these abuses.

A key function of NGOs is advocacy—urging support for human rights and attempting to influence governments or international groups with regard to particular human rights violations. Advocacy involves education, persuasion, and the public shaming of violators (Claude & Weston 1992). Representatives of NGOs are seen everywhere in the international human rights system. Many international human rights NGOs attend and often participate in the meetings of UN human rights bodies (Claude & Weston 1992). They provide information about human rights situations through their reports and testimony. They shape the agendas, policies, and treaties of the UN through participation and lobbying (Korey 1998). Notable examples include NGO involvement in the development of the Universal Declaration of Human Rights and the UN Declaration on Torture and Other Cruel, Inhuman or Degrading Treatment (Claude & Weston 1992).

NGOs with affiliates around the world include Amnesty International, Human Rights Watch, the International Commission of Jurists, the International Federation of Human Rights, Minority Group Rights, Doctors without Borders, and Oxfam. Besides these high profile NGOs there are thousands of local and national organizations working on human rights issues. For a comprehensive list of such organizations see Non-governmental Organizations Research Guide.

5.8 The Future of Human Rights Law

A person who has read the foregoing account of human rights law may wonder whether all the work that has gone into its creation and implementation has made any difference. If so much international human rights law exists, why is the world such a mess?

A simple answer with much truth in it is that the world's human rights problems are large and deeply entrenched, and that human rights law and organizations are, by comparison, not very strong—particularly within the United Nations. Some of the countries that have the worst human rights records do not participate in the UN human rights system, and many others participate in a formal and hypocritical way.

Regional systems, particularly in Europe and the Americas, do somewhat better. They have their own human rights courts, are more powerful, and enjoy more serious and sincere participation by many (but not all) of their members.

The first 50 years of the human rights movement were handicapped by the Cold War. With that handicap removed, the 1990s were a period of growth and improvement in human rights law and institutions. The period since 2001 has seen a preoccupation with terrorism that has taken much attention and energy away from other human rights problems.

Success in promoting human rights requires hard-to-achieve success in other areas including building more capable, responsive, efficient, and non-corrupt governments, dealing with failed states, increasing economic productivity (to pay for the protections and services that human rights require), improving the power and status of women, improving education, and managing international tensions and conflicts. Realizing human rights worldwide is a project for centuries, not decades. This is not to say, however, that progress cannot proceed at a faster pace than it currently does.

Still, human rights are more widely accepted than they have ever been. They have become part of the currency of international relations, and most countries participate in the human rights system. Treaty arrangements help encourage and pressure countries to deal with their human rights problems. The human rights project continues and has not failed.

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Collections of Essays on the Philosophy of Human Rights

  • Cruft. R., Liao, S., and Renzo, M. (eds.), forthcoming. Philosophical Foundations of Human Rights>, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Ernst, G. and Heilinger, J. (eds.), 2011. The Philosophy of Human Rights: Contemporary Controversies, Berlin: De Gruyter 2011.
  • Etinson, A. (ed.), forthcoming 2014. Human Rights: Moral or Political?, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Hayden, P. (ed.), 2001. The Philosophy of Human Rightsv, St. Paul, MN: Paragon Press.
  • Holder C, and Reidy, D. (eds.), 2013. Human Rights: The Hard Questions, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Selected Human Rights Journals

Documents and Treaties

Organizations (Governmental and Nongovernmental)

Copyright © 2013 by
James Nickel <nickel@law.miami.edu>