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The term, “social institution” is somewhat unclear both in ordinary language and in the philosophical literature (see below). However, contemporary sociology is somewhat more consistent in its use of the term. Typically, contemporary sociologists use the term to refer to complex social forms that reproduce themselves such as governments, the family, human languages, universities, hospitals, business corporations, and legal systems. A typical definition is that proffered by Jonathan Turner (Turner 1997: 6): “a complex of positions, roles, norms and values lodged in particular types of social structures and organising relatively stable patterns of human activity with respect to fundamental problems in producing life-sustaining resources, in reproducing individuals, and in sustaining viable societal structures within a given environment.” Again, Anthony Giddens says (Giddens 1984: 24): “Institutions by definition are the more enduring features of social life.” He (Giddens 1984: 31) goes on to list as institutional orders, modes of discourse, political institutions, economic institutions and legal institutions. The contemporary philosopher of social science, Rom Harre follows the theoretical sociologists in offering this kind of definition (Harre 1979: 98): “An institution was defined as an interlocking double-structure of persons-as-role-holders or office-bearers and the like, and of social practices involving both expressive and practical aims and outcomes.” He gives as examples (Harre 1979: 97) schools, shops, post offices, police forces, asylums and the British monarchy.
In this entry the above-noted contemporary sociological usage will be followed. Doing so has the virtue of grounding philosophical theory in the most salient empirical discipline, namely, sociology.
At this point it might be asked why a theory of social institutions has, or ought to have, any philosophical interest; why not simply leave such theorising to the sociologists? One important reason stems from the normative concerns of philosophers. Philosophers, such as John Rawls (Rawls 1972), have developed elaborate normative theories concerning the principles of justice that ought to govern social institutions. Yet they have done so in the absence of a developed theory of the nature and point of the very entities (social institutions) to which the principles of justice in question are supposed to apply. Surely the adequacy of one's normative account of the justice or otherwise of any given social institution, or system of social institutions, will depend at least in part on the nature and point of that social institution or system.
The entry has five sections. In the first section various salient accounts of social institutions are discussed. Accounts emanating from sociological theory as well as philosophy are mentioned. Here, as elsewhere, the boundaries between philosophy and non-philosophical theorising in relation to an empirical science are vague. Hence, it is important to note the theories of the likes of Durkheim and Talcott Parsons as well as those of John Searle and David Lewis.
In the second section so-called collective acceptance theories of social institutions are discussed (Searle 1995 and 2010; Tuomela 2002 and 2007.
In the third section a teleological account of social institutions is presented (Miller 2001 and 2010). Teleological explanation is out of fashion in many areas of philosophy. However, it remains influential in contemporary philosophical theories of social action.
In the fourth section, the so-called agent-structure question is addressed. At bottom, this issue concerns the apparent inconsistency between the autonomy (or alleged autonomy) of individual human agents, on the one hand, and the ubiquity and pervasive influence of social forms on individual character and behaviour, on the other.
In the fifth and final section the specific normative issue of the justice of social institutions is explored. This section includes a discussion of intra-institutional justice, e.g. the justice or injustice of the reward system within an institution, as well as extra-institutional justice, e.g. the justice or injustice of a power relationship between a government and refugees.
- 1. Accounts of Social Institutions
- 2. The Collective Acceptance Theory of Institutions
- 3. A Teleological Account of Institutions
- 4. Agency and Structure
- 5. Social Institutions and Distributive Justice
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Any account of social institutions must begin by informally marking off social institutions from other social forms. Unfortunately, as noted above, in ordinary language the terms “institutions” and “social institutions” are used to refer to a miscellany of social forms, including conventions, rules, rituals, organisations, and systems of organisations. Moreover, there are a variety of theoretical accounts of institutions, including sociological as well as philosophical ones. Indeed, many of these accounts of what are referred to as institutions are not accounts of the same phenomena; they are at best accounts of overlapping fields of social phenomena. Nevertheless, it is possible, firstly, to mark off a range of related social forms that would be regarded by most theorists as being properly describable as social institutions; and, secondly, to compare and contrast some of the competing theoretical accounts of the “social institutions” in question.
Social institutions need to be distinguished from less complex social forms such as conventions, rules, social norms, roles and rituals. The latter are among the constitutive elements of institutions.
Social institutions also need to be distinguished from more complex and more complete social entities, such as societies or cultures, of which any given institution is typically a constitutive element. A society, for example, is more complete than an institution since a society—at least as traditionally understood—is more or less self-sufficient in terms of human resources, whereas an institution is not. Thus, arguably, for an entity to be a society it must sexually reproduce its membership, have its own language and educational system, provide for itself economically and—at least in principle—be politically independent.
Social institutions are often organisations (Scott 2001). Moreover, many institutions are systems of organisations. For example, capitalism is a particular kind of economic institution, and in modern times capitalism consists in large part in specific organisational forms—including multi-national corporations—organised into a system. Further, some institutions are meta-institutions; they are institutions (organisations) that organise other institutions (including systems of organisations). For example, governments are meta-institutions. The institutional end or function of a government consists in large part in organising other institutions (both individually and collectively); thus governments regulate and coordinate economic systems, educational institutions, police and military organisations and so on largely by way of (enforceable) legislation.
Nevertheless, some institutions are not organisations, or systems of organisations, and do not require organisations. For example, the English language is an institution, but not an organisation. Moreover, it would be possible for a language to exist independently of any organisations specifically concerned with language. Again, consider an economic system that does not involve organisations, e.g. a barter system involving only individuals. An institution that is not an organisation or system of organisations comprises a relatively specific type of agent-to-agent interactive activity, e.g. communication or economic exchange, that involves: (i) differentiated actions, e.g. communication involves speaking and hearing/understanding, economic exchange involves buying and selling, that are; (ii) performed repeatedly and by multiple agents; (iii) in compliance with a structured unitary system of conventions, e.g. linguistic conventions, monetary conventions, and social norms, e.g. truth-telling, property rights.
In this entry the concern is principally with social institutions (including meta-institutions) that are also organisations or systems of organisations. However, it should be noted that institutions of language, such as the English language, are often regarded not simply as institutions but as more fundamental than many other kinds of institution by virtue of being presupposed by, or in part constitutive of, other institutions. Searle, for example, holds to the latter view (Searle 1995: 37). A case might also be made that the family is a more fundamental institution than others for related reasons, e.g. it is the site of sexual reproduction and initial socialisation.
Note also that uses of the term “institution” in such expressions as “the institution of government”, are often ambiguous. Sometimes what is meant is a particular token, e.g. the current government in Australia, sometimes a type, i.e. the set of properties instantiated in any actual government, and sometimes a set of tokens, i.e. all governments. Restricting the notion of an institution to organisations is helpful in this regard; the term “organisation” almost always refers to a particular token. On the other hand, the term “institution” connotes a certain gravity not connoted by the term “organisation”; so arguably those institutions that are organisations are organisations that have a central and important role to play in or for a society. Being central and important to a society, such roles are usually long lasting ones; hence institutions are typically trans-generational.
Having informally marked off social institutions from other social forms, let us turn to a consideration of some general properties of social institutions. Here there are four salient properties, namely, structure, function, culture and sanctions.
Roughly speaking, an institution that is an organisation or system of organisations consists of an embodied (occupied by human persons) structure of differentiated roles. These roles are defined in terms of tasks, and rules regulating the performance of those tasks. Moreover, there is a degree of interdependence among these roles, such that the performance of the constitutive tasks of one role cannot be undertaken, or cannot be undertaken except with great difficulty, unless the tasks constitutive of some other role or roles in the structure have been undertaken or are being undertaken. Further, these roles are often related to one another hierarchically, and hence involve different levels of status and degrees of authority. Finally, on teleological and functional accounts, these roles are related to one another in part in virtue of their contribution to (respectively) the end(s) or function(s) of the institution; and the realisation of these ends or function normally involves interaction among the institutional actors in question and external non-institutional actors. (The assumption here is that the concept of an end and of a function are distinct concepts.) The constitutive roles of an institution and their relations to one another can be referred to as the structure of the institution.
Note that on this conception of institutions as embodied structures of roles and associated rules, the nature of any institution at a given time will to some extent reflect the personal character of different role occupants, especially influential role occupants, e.g. the British Government during the Second World War reflected to some extent Winston Churchill's character. Moreover, institutions in this sense are dynamic, evolving entities; as such, they have a history, the diachronic structure of a narrative and (usually) a partially open-ended future.
Aside from the formal and usually explicitly stated, or defined, tasks and rules, there is an important implicit and informal dimension of an institution roughly describable as institutional culture. This notion comprises the informal attitudes, values, norms, and the ethos or “spirit” which pervades an institution. Culture in this sense determines much of the activity of the members of that institution, or at least the manner in which that activity is undertaken. So while the explicitly determined rules and tasks might say nothing about being secretive or “sticking by one's mates come what may” or having a hostile or negative attitude to particular social groups, these attitudes and practices might in fact be pervasive; they might be part of the culture. Naturally, there can be competing cultures within a single organisation; the culture comprised of attitudes and norms that is aligned to the formal and official complex of tasks and rules might compete with an informal and “unofficial” culture that is adhered to by a substantial sub-element of the organisation's membership.
It is sometimes claimed that in addition to structure, function and culture, social institutions necessarily involve sanctions. It is uncontroversial that social institutions involve informal sanctions, such as moral disapproval following on non-conformity to institutional norms. However, some theorists, e.g. Jon Elster (1989: ch. XV), argue that formal sanctions, such as punishment, are a necessary feature of institutions. Formal sanctions are certainly a feature of many institutions, notably legal systems; however, they do not seem to be a feature of all institutions. Consider, for example, an elaborate and longstanding system of informal economic exchange among members of different societies that have no common system of laws or enforced rules. Again, a spoken language such as pidgin English, is presumably an institutions; yet breaches of its constitutive norms and conventions might not attract any formal sanctions.
Thus far we have informally marked off social institutions from other social forms, and we have identified a number of general properties of social institutions. It is now time to outline some of the main theoretical accounts of social institutions.
Notwithstanding our understanding of social institutions as complex social forms, some theoretical accounts of institutions identify institutions with relatively simple social forms—especially conventions, social norms or rules. At one level this is merely a verbal dispute; contra our procedure here, such simpler forms could simply be termed “institutions”. However, at another level the dispute is not merely verbal, since what we are calling “institutions” would on such a view consist simply of sets of conventions, social norms or rules. Let us refer to such accounts as atomistic theories of institutions (Taylor 1985: Chapter 7). Schotter is a case in point (Schotter 1981) as is North (North 1990). The best known contemporary form of atomism is rational choice theory and it has been widely accepted in, indeed it is in part constitutive of, modern economics. The most influential philosophical theory within a broadly rational choice framework is David Lewis’ theory of conventions (Lewis 1969). According to Lewis, conventions are regularities in action that solve coordination problems confronted by individual agents. Agents conform to the regularity because they prefer to do so, given others conform, and they believe that others will conform. (For criticisms see Miller 2001: Chapter 3.)
The “atoms” within atomistic accounts themselves typically consist of the actions of individual human persons, e.g. conventions as regularities in action. The individual agents are not themselves defined in terms of institutional forms, such as institutional roles. Hence atomistic theories of institutions tend to go hand in glove with atomistic theories of all collective entities, e.g. a society consists of an aggregate of individual human persons. Moreover, atomistic theories tend to identify the individual agent as the locus of moral value. On this kind of view, social forms, including social institutions, have moral value only derivatively, i.e. only in so far as they contribute to the prior needs, desires or other requirements of individual agents.
The regularities in action (or rules or norms) made use of in such atomistic accounts of institutions cannot simply be a single person’s regularities in action (or a single person’s rules or norms prescribing his or her individual action alone); rather there must be interdependence of action such that, for example, agent A only performs action x, if other agents, B and C do likewise. Moreover, some account of the interdependence of action in question is called for, e.g. that it is not the sort of interdependence of action involved in conflict situations (although it might arise as a solution to a prior conflict situation).
Assume that the conventions, norms or rules in question are social in the sense that they involve the required interdependence of action, e.g. the parties to any given convention, or the adherent to any such norm or rule, conform to (respectively) the convention, norm or rule on the condition that others do. Nevertheless, such interdependence of action is not sufficient for a convention, norm or rule, or even a set of conventions, norms or rules, to be an institution. Governments, universities, corporations etc. are structured, unitary entities. Accordingly, a mere set of conventions (or norms or rules) does not constitute an institution. For example, the set of conventions comprising the convention to drive on the left, the convention to utter, “Australia”, to refer to Australia, and the convention to use chopsticks does not constitute an institution. Accordingly, a problem for atomistic accounts of social institutions is the need to provide an account of the structure and unity of social institutions, and an account that is faithful to atomism, e.g. that the structure is essentially aggregative in nature.
By contrast with atomistic accounts of social institutions, holistic—including structuralist-functionalist—accounts stress the inter-relationships of institutions (structure) and their contribution to larger and more complete social complexes, especially societies (function). Thus according to Barry Barnes (Barnes 1995: 37): “Functionalist theories in the social sciences seek to describe, to understand and in most cases to explain the orderliness and stability of entire social systems. In so far as they treat individuals, the treatment comes after and emerges from analysis of the system as a whole. Functionalist theories move from an understanding of the whole to an understanding of the parts of that whole, whereas individualism proceeds in the opposite direction”. Moreover, (Barnes 1995: 41), “such accounts list the ”functions“ of the various institutions. They describe the function of the economy as the production of goods and services essential to the operation of the other institutions and hence the system as a whole.” Such theorists include Durkheim, Radcliffe-Brown and Parsons (Durkheim 1964; Radcliffe-Brown 1958; Parsons 1968 and 1982). Of particular concern to these theorists was the moral decay consequent (in their view) upon the demise of strong, mutually supportive social institutions. Durkheim, for example, advocated powerful professional associations. He said (Durkheim 1957 p.6):
A system of moral morals is always the affair of a group and can operate only if the group protects them by its authority. It is made up of rules which govern individuals, which compel them to act in such and such a way, and which impose limits to their inclinations and forbid them to go beyond. Now there is only one moral power—moral, and hence common to all—which stands above the individual and which can legitimately make laws for him, and that is collective power. To the extent the individual is left to his own devices and freed from all social constraint, he is unfettered by all moral constraint. It is not possible for professional ethics to escape this fundamental condition of any system of morals. Since, then, the society as a whole feels no concern in professional ethics, it is imperative that there be special groups in the society, within which these morals may be evolved, and whose business it is to see that they are observed.
Moreover, here the meta-institution of government obviously has a pivotal directive and integrative role in relation to other institutions and their inter-relationships, even though government is itself simply one institution within the larger society. Further, holistic accounts of institutions lay great stress on institutional roles defined in large part by social norms; institutional roles are supposedly largely, or even wholly, constitutive of the identity of the individual human agents who occupy these roles. (Individuals participate in a number of institutions and hence occupy a number of institutional roles; hence the alleged possibility of their identity being constituted by a number of different institutional roles.)
Many such holistic accounts deploy and depend on the model, or at least analogy, of an organism. A salient historical figure here is Herbert Spencer (Spencer 1971, Part 3B—A Society is an Organism). On this holistic, organicist model, social institutions are analogous to the organs or limbs of a human body. Each organ or limb has a function the realisation of which contributes to the well-being of the body as a whole, and none can exist independently of the others. Thus the human body relies on the stomach to digest food in order to continue living, but the stomach cannot exist independently of the body or of other organs, such as the heart. Likewise, it is suggested, any given institution, e.g. law courts, contributes to the well-being of the society as a whole, and yet is dependent on other institutions, e.g. government. Here the “well-being” of the society as a whole is sometimes identified with the stability and continuation of the society as it is; hence the familiar charge that holistic, organicist accounts are inherently politically conservative. This political conservatism transmutes into political authoritarianism when society is identified with the system of institutions that constitute the nation-state and the meta-institution of the nation-state—the government—is assigned absolute authority in relation to all other institutions. Hence the contrasting emphasis in political liberalism on the separation of powers among, for example, the executive, the legislature and the judiciary.
Holistic accounts of social institutions often invoke the terminology of internal and external relations. An internal relation is one that is definitive of, or in some way essential to, the entity it is a relation of; by contrast, external relations are not in this way essential. Thus being married to someone is an internal relation of spouses; if a man is a husband then necessarily he stands in the relation of being married to someone else. Likewise, if someone is a judge in a court of law then necessarily he stands in an adjudicative relationship to defendants. Evidently, many institutional roles are possessed of, and therefore in part defined by, their internal relations to other institutional roles.
However, the existence of institutional roles with internal relations to other institutional roles does not entail a holistic account of social institutions. For the internal relations in question might not be relations among institutional roles in different institutions; rather they might simply be internal relations among different institutional roles in the same institution. On the other hand, the existence of institutional roles with internal relations does undermine the attempts of certain forms of atomistic individualism to reduce institutions to the individual human agents who happen to constitute them; ex hypothesi, the latter are not qua individual human persons in part defined in terms of their relations to institutional roles.
Here it is important to distinguish the plausible view that institutions are not reducible to the individual human persons who constitute them from the controversial view that institutions are themselves agents possessed of minds and a capacity to reason. Peter French is an advocate of the latter view (French 1984). (See also Margaret Gilbert’s notion of a “plural subject” (Gilbert 1989: 200)). If we ascribe intentions to organisations, e.g. ascribe to Gulf Oil the intention to maximise profits, then we are apparently committed to ascribing to Gulf Oil a whole network of sophisticated propositional attitudes concerning economic production, the workings of markets, and so on. Moreover, a being with such a network of propositional attitudes would be capable of high level thought, and therefore be possessed of a language in which to do this thinking. Further, this agent's thought processes would include planning for its future and doing so on the basis of its past mistakes, and the likely responses of other corporations. Such a corporate agent is self-reflective; it not only distinguishes its present from both its past and its future, and itself from other corporations, it reflects on itself for the purpose of transforming itself. Such a being has higher order propositional attitudes, including beliefs about its own beliefs and intentions, and conceives of itself as a unitary whole existing over time. In short, it looks as though we now have a fully conscious, indeed self-conscious, being on our hands. Nor do matters rest here. For if we are prepared to grant Gulf Oil a mind, then why not all its subsidiaries, as well as all other companies and subsidiaries worldwide. Indeed how can we stop at corporations? Surely governments, universities, schools, supermarkets, armies, banks, political parties, trade unions, English soccer teams' supporters' clubs (at least) now all have minds, albeit in some cases smaller minds (so to speak). Not only do we have a self-conscious mind, but apparently we have an ever expanding community of self-conscious minds; or so it could be argued.
Thus far we have discussed atomistic and holistic accounts of social institutions. However, there is a third possibility, namely, (what might be termed) molecular accounts. Roughly speaking, a molecular account of an institution would not seek to reduce the institution to simpler atomic forms, such as conventions; nor would it seek to define an institution in terms of its relationships with other institutions and its contribution to the larger societal whole. Rather, each institution would be analogous to a molecule; it would have constitutive elements (“atoms”) but also have its own structure and unity. Moreover, on this conception each social institution would have a degree of independence vis-à-vis other institutions and the society at large; on the other hand, the set of institutions might itself under certain conditions form a unitary system of sorts, e.g. a contemporary liberal democratic nation-state comprised of a number of semi-autonomous public and private institutions functioning in the context of the meta-institution of government.
A general problem for holistic organicist accounts of social institutions—as opposed to molecular accounts—is that social institutions can be responses to trans-societal requirements or needs. Accordingly, an institution is not necessarily a constitutive element of some given society in the sense that it is both in part constitutive of that society and wholly contained within that society. Examples of such trans-societal institutions are the international financial system, the international legal system, the United Nations and some multi-national corporations. Indeed, arguably any given element of such a trans-societal institution stands in some internal relations to elements of other societies.
This raises the question as to whether or not the category of social institution might be conceptually independent of the category of society in the sense that it might be conceptually possible for there to be an institution without there being a society. This is consistent with the impossibility of there being a society without institutions. That is, perhaps societies presuppose social institutions, but not vice-versa.
Here we need to distinguish conceptual (or logical) impossibility from practical impossibility. For example, it might well be that no society and no system of institutions can exist, practically speaking, without the meta-institution of government; absent government, societies and social institutions tend to disintegrate. However, it would not follow from this that the institution of government is logically necessary for the existence of societies and (non-government) institutions.
The claim that institutions are conceptually independent of societies goes hand in glove with the proposition that human social life is dependent on institutions, but not necessarily on societies as such. The picture here is of human beings who are members of many different social groups, e.g. academic philosophers, EU citizens, speakers of the Spanish language, each of which group is sustained by one or more social institutions; however, there are no societies as such. For those who lived, or are living, in traditional tribes or clans this picture might be incomprehensible. However, it does have some resonance for those living in contemporary cosmopolitan settings.
In response to this claim of the independence, and perhaps priority, of institutions vis-à-vis societies it can be pointed out that trans-societal institutions presuppose societies. This is true enough. However, this would not rescue the holistic organicist conception; for such trans-societal institutions are not generally—and certainly not necessarily—constitutive “organs” of some larger society. Moreover, international institutions presuppose only nation-states, and the latter might be conceived of in narrowly political terms. Contemporary nation-states are not, it might be insisted, complete and self-sufficient societies, such as traditional tribes or clans might have been.
In this section atomistic and holistic accounts of institutions have been discussed in general terms. It is now time to focus on two recent molecular theories, namely, the collective acceptance theory and the teleological theory.
Both collective acceptance and teleological accounts of social action in general, and of social institutions in particular, fall within the rationalist, individualist, philosophy of action tradition that has its roots in Aristotle, Hume and Kant and is associated with contemporary analytic philosophers of social action such as Michael Bratman (Bratman 1987), John Searle (Searle 1995) and Raimo Tuomela (Tuomela 2002). However, this way of proceeding also has a place outside philosophy, in sociological theory. Broadly speaking, it is the starting point for the voluntaristic theory of social action associated with the likes of Max Weber (Weber 1949) and (the early) Talcott Parsons (Parsons 1968). For example, the following idea in relation to social action is expressed by Parsons (Parsons 1968: 229):
actions do not take place separately each with a separate, discrete end in relation to the situation, but in long complicated ‘chains’ … [and] the total complex of means-end relationships is not to be thought of as similar to a large number of parallel threads, but as a complicated web (if not a tangle).
However, unsurprisingly, the teleological account lays much greater explanatory emphasis on the means-end relationship in collective action contexts and much less on collective acceptance.
That said, the starting point for both kinds of theory has been the notion of a joint action. Examples of joint action are two people lifting a table together, and two men jointly pushing a car. However, such basic two person joint actions exist at one end of a spectrum. At the other end are much more complex, multi-person, joint actions, such as a large group of engineers, tradesmen and construction workers jointly building a skyscraper or the members of an army jointly fighting a battle.
Over the last decade or two a number of analyses of joint action have emerged (Gilbert 1989; Miller 2001; Searle 1995; Tuomela 2002). A number of these theorists have developed and applied their favoured basic accounts of joint action in order to account for a range of social phenomena, including conventions, social norms and social institutions. At the risk of oversimplification, I suggest that the tendency has been to eschew so-called individualist accounts in favour of so-called supra-individualist accounts, or at least in favour of the occupancy of some hoped-for anti-reductionist middle ground.
Individualism (of which more below) is committed to an analysis of joint action such that ultimately a joint action consists of: (1) a number of singular actions; (2) relations among these singular actions. Moreover, the constitutive attitudes involved in joint actions are individual attitudes; there are no sui generis we-attitudes.
By contrast, according to supra-individualists, when a plurality of individual agents perform a joint action, then the agents have the relevant propositional attitudes (beliefs, intentions etc.) in an irreducible ‘we-form’, which is sui generis and as such not analysable in terms of individual or I-attitudes. Moreover, the individual agents constitute a new entity, a supra-individual entity not reducible to the individual agents and the relations among them.
If the starting point for theorists in this strand of contemporary philosophy of action is basic joint action (and its associated basic collective intentionality), it is by no means the endpoint. Specifically, there is the important matter of the relationship between joint action and social institutions. For example, while it is a matter of controversy whether or not joint actions per se necessarily involve rights, duties and other deontic properties, it is self-evident that social institutions do so. Theorists within this recent tradition agree that joint actions—or perhaps the collective intentionality definitive of joint actions—is at least one of the building blocks of social institutions. However, the question remains as to the precise relationship between joint actions (and its associated collective intentionality) on the one hand, and social institutions on the other.
According to collective acceptance accounts, social institutions are created and maintained by collective acceptance. Collective acceptance accounts are constructivist; institutional facts and, therefore, institutions exist only in so far as they are collectively believed to exist or are otherwise the content of a collective attitude. Such collective attitudes are not to be understood as reducible to individual attitudes or aggregates thereof. Moreover, collective acceptance is not simply a matter of psychological attitudes standing in some straightforward causal relation to the external world as is the case, for instance, with common or garden-variety intentions, including the joint intentions definitive of basic joint actions. The idea is not that a group forms a joint intention to (say) push a boulder up a hill and, thereby, jointly cause the boulder to be relocated to the top of the hill. Rather the notion of a performative is invoked (Austin 1962).
Examples of performatives are: ‘I name this ship the Queen Elizabeth’—as uttered when smashing the bottle against the stem; ‘I give and bequeath my watch to my brother’—as occurring in a will (Austin 1962: 5). Performative are speech acts which bring about an outcome in the external world (e.g. that the name of the ship is the Queen Elizabeth or that my brother is the owner of what used to be my watch). Specifically, performatives are sayings which are also doings. In Searle’s terminology, merely saying something (‘I do’) counts as something else (becoming a wife). An important species of performatives are declarative speech acts (e.g. saying ‘I declare war’ in a certain context counts as going to war). A key point about performatives appears to be that it is by virtue of a convention that saying such and such in a given context brings the outcome about (Miller 1984). Accordingly, the outcome depends on collective acceptance (in the sense of compliance with the convention) and, indeed, to this extent the outcome is in part constituted by collective acceptance (in this sense). Searle himself speaks of constitutive rules at this point; rules that have the form ‘X counts as Y in context C’.
Searle in fact holds that declaratives have a fundamental role in the construction of social institutions. Thus he says (Searle 2010: 12–13): “With the exception of language itself, all of institutional reality, and therefore, in a sense, all of human civilisation, is created by speech acts that have the same logical form as Declarations.”
Favourite examples of collective acceptance theorists are money and political authorities. Thus Tuomela says (Tuomela 2007: 183): “‘performative’ collective acceptance must have been in place for squirrel pelt to become money.”
Searle says (Searle 1995: 91–2): “More spectacular examples are provided by the collapse of the Soviet empire in the annus mirabilis, 1989.… It collapsed when the system of status-functions was no longer accepted.”
Searle’s theory of social institutions makes use of three primitive notions, namely, collective intentionality, status functions and a language with declaratives. I have described declaratives, what of collective intentionality and status functions?
Collective intentionality is for Searle a primitive notion expressed by locutions such as “we-intend” and embodied (as we saw above) in joint action. A we-intention is not reducible to an individual intention, nor to an individual intention in conjunction with other individual attitudes such as individual beliefs (Searle 1995: 24-6; Searle 2010: Chapter 3). So Searle belongs to the anti-reductionist camp, albeit he appears not to want to embrace supra-individualism. According to Searle, we-intentions only exist in the heads of individual human agents and, therefore, do not imply the existence of a ‘super’ agent that is the possessor of any given we-intention.
An important feature of collective intentionality, as Searle understands it, is its ability to impose functions on objects. Searle’s notion of function concerns what it is that a group collectively imposes on physical phenomena. For example, if members of a community began to sit on a log then the log would in effect have become a bench. So a function—that of being used to sit on—would have been collectively imposed on a physical object.
On Searle’s conception, some functions—such as the function of being a chair—depend on the specific physical properties of the object on which they are imposed. Thus a log can become a bench only if it has a certain size and shape. By contrast, the key feature of institutional facts is that they involve functions which are not able to be imposed simply by virtue of the specific physical properties of the phenomena on which they are imposed. Rather possession of the function exists by virtue of the collective character of the imposition (Searle 1995: 39). So being a chair is not an institutional fact; rather its functionality exists by virtue of its specific physical properties. On the other hand, being a medium of exchange is an institutional fact; its functionality supposedly exists by virtue of collective imposition rather than specific physical properties.
According to Searle, institutions necessarily involve what he calls status-function, and something has a status-function—as opposed to a mere function—if it has, or those who use it have, deontic properties (rights and duties) and, therefore, deontic powers. Thus a police officer has a status-function, and therefore a set of deontic powers, including rights to stop, search and arrest people under certain conditions. A five dollar bill is a piece of paper (a physical object) the bearers of which have various deontic powers, including the right to exchange the bill for goods to the value of five dollars. These status-functions, and therefore deontic powers, have been collectively imposed in the sense that the relevant members of a community accept or agree to or otherwise treat the objects or persons that possess these status-powers as if they do in fact possess them. But in accepting or so treating, for example, the police officer as if he has the right to arrest people, the police officer comes to have that right. By Searle’s lights, if no-one ever paid any attention to police officers they would cease to have any deontic powers and therefore any status-function; indeed they would cease to be police officers. Similarly, if no-one was prepared to exchange five dollar bills for goods then these bits of paper would cease to have any status-function, and the bearers of them would cease to have any deontic powers.
In his latest work (Searle 2010) argues that the collective acceptance involved in the creation and maintenance of status functions (and, therefore, deontic powers) necessarily involves declaratives. Thus Searle says (Searle 2010: 101): “But when we count pieces of paper of a particular sort as twenty-dollar bills we are making them twenty dollar bills by Declaration. The Declaration makes something the case by counting it as, that, by declaring it to be, the case.”
There are a number of objections to Searle’s account including the following ones centering on the notion of collective acceptance in play and its relation to deontic properties and associated powers.
Firstly, in invoking declaratives and, therefore, performatives, does not Searle thereby necessarily invoke institutional forms constitutive of language and, in particular, conventions? If so, does not his account of institutional facts presuppose at the very least an unexplained social form (convention) and perhaps one that is part and parcel of institutions and, thereby, renders his account to some degree circular?
Secondly, and more generally, does collective acceptance (whether on Searle’s account or other accounts) necessarily generate deontic properties in the relevant cases? For example, a set of individuals might use a certain sort of relatively rare shell as a medium of exchange, and do so notwithstanding the fact that no-one had any desire to possess these shells independent of the fact that they could be used as a medium of exchange. In this scenario all that is required is that each exchanges shells for goods, and goods for shells, intends to continue to do so, and believes that all the others do and intend likewise. So in Searle’s terms, there has been collective imposition of a function, namely, the function of being a medium of exchange. Moreover, unlike in the above-mentioned example of a chair, this function does not crucially depend on specific physical properties of the shells; pretty much any small object of a consistent shape or colour would suffice. Of course it would add greatly to the stability of this arrangement if these shells were somehow authorised as an official medium of exchange, and if a (rule constituted) system of rights and duties in relation to the exchange of these shells was introduced and enforced. However, such a deontological structure is not seen to be a necessary feature of the system of exchange.
Thirdly, do deontic properties in themselves necessarily imply the actual ability to undertake an institutional role (the possession of deontic powers, to use Searle’s terminology)? Arguably, even where a deontological framework has been adopted, the relevant deontic properties do not subsume, take the place of, provide the basis for, or go hand in hand with, the function-driven (or ends-directed) actions of the persons in question. Consider an incompetent surgeon who is incapable of performing a successful operation on anybody, and who largely avoids doing so or, when he absolutely has to, always ensures that he is part of a team comprised of other competent surgeons and nurses who actually do the work. By virtue of being a fully accredited surgeon this person has a set of deontic properties, including the right to perform surgery, and others have deontic properties in relation to him, including the right that he performs operations competently and with due diligence. Moreover, these deontic properties are maintained in part by, say, the Royal College of Surgeons, his colleagues and the community. However, the surgeon simply does not possess the substantive functional capacities of a surgeon. The deontology is there but the underlying functional capacities are not. Accordingly, it is arguably false to claim that he is a surgeon. If someone cannot perform, and knows nothing about, surgery he is surely not a surgeon, irrespective of whether he is the possessor of the highest professional qualification available, is treated as if he were a surgeon, and indeed is widely believed to be the finest surgeon in the land; in short, irrespective of whether he is collectively accepted as a surgeon and the relevant institutional raiment of deontic properties is in place.
As noted above, the central concept in the teleological account of social institutions is that of joint action (Miller 2001 Chapter 2). On the teleological account, joint actions consist of the intentional individual actions of a number of agents directed to the realisation of a collective end. (Note that intentions are not the same things as ends, e.g. an agent who intentionally and gratuitously raises his arm ex hypothesi has no end or purpose in doing so.) Importantly, on the teleological account, a collective end—notwithstanding its name—is a species of individual end; it is an end possessed by each of the individuals involved in the joint action. However it is an end, which is not realised by the action of any one of the individuals; the actions of all or most realise the end. So contra anti-reductionist theorists such as Gilbert and Searle, the teleological account holds that joint actions can be analysed in terms of individualist notions.
Collective ends can be unconsciously pursued, and have not necessarily been at any time explicitly formulated in the minds of those pursuing them; collective ends can be implicit in the behaviour and attitudes of agents without ceasing to be ends as such. Further, in the case of a collective end pursued over a long period of time, e.g. by members of an institution over generations, the collective end can be latent at a specific point in time, i.e. it is not actually being pursued, explicitly or implicitly, at that point in time. However, it does not thereby cease to be an end of that institution—which is to say, of those persons—even at those times when it is not being pursued.
As we saw above, organisations consist of an (embodied) formal structure of interlocking roles. These roles can be defined in terms of tasks, regularities in action and the like. Moreover, unlike social groups, organisations are individuated by the kind of activity which they undertake, and also by their characteristic ends. So we have governments, universities, business corporations, armies, and so on. Perhaps governments have as an end or goal the ordering and leading of societies, universities the end of discovering and disseminating knowledge, and so on (Miller 2010: Part B). Here it is important to reiterate that these ends are, firstly, collective ends and, secondly, often the latent and/or implicit (collective) ends of individual institutional actors.
On the teleological account, a further defining feature of organisations is that organisational action typically consists in, what has elsewhere been termed, a layered structure of joint actions. One illustration of the notion of a layered structure of joint actions is an armed force fighting a battle. Suppose at an organisation level a number of “actions” are severally necessary and jointly sufficient to achieve some collective end. Thus the “actions” of the mortar squad destroying enemy gun emplacements, the flight of military planes providing air-cover and the infantry platoon taking and holding the ground might be severally necessary and jointly sufficient to achieve the collective end of defeating the enemy; as such these “actions” constitute a joint action. Call each of these “actions” level-two actions. Suppose, in addition, that each of these level-two “actions” is itself—at least in part—a joint action whose component actions are severally necessary and jointly sufficient for the performance of the level-two “action” in question. Call these component actions, level-one actions. So the collective end of the level-one actions is the performance of the level-two “action”. Thus the individual members of the mortar squad jointly operate the mortar in order to realise the collective end of destroying enemy gun emplacements. Each pilot, jointly with the other pilots, strafes enemy soldiers in order to realise the collective end of providing air-cover for their advancing foot soldiers. Finally, the set of foot soldiers jointly advance in order to take and hold the ground vacated by the members of the retreating enemy force. The actions of each of the individual foot soldiers, mortar squad members and individual pilots are level-one actions.
On the teleological account a further feature of many social institutions is their use of joint institutional mechanisms. Examples of joint institutional mechanisms are the device of tossing a coin to resolve a dispute and voting to elect a candidate to political office.
Joint institutional mechanisms consist of: (a) a complex of differentiated but interlocking actions (the input to the mechanism); (b)the result of the performance of those actions (the output of the mechanism), and; (c) the mechanism itself. Thus a given agent might vote for a candidate. He will do so only if others also vote. But further to this, there is the action of the candidates, namely, that they present themselves as candidates. That they present themselves as candidates is (in part) constitutive of the input to the voting mechanism. Voters vote for candidates. So there is interlocking and differentiated action (the input). Further there is some result (as opposed to consequence) of the joint action; the joint action consisting of the actions of putting oneself forward as a candidate and of the actions of voting. The result is that some candidate, say, Barack Obama is voted in (the output). That there is a result is (in part) constitutive of the mechanism. That to receive the most number of votes is to be voted in, is (in part) constitutive of the voting mechanism. Moreover that Obama is voted in is not a collective end of all the voters. (Although it is a collective end of those who voted for Obama.) However, that the one who gets the most votes—whoever that happens to be—is voted in is a collective end of all the voters, including those who voted for some candidate other than Obama.
On the teleological account, as on more broadly functionalist accounts, the definition of an institution will typically include a description of the human good or social benefit that it purports to produce. For example, universities purport to produce knowledge and understanding, language enables the communication of truths, marriages facilitate the raising and moral development of children, economic systems ought to produce material well-being, and so on. Such goods or benefits are collective in character.
The notion of a collective good in the context of a teleological account of social institutions is not that of a public good familiar in economics. Rather a collective good can be understood as a good (Miller 2010: Chapter 2): (1) produced, maintained and/or renewed by means of the joint activity of members of organisations (e.g. schools, hospitals, governments, business firms) i.e. by institutional role occupants; (2) made available to the whole community (e.g. food, security, banking services); and (3) one which ought to be produced (or maintained or renewed) and made available to the whole community because they are desirable (as opposed to merely desired) and such that the members of the community have an (institutional) joint moral right to them (Miller 2010: Chapter 2).
Note that the community in question is not necessarily the membership of a given nation-state or some other political community. Rather it is to be understood in terms of participation in an institutional arrangement and, therefore, relativised to the reach of the social institution in question. But some social institutions, e.g. the global economic system of organisations, transcend national boundaries. Accordingly, the participants and, therefore, contributors and bearers of joint rights to the collective goods in question, are not necessarily defined in terms of their membership of a nation-state or other political entity.
If the end realised in joint action, and organisational action in particular, is not merely a collective end, but also a collective good, then moral properties may well be generated. In the first place, the collective good might consist in an aggregate of basic human needs that have been met, as in the case of welfare institutions. But, arguably, such needs generate moral obligations; other things being equal, the desperately poor (for example) morally ought to be assisted by the ongoing, organised joint action of those able to assist.
In the second place—at the, so to speak, production, as opposed to the consumption, end of joint action—the realisation of collective ends that are also collective goods may well generate joint moral rights. It is easy to see why some agents, and not other agents, would have a right to such a good; they are the ones responsible for its existence, or continued existence. In this connection consider the managers and workers in a factory that produces cars which are sold for profit. Managers and workers in the factory—but not necessarily others—have a joint moral right to be remunerated from the sales of the cars that they jointly produced—and not simply on the basis of some contractual arrangement that they have entered into. It is also clear that if one participating agent has a moral right to the good, then—other things being equal—so do the others. That is, there is interdependence of moral rights with respect to the good. Moreover, these moral rights generate correlative moral duties on the part of others to respect these rights. Naturally these prior joint right and duties can be, and are, institutionalised including by way of contract based legal rights and duties that to some extent respect the relative contributions made by the participants.
This point about joint rights (and correlative duties) can be generalised across and among institutions so as to generate a web of interdependence (and hence joint rights and duties). Consider that the participants in any business rely on communication, transport, educational, security and other infrastructure directly provided by others and indirectly provided by all (or most) via taxes.
Unlike the collective acceptance account the teleological account introduces moral deontology at the ground floor (so to speak) and tries to generate institutional deontology on the back of this prior moral deontology. As such it is open to the charge that moral deontology presupposes institutional forms. The concept of a right, for example, might be held to make no sense outside an institutional environment. Indeed, Searle (Searle 2010: Chapter 8) offers this kind of argument, including in relation to human rights.
In this section the teleological account of social institutions has been elaborated. In the following section the so-called agent-structure question is addressed.
It is convenient to conceive of social institutions as possessed of three dimensions, namely, structure, function and culture. However, it needs to be kept in mind that this is potentially misleading since, as we saw above, there are conceptual differences between functions and ends. On some accounts, function is a quasi-causal notion (Cohen 1978 Chapter IX), on others it is a teleological notion, albeit one that does not necessarily involve the existence of any mental states (Ryan 1970 Chapter 8).
While the structure, function and culture of an institution provide a framework within which individuals act, they do not fully determine the actions of individuals. There are a number of reasons why this is so. For one thing, rules, norms and ends cannot cover every contingency that might arise; for another, rules, norms and so on, themselves need to be interpreted and applied. Moreover, changing circumstances and unforeseeable problems make it desirable to vest individuals with discretionary powers to rethink and adjust old rules, norms, and ends, and sometimes elaborate new ones.
Inevitably, the individuals who occupy institutional roles are possessed of varying degrees of discretionary power in relation to their actions. These discretionary powers are of different kinds and operate at different levels. For example, senior and middle level public servants have discretion in the way they implement policies, in their allocations of priorities and resources, and in the methods and criteria of evaluation of programs. Indeed, senior public servants often exercise discretion in relation to the formulation of policies. Consider that Gordon Chase, the New York Health Services Administrator, conceived, developed and implemented, the methadone program in New York in the early 1970s, notwithstanding political opposition to it (Warwick 1981, p. 93). Lower echelon public servants also have discretionary powers. Police officers have to interpret rules and regulations, customs officers have the discretionary power to stop and search one passenger rather than another, and so on.
Traditionally, members of the so-called professions, such as doctors, lawyers, members of the clergy, engineers and academics, have enjoyed a very high degree of individual autonomy, notwithstanding their membership of, and regulation by professional associations. In recent times they have increasingly been housed in large bureaucratic organisations in which their professional autonomy has evidently diminished somewhat.
So certain categories of individual institutional actors have discretionary powers and a reasonable degree of autonomy in the exercise of their institutional duties. However, it is not only the individual actions of institutional actors that are not fully determined by structure, function and culture. Many joint or cooperative actions that take place in institutions are not determined by structure, function or culture. For example, a senior public servant might put together a team of like minded people and they might pursue a specific agenda which is not one determined by the prevailing institutional structure, function or culture, and is even in part inconsistent with them.
It should also be noted that legitimate individual or collective discretionary activity undertaken within an institution is typically facilitated by a rational internal structure—including role structure—by rational policy and decision making procedures, and by a rational institutional culture. By rational, it is here meant internally consistent, as well as rational in the light of the institution's purposes. Arguably, the corporate culture in many contemporary corporations, e.g. Enron, is not rational in this sense. In particular, a culture of greed, recklessness and of breaking the rules is—from the standpoint of this rationality, as opposed to the rationality of some self-interested factions within these organisations—inconsistent with a hierarchical organisational structure preoccupied with accountability. Accordingly, it is likely that many (individual and collective) discretionary judgments will be ones that do not contribute to the realisation of the institution's purposes, even if they do facilitate the narrow self-interest of individuals and factional elements.
Aside from the internal dimensions of an institution, there are its external relationships, including its relationships to other institutions. In particular, there is the extent of the independence of an institution from other institutions, including government. One thinks here of the separation of powers among the legislative, executive and judicial institutions in the United States of America and elsewhere.
It should be noted that, strictly speaking, independence is not the same thing as autonomy, but is rather a necessary condition for it. An institution possessed of independence from other institutions might still lack autonomy, if it lacked the kinds of rational internal structure and culture noted above. Indeed, internal conflicts can paralyse an institution to the point where it becomes incapable of pursuing its institutional purposes. A university, for example, might enjoy independence from outside institutions, including government, but might be paralysed by internal conflict between staff and students. Such conflict might take the form (in part) of ongoing demonstrations that disrupt classes, and thereby prevent lectures and tutorials from being held.
Granted that institutional actors have a degree of discretionary power, nevertheless, they are constrained by institutional structure, and specifically the role structure, of the role that they occupy. As is often pointed out, institutional structure also enables the action of institutional actors. Police officers, for example, have significant powers not possessed by ordinary citizens.
However, a question arises as to the nature of the relationship between institutional structure and the agency of institutional actors. More specifically, a question arises as to whether or not one of these is logically prior to the other (or whether neither is). Thus some theorists, e.g. Emile Durkheim (Durkheim 1964) are held to conceive of structure as sui generis in relation to individual agency; and indeed, at least in the case of structuralists such as Althusser (Althusser 1971), explanatory of human ‘agency’. The proposition of structuralists such as Althusser is that institutional structures (in the sense of a structure of social roles and social norms) are a basic, non-reducible feature of the world and the actions, values, self-images and the like of individual human agents must conform to these structures because individual agency, properly understood, is in fact constituted by such structures. An individual human agent is simply the repository of the roles and values of the institutions in which the ‘agent’ lives his or her life. Other theorists, e.g., arguably Max Weber (Weber 1949) and methodological individualists, conceive of institutional structure as simply an abstraction from the habitual and interdependent actions of individual human beings actors. Social reality is wholly compromised of individual human agents and their ongoing, patterned interactions; there is no structure as such. (Theorists such as Durkheim occupy a mid-position in which there is both sui generis structure and non-reducible agency; such theorists now confront the problem of conflict between structure and individual agency—which overrides which?)
In relation to this issue Anthony Giddens (Giddens 1976 and 1984) has attempted to reconcile the felt reality of individual agency with the apparent need to posit some form of institutional structure that transcends individual agency.
According to Giddens, structure is both constituted by human agency and is the medium in which human action takes place (Giddens 1976, p. 121). This seems to mean, firstly, that structure is nothing other than the repetition over time of the related actions of many institutional actors. So the structure consists of: (i) the habitual actions of each institutional agent; (ii) the set of such agents; and (iii) the relationship of interdependence between the actions of any one agent and the actions of the other agents. But it means, secondly, that this repetition over time of the related actions of many agents provides not just the context, but the framework, within which the action of a single agent at a particular spatio-temporal point is performed. Structure qua framework constrains any given agent's action at a particular spatio-temporal point. (In addition, and as Giddens is at pains to point out, structure qua framework enables various actions not otherwise possible, e.g. linguistic structure enables speech acts to be performed.)
This seems plausible as far as it goes; however, we are owed an account of the interdependence among the actions of different agents. On a teleological account of institutions this interdependence is in large part generated by the ends of the institutions.
Here we need to remind ourselves of a characteristic feature of institutions, namely, their reproductive capacity. Institutions reproduce themselves, or at least are disposed to do so. On the teleological account of institutions, this is in large part because the members of institutions strongly identify with the institutional ends and social norms that are definitive of those institutions, and therefore make relatively long term commitments to institutions and induct others into those institutions.
However, it has been suggested by, for example, Roy Bhaskar (Bhaskar 1979: 44) that this reproduction of institutions is the unintended result of the free actions of institutional actors in institutional settings. By way of support for this proposition Bhaskar claims that people do not marry to reproduce the nuclear family or work to reproduce the capitalist system.
The first point to be made by way of response to Bhaskar is that even if the reproduction of an institution was an unintended consequence of the intentional participation of agents in that institution it would not follow that those agents did not have various other institutional outcomes as an end. For example, members of a business might have the maximisation of profit as an explicit collective end, even if the reproduction of the company was not intended by anyone.
The second point is that having an outcome as an implicit and/or latent collective end is not equivalent to individually explicitly intending to bring about that outcome. But it is the former, and not the latter that is in question. What is the evidence for the former in relation to Bhaskar's chosen examples?
It is plausible to assume that in the typical case of a nuclear family in a contemporary western setting the couple married in order to, i.e. having as a collective end to, establish and maintain a single nuclear family; indeed, such a couple tries also to ensure that their adult children in turn establish and maintain nuclear families. Moreover, in their interaction with members of other families and with potential fathers, mothers, husbands and wives, let us assume that the married couple in question express—often explicitly—not only their own commitment to their own nuclear family, and to the present or future nuclear families of their adult children, but to nuclear families in general. Further, where appropriate and possible, such a married couple—let us assume—often assists members of other families to establish and maintain their own nuclear families. Arguably, these fairly plausible assumptions, if they obtain, taken in combination constitute empirical evidence that each member of the large set of such typical married individuals has—jointly with each or most of the other members of the set—an implicit and (much of the time) latent collective end to reproduce the institution of the nuclear family.
Similarly, assume that the owners and managers of a company work to maintain the existence of their company and—through training, recruitment and so on—to ensure that it continues beyond their retirement or resignation. Moreover, assume that in their ongoing interaction with customers and with other businesses, they knowingly—and in the case of sales and marketing personnel, intentionally—establish and maintain specific economic relationships. More generally—let us assume—they express, often explicitly, not only their commitment to their own business, but to the market system in general. Further, let us assume that where appropriate and possible, they assist in the maintenance and further development of that system, e.g. by voting for a market oriented political party. Now consider a set of such companies. Arguably—given these fairly plausible assumptions—each of owner and manager of any of these companies has—jointly with the others—an implicit and (much of the time) latent collective end to reproduce the market system.
Further, there are institutions, such as schools and churches, and policymaking bodies, such as governments, that are explicitly engaged in the enterprise of reproducing a variety of social institutions other than themselves. They contribute to the reproduction of various social institutions by propagating the “ideology” of these institutions, but also by advocating and, in the case of government, by implementing specific policies to ensure the reproduction of these institutions.
Doubtless, unintended consequences—or, more precisely, consequences not aimed at as an end—have an important role in the life and for that matter, the death, of institutions (Hirschman 1970). Such consequences might include ones produced by evolutionary style causal mechanisms, or ones involved in so-called “hidden hand” mechanisms. (Albeit, as we saw above, “hidden hand” mechanisms are often the product of deliberate institutional design, and so their consequences are in a general sense aimed at by the designers, if not by the participating institutional actors themselves.)
More specifically, habitual action is a necessary feature of individual and collective—including institutional—life; and each single action performed on the basis of a habit, contributes in turn, and often unintentionally, to the maintenance and reinforcement of that habit. So the fact that institutional actors necessarily act in large part on the basis of habit means that many of their actions unintentionally contribute to the reproduction of the institution. However, this is consistent with a teleological account of social institutions—since, as noted above, there are outcomes other than institutional reproduction, and many of these are outcomes that are clearly aimed at. Moreover, it is consistent even with a teleological explanation of the reproduction of social institutions, since the establishment and periodic justificatory review of habits are themselves susceptible to teleological explanation.
In this section we have addressed the so-called agent-structure Question. Let us now turn in the final section of this entry to a specific normative aspect of institutions, namely their conformity or lack of it with principles of distributive justice.
Justice is an important aspect of many, if not all, social institutions. Market economies, salary and wage structures, tax systems, judicial systems, prisons, and so on are all in part to be evaluated in terms of their compliance with principles of justice.
Here it is important to distinguish the concept of justice from, on the one hand, the related concept of a right—especially a human right—and from goods, such as well-being and utility, on the other hand. Self-evidently, well-being is not the same thing as justice. However, there is a tendency to conflate justice and rights. Nevertheless, arguably the concepts are distinct; or at least justice in a narrow relational sense should be distinguished from the concept of a right. Genocide, for example, is a violation of human rights—specifically, the right to life—but it is not necessarily, or at least principally, an act of injustice in a relational sense. A person's rights can be violated, irrespective of whether or not another—or indeed everyone—has suffered a rights violation. However, injustice in the relational sense entails an unfairness as among persons or groups; injustice in this sense consists in the fact that someone has suffered or benefited but others have not (and there is no adequate justification for this state of affairs). Although the concept of a right and the concept of justice (in this sense) are distinct, violations of rights are typically acts of injustice (and vice-versa).
Moreover, the concept of justice is itself multi-dimensional. Penal justice (sometimes referred to as retributive justice), for example, concerns the punishment of offenders for their legal and/or moral offences, and is to be distinguished from distributive justice. Thus it is a principle of penal justice, but not distributive justice, that the guilty be punished and the innocent go free.
Distributive justice is essentially a relational phenomenon to do with the comparative distribution of benefits and burdens as among individuals or groups, including the distribution of rights and duties but not restricted to the distribution of rights and duties, e.g. the injustice of excluding blacks (but not whites) from voting in elections to determine the national government in apartheid South Africa or of lower wages being paid to women than those paid to men for the same work. (These are also instances of rights violations.)
On the view of distributive justice being propounded here, justice is but one moral value and distributive justice but one dimension of justice. Accordingly, it is always an open question whether or not some action or policy required by the principles of distributive justice is morally required all things considered.
Distributive justice is an important aspect of most, if not all, social institutions; the role occupants of most institutions are the recipients and providers of benefits, e.g. wages, consumer products, and the bearers of burdens, e.g. allocated tasks and, accordingly, are subject to principles of distributive justice. Moreover, arguably some institutions, perhaps governments, have as one of their defining ends or functions, to ensure conformity to principles of distributive justice in the wider society. However, distributive justice does not appear to be a defining feature, end or function of all social institutions. By this I do not mean that some social institutions are unjust, e.g. the institution of slavery; though clearly many are. Rather I am referring to the fact that a number of social institutions, such as the English language or even the institution of the university, are not defined—normatively speaking—in terms of justice, but rather by some other moral value(s), e.g. truth. Communication systems, such as human languages, are arguably defined in part in terms of the end of truth, but not in terms of justice; hence, a communicative system would cease to be a communication system if its participants never attempted to communicate the truth, but not if its participants failed to respect principles of distributive justice, e.g. in terms of the number of occasions on which particular speakers were allowed to speak.
The principles of distributive justice can be applied at an individual level, at an intra-institutional level, at a societal level and at a global level. If principles of distributive justice are applied at an individual level then the questions arises as to the scope of the application: Is it, for example, the individuals who happen to occupy a neighbourhood, the individuals who comprise a society, the individuals who comprise the human race, or some other demarcated set of individuals?
Moreover, if the principles of distributive justice are applied at an institutional level then an analogous question arises in relation to the scope of the application: Is it, for example, a particular institution or a structure of institutions? If the latter, Is it the institutional structure of a society or the global institutional structure? Famously, John Rawls addressed and privileged the question of the distributive justice of the structure of institutions in a given (liberal democratic) society (Rawls (1972) and (1999)). Arguably, this is a somewhat narrow focus, whatever one thinks of the specific account of distributive justice that Rawls elaborated in relation to the structure of institutions at the societal level. Why is it not, for example, important to focus on the application of principles of distributive justice in relation to the global structure of, say, political and economic institutions? At any rate, our concern here is with the application of the concept of distributive justice at the institutional level (though not necessarily only with respect to the structure of institutions within a given society, let alone liberal democratic society). The contrast here is between the institutional level and the individual level. However, it is important to determine what this distinction consists in.
Justice is a moral (relational) property and as such, I suggest, is only properly applied either to the actions of individual human beings or to the relations among individual human beings, including their relative wealth, status and power. More specifically, a social entity or relation among social entities is not per se just or unjust, notwithstanding that in ordinary speech social entities and their relations to one another are said to be just or unjust, e.g. the USA is sometimes said to be an unjust society. Rather claims ascribing justice or injustice to social entities and/or their relations are translatable into claims regarding the actions of, and relations among, individual human beings, e.g. the distribution of income among the individual citizens of the USA is unjust.
Given this individualistic conception of justice (and of moral properties more generally) how is a distinction to be maintained between the application of principles of distributive justice at an institutional level, on the one hand, and at an individual level, on the other? Quite simply, by helping ourselves to the concept of an institutional role occupant (and the relations, actions and effects on role occupants qua role occupants).
Institutional role occupants are individual human persons. However, they are individual human persons who happen to occupy one or more institutional roles, including in contemporary nation-states the role of citizen. As such, they have certain institutional rights and duties, in the manner adumbrated in earlier sections of this entry.
Accordingly, an institution is in some respect or on some occasion unjust in one of two main ways, intra-institutionally unjust and externally institutionally unjust. An institution is in some respect or on some occasion intra-institutionally unjust if a role occupant(s) of this institution qua role occupant(s) of this institution: (a) stands in an unjust relation to some other role occupant(s) within this institution qua role occupant(s) of this institution or (b) performs an action(s) that is unjust to some role occupant(s) of this institution qua role occupant of this institution. For example, a company in which the CEO's salary is 50 times the wage of the lower echelon workers is prima facie unjust in respect of its system of rewards.
An institution is in some respect or on some occasion externally unjust if a role occupant(s) of this institution qua role occupant of this institution: (a) stands in an unjust relation to some other non role occupant(s) of this institution; or (b) performs an action(s) that is unjust to some non role occupant of this institution, e.g. the members of a parliamentary cabinet jointly decide to remove the minimum wage level in the interests of economic growth and notwithstanding that this policy will further impoverish the least well-off.
Accordingly, the unjust actions of, and unjust relations among, ordinary human beings are actions and relations at the individual non-institutional level by virtue of not being acts of, and relation among, individuals qua institutional role occupants. Thus if a group of wealthy entrepreneurs buy a large (but allowable) number of tickets to soccer matches in some national league and then sell them at grossly inflated prices to wealthy soccer fans (again, this is allowable) then arguably there has been an injustice to the relatively impoverished soccer fans who would otherwise have been able to afford these tickets and attend the matches of their beloved home teams. However, these are not acts of injustice at the institutional level, since there are no institutional actors involved in this injustice.
Notice that on the account of the distinction between the institutional and the individual levels of just/unjust actions and relations, if a role occupant (acting qua role occupant) treats some non-role occupant unjustly then this is, nevertheless, an injustice at the institutional level. So if the members of an apartheid government refuse to enact legislation giving the vote to (currently unenfranchised) blacks then this is an institutional injustice.
Note also that on this way of drawing the distinction it does not matter whether the institution in question is an intra-societal institution, e.g. an institution within a nation-state or an extra-societal, including global institution, e.g. the United Nations.
On the other hand, this way of drawing the distinction between the individual and the institutional level of the application of principles of distributive justice assumes that some relevant institution has been established. However, it is possible that there are in fact no institutions designed to deal with some pressing issue of distributive justice and, therefore, no institutional role occupants to rectify the injustice. Surely, it might be argued, such an injustice is an injustice at the institutional level. I suggest that such cases are not cases of the injustice of institutions per se, but rather of the injustice of the absence of institutions. Such cases point to the need to make a threefold, rather than a merely twofold, distinction in this area: (i) injustice at the individual level; (ii) injustice at the institutional level; (iii) injustice at the individual level that is of such magnitude as to warrant the establishment of an institution.
It might further be argued that a crucial factor in all this has been ignored, namely, groups of individuals, e.g. socio-economic classes, ethnic and gender-based groups. The application of principles of distributive justice at the institutional level is, or ought to be, in large part the application of such principles not so much to individuals per se, but to groups whose members are known to be, say, systemically discriminated against. Doubtless, much injustice is group-based. To the extent that institutional actors are themselves guilty of group-based injustice, e.g. politicians whose policies discriminate against indigenous people, employers who exploit young workers in terms of pay and conditions, then this is a matter of injustice at the institutional level, as this notion has been characterised above. However, there is a further point at issue here.
Group-based injustices can exist primarily at the individual level rather than primarily at the institutional level. Some groups of individuals might have significant advantages in the competition for scarce goods, such as wealth, power and status, by virtue of their greater initial wealth, their access to social networks etc. and so on. That is, they have no formal institutional advantages. Moreover, it is not self-evident that a given institution, e.g. corporation, university, medical or legal profession etc., is unjust simply by virtue of the fact that some groups enjoy informal and highly generic advantages in relation to the competition for access to and progress within the institution in question; surely it is too much to insist that every institution must ensure complete equality of opportunity if it wants to avoid the charge of injustice.
However, it might be argued that this line of argument fails to accommodate group-based injustices of the kind in question. Indeed, the Rawlsian difference principle might be invoked at this point; the system of institutional arrangements within a society taken as a whole should work to the advantage of the least advantaged.
In response to this, I suggest that such group-based injustices, if injustices they be, are not necessarily injustices at the institutional level, but rather might well be injustices at the individual level. Nevertheless, they might be injustices at the individual level that are of such a magnitude that they need to be addressed institutionally. However, they are not injustices in respect of which there is no relevant remedial institution in existence. Rather existing institutions, especially governments, are presumably obliged to formulate appropriate policies to deal with such group-based injustices. Such policies might include death duties and/or tax scales with very high marginal rates of taxation at the top end of the scale.
On the other hand, if such group-based injustices are in fact the result of the practices or structures of institutions (taken individually or collectively) within the society then they would constitute injustices at the institutional level. For example, if the quality of educational preparation necessary to become a doctor or lawyer was in fact only available to the very rich, then arguably the educational institutions themselves are unjust, i.e. there is injustice at the institutional level. In many societies socio-economic group-based injustices exist at both the individual and the institutional level. That is, relevant institutions are both failing to take steps to redress prior group-based injustices at the individual level and further exacerbating those injustices by adding another layer of injustice at the institutional level.
There is a category of institutions in respect of which the distinction between group-based individual injustices and injustices at the institutional level collapses, namely, institutions that have as a defining purpose to redress large-scale distributive injustices in the wider society, i.e. governments.
The assumption here is that the institutional end of government goes beyond protecting human rights to, for example, life and liberty, and providing necessary means to the realisation of those rights, e.g. basic health, education and conditions of law and order that enable citizens to pursue their various individual and collective projects. For, as we have seen, the concept of a right, especially a human right, needs to be distinguished from the concept of justice, including distributive justice; and the realisation of human rights is a more pressing moral imperative than compliance with the principles of distributive justice.
On the other hand, minimalist conceptions of the institution of government might stop short of advocating a major role for government in applying principles of distributive justice in the wider society.
A further question that arises here pertains to the putative obligation of governments to protect the human rights of citizens of other states (or for that matter, non-citizens). Arguably, all individuals and institutions, including governments, have a moral obligation to protect human rights, e.g. not to violate the right to life or liberty. And some of these human rights evidently include positive rights to security and the provision of basic necessities, such as food and water. Some have argued that there are no such obligations on the part of governments, other than to their own citizens. This view might prove difficult to sustain, given that the principle not to infringe a human right applies universally, and given that the notion of a human right cannot easily be restricted to so-called negative rights, i.e. cannot easily be restricted to rights not to be interfered with.
Perhaps ironically, a conception of the institution of government that is minimalist in respect of the nature of its obligations, i.e. government exists only to protect the human rights of its citizens, might generate (presumably unwittingly) maximalism in respect of the scope of those obligations, i.e. other things being equal, the government has an obligations to protect the human rights of all, whether they be its citizens or not. Naturally, other things are not equal, e.g. there are practicalities and a certain division of labour in respect of the protection of the human rights of different groups. Australia, for example, cannot presumably be expected to protect the human rights of the Tibetans, given the relative power of China vis-à-vis Australia. On the other hand, Australia might be reasonably expected to intervene to protect the human rights of the East Timorese.
Some (Blake 2001) have argued: (a) that a liberal democratic government has a moral obligation to ensure respect for the human rights of its own citizens and others alike, but only has moral obligations to ensure that its own citizens comply with principles of distributive justice (specifically, the (controversial) Rawlsian difference principle), and (b) that the reason for this is that its own citizens alone are legitimately subject to the coercive authority of the government. The latter claim (b) is open to question (Anderson (1999)). No doubt citizens subject to the coercive authority of a government have a moral right to political rights, e.g. a right to vote and to stand for political office; they relinquish a degree of their individual autonomy in favour of a degree of jointly held autonomy (as well as (at least) protection of their human rights, and law and order). However, it is difficult to see why citizens being subject to the coercive authority of a government (willingly or, for that matter, unwillingly) generates a moral obligation on the part of the government in question to apply principles of distributive justice—specifically, the controversial Rawlsian difference principle—to the interactions among the citizens.
On the other hand, arguably, the coercive authority of government does generate a moral obligation on the part of government to enforce respect for contracts among citizens that are freely entered in to. For the latter are expressions of the autonomy of citizens, and in accepting the coercive authority of the government, citizens have relinquished a further aspect of their individual autonomy, namely their individual rights to enforce the contracts that they freely enter in to.
In conclusion, a final point about liberal democratic governments and distributive justice. There is at least one important and uncontroversial principle of distributive justice that arises in the context of collective enterprises (joint action); namely that, other things being equal, the benefits produced by joint actions should flow back to those who performed the joint action. Let us assume that inevitably citizens of a given polity participate in collective enterprises; whereas this is not necessarily the case for individuals who are not citizens of the same polity. (In the contemporary globalising world this assumption is increasingly implausible; but let us grant it for the sake of argument.) Surely this principle of distributive justice, if any, should be enforced by governments in relation to their own citizens but not in relation to non-citizens. Perhaps. At any rate, one key test of this proposition is whether or not individuals would be morally entitled to enforce such a principle of distributive justice in the absence of government. If the answer is in the affirmative, i.e. individuals have a “natural” right to enforce this principle of distributive justice, then presumably governments have a right to enforce it; after all, as we have seen above, according to liberal democratic theory individuals relinquish to government whatever pre-existing moral rights to enforcement they might have had.
What if the answer to our question is in the negative; does it follow that the government has no moral right to enforce this principle of distributive justice? Not necessarily. For one thing enforcement of such a principle of distributive justice is not necessarily the violation of a human right; if it were, this would be a moral constraint on governmental action in this regard. For another thing, in the context of a liberal democratic state citizens can make legitimate joint decisions—via their representative governments—that are simply unavailable to them when they are functioning as lone individuals; and one of these joint decisions might well be to enforce such a principle of distributive justice in their society on the grounds that it is a weighty moral principle the enforcement of which is morally required.
Now consider—as is in fact the case—a world in which many joint economic enterprises are in fact trans-societal, e.g. a multi-national corporation. Naturally, the citizens of different societies (polities)—or at least their representative governments—might also make a joint decision to (jointly) enforce this principle of distributive justice in relation to trans-societal joint economic enterprises involving citizens from both polities, e.g. wages in a poor society would need to reflect the contribution of the wage-earner to the overall benefits produced by the multi-national corporation. And if the citizens are committed on moral grounds to the enforcement of this principle of distributive justice in relation to intra-societal economic interactions, it is difficult to see why they should not be likewise committed to it in trans-societal economic interactions.
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